The term “Stoicism” derives from the Greek word “stoa,” referring to a colonnade, such as those built outside or inside temples, around dwelling-houses, gymnasia, and market-places. They were also set up separately as ornaments of the streets and open places. The simplest form is that of a roofed colonnade, with a wall on one side, which was often decorated with paintings. Thus in the market-place at Athens the stoa poikile (Painted Colonnade) was decorated with Polygnotus’s representations of the destruction of Troy, the fight of the Athenians with the Amazons, and the battles of Marathon and Oenoe. Zeno of Citium taught in the stoa poikile in Athens, and his adherents accordingly obtained the name of Stoics. Zeno was followed by Cleanthes, and then by Chrysippus, as leaders of the school. The school attracted many adherents, and flourished for centuries, not only in Greece, but later in Rome, where the most thoughtful writers, such as Marcus Aurelius, Seneca, and Epictetus, counted themselves among its followers.
We know little for certain as to what share particular Stoics, Zeno, Cleanthes, or Chrysippus, had in the formation of the doctrines of the school, but after Chryssipus the main lines of the doctrine were complete. The Stoic doctrine is divided into three parts: logic, physics, and ethics. Stoicism is essentially a system of ethics which, however, is guided by a logic as theory of method, and rests upon physics as foundation. Briefly, their notion of morality is stern, involving a life in accordance with nature and controlled by virtue. It is an ascetic system, teaching perfect indifference (apathea) to everything external, for nothing external could be either good or evil. Hence to the Stoics both pain and pleasure, poverty and riches, sickness and health, were supposed to be equally unimportant.
Stoic logic is, in all essentials, the logic of Aristotle. To this, however, they added a theory, peculiar to themselves, of the origin of knowledge and the criterion of truth. All knowledge, they said, enters the mind through the senses. The mind is a blank slate, upon which sense-impressions are inscribed. It may have a certain activity of its own, but this activity is confined exclusively to materials supplied by the physical organs of sense. This theory stands, of course, in sheer opposition to the idealism of Plato, for whom the mind alone was the source of knowledge, the senses being the sources of all illusion and error. The Stoics denied the metaphysical reality of concepts. Concepts are merely ideas in the mind, abstracted from particulars, and have no reality outside consciousness.
Since all knowledge is a knowledge of sense-objects, truth is simply the correspondence of our impressions to things. How are we to know whether our ideas are correct copies of things? How do we distinguish between reality and imagination, dreams, or illusions? What is the criterion of truth? It cannot lie in concepts, since they are of our own making. Nothing is true save sense impressions, and therefore the criterion of truth must lie in sensation itself. It cannot be in thought, but must be in feeling. Real objects, said the Stoics, produce in us an intense feeling, or conviction, of their reality. The strength and vividness of the image distinguish these real perceptions from a dream or fancy. Hence the sole criterion of truth is this striking conviction, whereby the real forces itself upon our consciousness, and will not be denied. There is, thus, no universally grounded criterion of truth. It is based, not on reason, but on feeling.
The fundamental proposition of the Stoic physics is that “nothing incorporeal exists.” This materialism coheres with the sense-impression orientation of their doctrine of knowledge. Plato placed knowledge in thought, and reality, therefore, in the ideal form. The Stoics, however, place knowledge in physical sensation, and reality — what is known by the senses — is matter. All things, they said, even the soul, even God himself, are material and nothing more than material. This belief they based upon two main considerations. Firstly, the unity of the world demands it. The world is one, and must issue from one principle. We must have a monism. The idealism of Plato resolved itself into a futile struggle involving a dualism between matter and thought. Since the gulf cannot be bridged from the side of ideal realm of the forms, we must take our stand on matter, and reduce mind to it. Secondly, body and soul, God and the world, are pairs which act and react upon one another. The body, for example, produces thoughts (sense impressions) in the soul, the soul produces movements in the body. This would be impossible if both were not of the same substance. The corporeal cannot act on the incorporeal, nor the incorporeal on the corporeal. There is no point of contact. Hence all must be equally corporeal.
All things being material, what is the original kind of matter, or stuff, out of which the world is made? The Stoics turned to Heraclitus for an answer. Fire (logos) is the primordial kind of being, and all things are composed of fire. With this materialism the Stoics combined pantheism. The primal fire is God. God is related to the world exactly as the soul to the body. The human soul is likewise fire, and comes from the divine fire. It permeates and penetrates the entire body, and, in order that its interpenetration might be regarded as complete, the Stoics denied the impenetrability of matter. Just as the soul-fire permeates the whole body, so God, the primal fire, pervades the entire world.
But in spite of this materialism, the Stoics declared that God is absolute reason. This is not a return to idealism, and does not imply the incorporeality of God. For reason, like all else, is material. It means simply that the divine fire is a rational element. Since God is reason, it follows that the world is governed by reason, and this means two things. It means, firstly, that there is purpose in the world, and therefore, order, harmony, beauty, and design. Secondly, since reason is law as opposed to the lawless, it means that the universe is subject to the absolute sway of law, is governed by the rigorous necessity of cause and effect. Hence the individual is not free. There can be no true freedom of the will in a world governed by necessity. We may, without harm, say that we choose to do this or that, and that our acts are voluntary. But such phrases merely mean that we assent to what we do. What we do is none the less governed by causes, and therefore by necessity.
The world-process is circular. God changes the fiery substance of himself first into air, then water, then earth. So the world arises. But it will be ended by a conflagration in which all things will return into the primal fire. Thereafter, at a pre-ordained time, God will again transmute himself into a world. It follows from the law of necessity that the course taken by this second, and every subsequent, world, will be identical in every way with the course taken by the first world. The process goes on for ever, and nothing new ever happens. The history of each successive world is the same as that of all the others down to the minutest details.
The human soul is part of the divine fire, and proceeds into humans from God. Hence it is a rational soul, and this is a point of cardinal importance in connection with the Stoic ethics. But the soul of each individual does not come direct from God. The divine fire was breathed into the first man, and thereafter passed from parent to child in the act of procreation. After death, all souls ( according to some scholars) or only the souls of the good (according to other scholars) continue in individual existence until the general conflagration in which they, and all else, return to God.
The Stoic ethical teaching is based upon two principles already developed in their physics; first, that the universe is governed by absolute law, which admits of no exceptions; and second, that the essential nature of humans is reason. Both are summed up in the famous Stoic maxim, “Live according to nature.” For this maxim has two aspects. It means, in the first place, that men should conform themselves to nature in the wider sense, that is, to the laws of the universe, and secondly, that they should conform their actions to nature in the narrower sense, to their own essential nature, reason. These two expressions mean, for the Stoics, the same thing. For the universe is governed not only by law, but by the law of reason, and we, in following our own rational nature, are ipso facto conforming ourselves to the laws of the larger world. In a sense, of course, there is no possibility of our disobeying the laws of nature, for we, like all else in the world, act of necessity. And it might be asked, what is the use of exhorting a person to obey the laws of the universe, when, as part of the great mechanism of the world, we cannot by any possibility do anything else? It is not to be supposed that a genuine solution of this difficulty is to be found in Stoic philosophy. They urged, however, that, though we will in any case do as the necessity of the world compels us, it is given to us alone, not merely to obey the law, but to assent to our own obedience, to follow the law consciously and deliberately, as only a rational being can.
Virtue, then, is the life according to reason. Morality is simply rational action. It is the universal reason which is to govern our lives, not the caprice and self-will of the individual. The wise man consciously subordinates his life to the life of the whole universe, and recognizes himself as a cog in the great machine. Now the definition of morality as the life according to reason is not a principle peculiar to the Stoics. Both Plato and Aristotle taught the same. In fact, it is the basis of every ethic to found morality upon reason, and not upon the particular foibles, feelings, or intuitions, of the individual self. But what was peculiar to the Stoics was the narrow and one- sided interpretation which they gave to this principle. Aristotle had taught that the essential nature of humans is reason, and that morality consists in following this, his essential nature. But he recognized that the passions and appetites have their place in the human organism. He did not demand their suppression, but merely their control by reason. But the Stoics looked upon the passions as essentially irrational, and demanded their complete extirpation. They envisaged life as a battle against the passions, in which the latter had to be completely annihilated. Hence their ethical views end in a rigorous and unbalanced asceticism.
Aristotle, in his broad and moderate way, though he believed virtue alone to possess intrinsic value, yet allowed to external goods and circumstances a place in the scheme of life. The Stoics asserted that virtue alone is good, vice alone evil, and that all else is absolutely indifferent. Poverty, sickness, pain, and death, are not evils. Riches, health, pleasure, and life, are not goods. A person may commit suicide, for in destroying his life he destroys nothing of value. Above all, pleasure is not a good. One ought not to seek pleasure. Virtue is the only happiness. And people must be virtuous, not for the sake of pleasure, but for the sake of duty. And since virtue alone is good, vice alone evil, there followed the further paradox that all virtues are equally good, and all vices equally evil. There are no degrees.
Virtue is founded upon reason, and so upon knowledge. Hence the importance of science, physics, and logic, which are valued not for themselves, but because they are the foundations of morality. The prime virtue, and the root of all other virtues, is therefore wisdom. The wise man is synonymous with the good man. From the root-virtue, wisdom, spring the four cardinal virtues: insight, bravery, self-control, and justice. But since all virtues have one root, those who possess wisdom possess all virtue, and those who lack it lack all. A person is either wholly virtuous, or wholly vicious. The world is divided into wise and foolish people, the former perfectly good, the latter absolutely evil. There is nothing between the two. There is no such thing as a gradual transition from one to the other. Conversion must be instantaneous. the wise person is perfect, has all happiness, freedom, riches, beauty. They alone are the perfect kings, politicians, poets, prophets, orators, critics, and physicians. The fool has all vice, all misery, all ugliness, all poverty. And every person is one or the other. Asked where such a wise person was to be found, the Stoics pointed doubtfully at Socrates and Diogenes the Cynic. The number of the wise, they thought, is small, and is continually growing smaller. The world, which they painted in the blackest colors as a sea of vice and misery, grows steadily worse.
The similarities between Cynicism and Stoic ethics are apparent. However, the Stoics modified and softened the harsh outlines of Cynicism. To do this meant inconsistency, though. It meant that they first laid down harsh principles, and then proceeded to tone them down, to explain them away, to admit exceptions. Such inconsistency the Stoics accepted with their habitual cheerfulness. This process of toning down their first harsh utterances took place mainly in three ways. First, they modified their principle of the complete suppression of the passions. Since this is impossible, and, if possible, could only lead to immovable inactivity, they admitted that the wise person might exhibit certain mild and rational emotions. Thus, the roots of the passions might be found in the wise person, though they would never be allowed to grow. In the second place, they modified their principle that all else, save virtue and vice, is indifferent. Such a view is unreal, and out of accord with life. Hence the Stoics, with a masterly disregard of consistency, stuck to the principle, and yet declared that among things indifferent some are preferable to others. If the wise person has the choice between health and sickness, health is preferable. Indifferent things were thus divided into three classes: those to be preferred, those to be avoided, and those which are absolutely indifferent.
In the third place, the Stoics toned down the principle that people are either wholly good, or wholly evil. The famous heroes and politicians of history, though fools, are yet polluted with the common vices of humankind less than others. Moreover, what were the Stoics to say about themselves? Were they wise men or fools? They hesitated to claim perfection, to put themselves on a level with Socrates and Diogenes. Yet they could not bring themselves to admit that there was no difference between themselves and the common herd. They were “proficients,” and, if not absolutely wise, approximated to wisdom.
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Last updated: June 18, 2008 | Originally published: