Stoicism was one of the most important and enduring philosophies to emerge from the Greek and Roman world. The Stoics are well known for their contributions to moral philosophy, and more recently they have also been recognized for their work in logic, grammar, philosophy of language, and epistemology. This article examines the Stoics’ contributions to philosophy of mind. The Stoics constructed one of the most advanced and philosophically interesting theories of mind in the classical world. As in contemporary cognitive science, the Stoics rejected the idea that the mind is an incorporeal entity. Instead they argued that the mind (or soul) must be something corporeal and something that obeys the laws of physics. Moreover, they held that all mental states and acts were states of the corporeal soul. The soul (a concept broader than the modern concept of mind) was believed to be a hot, fiery breath [pneuma] that infused the physical body. As a highly sensitive substance, pneuma pervades the body establishing a mechanism able to detect sensory information and transmit the information to the central commanding portion of the soul in the chest. The information is then processed and experienced. The Stoics analyzed the activities of the mind not only on a physical level but also on a logical level. Cognitive experience was evaluated in terms of its propositional structure, for thought and language were closely connected in rational creatures. The Stoic doctrine of perceptual and cognitive presentation (phantasia) offered a way to coherently analyze mental content and intentional objects. As a result of their work in philosophy of mind the Stoics developed a rich epistemology and a powerful philosophy of action. Finally, the Stoics denied Plato’s and Aristotle’s view that the soul has both rational and irrational faculties. Instead, they argued that the soul is unified and that all the faculties are rational concluding that the passions are the result not of a distinct irrational faculty but of errors in judgement.
Greek and Roman philosophers did not recognize philosophy of mind as a distinct field of study. However, topics now considered central to philosophy of mind such as perception, imagination, thought, intelligence, emotion, memory, identity, and action were often discussed under the title Peri psychês or On the Soul. This article surveys some of the ideas held by the ancient Stoics addressing the soul and related topics which roughly correspond to themes prevalent in contemporary philosophy of mind and philosophical psychology.
The ancient Greek concept of soul differs in many ways from the modern (post-Cartesian) idea of mind. Contemporary thinkers tend to sharply contrast the mind and body. When we think of mind we think primarily of cognitive faculties and perhaps our sense of identity. The Greek concept of the soul is much broader and more closely connected to basic bodily functions. The soul is first and foremost the principle of life; it is that which animates the body. Although the soul accounts for our ability to think, perceive, imagine, and reason, it is also responsible for biological processes such as respiration, digestion, procreation, growth, and motion. Perhaps the closest we come to a Cartesian concept of the soul in ancient Greek thought would be Plato, the Pythagoreans, and their successors. Stoic psychology represents the other end of the spectrum: a corporeal or physicalist model of soul.
Since there is no clear subject in Stoicism corresponding to contemporary philosophy of mind, evidence must be gleaned from various departments of the Stoic philosophical system. The Stoics divided philosophy into three general “parts”: Physics, Logic, and Ethics. Teachings regarding the soul can be found in all three parts. In physics the Stoics analyzed the substance of the soul, its relationship to God and the cosmos, and its role in the functioning of the human body. In logic the Stoics developed a theory of meaning and truth, both of which are dependent upon a theory of perception, thinking, and other psychological concepts. Here the Stoics developed a sophisticated theory of mental content and intentionality and wrestled with the ontological ramifications of such a theory. Finally, in ethics the Stoics developed a complex theory of emotion and a psychology of action that ultimately had a great impact on their moral philosophy. The development of one’s cognitive faculties was believed to be inseparable from ethics. In short, Stoic psychology was central to Stoicism as a whole.
Zeno of Citium (335-263 BCE), the founder of Stoicism, was very interested in the nature of the soul. He and his protégé Cleanthes (331-232 BCE) emphasized the active nature of the mind by identifying it as an internal fire or vital heat. It was not until Chrysippus (c. 280-207 BCE) that Stoic psychology reached its mature state. According to Chrysippus, the human soul consists of a breath-like substance called pneuma. Cognitive faculties were identified with the specific activities of the pneuma. In addition to being the substance of the particular souls of living organisms, pneuma was also held to be the organizing principle of the cosmos, that is, the world-soul. The Stoics identified this world-soul with God or Zeus. One source described God as an intelligent, artistic fire that systematically creates the cosmos as it expands; in the same passage God is called a pneuma that pervades the whole cosmos as the human soul pervades the mortal body. In contrast to contemporary physics and cosmology, the Stoics saw the world as a living organism.
Stoic psychology is inseparable from Stoic physics and cosmology. The pneuma of the human soul (pneuma psychikon) is said to be a mixture of air and fire. Some Stoics saw this soul as a literal mixture of fire and air, others associated it with a refined fire (similar to aether) or vital heat. The pneuma permeating the body was held to be a portion of the divine pneuma permeating and directing the cosmos. The human soul is a portion of God within us, both animating us and endowing us with reason and intelligence.
The Stoics argued that the soul is a bodily (corporeal) substance. Although the soul is a body, it is best to avoid calling Stoic psychology materialist. The Stoics contrasted soul and matter. For this reason scholars generally prefer to call Stoic psychology corporealist, physicalist, or vitalist. Matter is but one of two principles underlying every bodily substance. These two principles are the active [to poioun] and the passive [to paschon]. Matter is identified with the passive principle. Its complement, the active principle, is reason [logos] or God and is held to extend through matter providing it with motion, form, and structure. Both principles are bodily or corporeal principles (that is, they occupy space and are causally efficient) but neither exists in isolation. Substances can be dominated by either principle; the more active the substance, the more rational and divine it is; the more passive, the more material.
The Stoics also made a distinction between principles [archai] and elements [stoicheia]. The basic elements are earth, water, air, and fire. Earth and water are heavy, passive elements, dominated by the passive principle. Air and fire, on the other hand, are active and closely connected with sentience and intelligence. The Stoics held that the soul is nourished from the exhalations from the passive elements. Biological bodies are distinguished from non-biological bodies by the presence of a specific kind of activity associated with the presence of the active elements in the body.
Pneuma was the central theoretical tool of both Stoic physics and Stoic psychology. In contrast to the atomists, the Stoics argued for a continuum theory which denied the existence of void in the cosmos. The cosmos was seen as a single continuum of pneuma-charged substance. Qualitative difference between individual substances, such as between a rock and a pool of water, is determined by the degree of the tensional motion of the pneuma pervading the substance. Tensional motion [tonikê kinêsis] seems to be the motion of the pneuma in a body that simultaneously moves from the center to the surface and from the surface back to the center. Passive elements (earth and water) and dense bodies have a low degree of tensional activity, while active elements (fire and air) and the soul were seen to possess a high level of tensional motion. The Stoics organized all natural substances into different classes based on a hierarchy of powers or a scala naturae. The concept of tensional motion allowed the Stoics to have a unified physical theory based on pneuma, while at the same time having one that distinguished and explained the difference between organic and inorganic substances. Consequently Stoic physics showed that there exists a physical connection and continuity between mind and matter.
The Stoic scala naturae is a hierarchy of the powers in nature based on the activity and organization of the pneuma. Pneuma at its lowest level of organization and concentration produces simple cohesion in the matter in which it dwells; it holds together individual unified bodies. This state of cohesion and coherence is called hexis [cohesive state]. Bodies hold together on account of an internal flow of pneuma that begins at the center of the object extending to the surface and flowing back upon itself producing a tension from a two-way motion. Hence, even the most stable object possesses internal motion according to the Stoics. Wood and stones are example of things which possess hexis.
When the pneuma in a body is organized with a greater degree of activity, there is phusis or organic nature. Things that have phusis grow and reproduce but do not show signs of cognitive power. The pneuma that produces phusis also provides the stability or cohesion of hexis. The Stoics held that each power on this scala naturae subsumes the power below it. Plants are obvious examples of organisms that have both hexis and phusis but not soul.
The next tier of this hierarchy of pneumatic activity is soul [ psuchê]. The characteristic marks of this level of organization are the presence of impulse and perception. Non-rational animals have hexis [cohesive state], phusis [an organic nature], and psuchê [soul].
Only human beings and gods possess the highest level of pneumatic activity, reason [logos]. Reason was defined as a collection of conceptions and preconceptions; it is especially characterized by the use of language. In fact, the difference between how animals think and how humans think seems to be that human thinking is linguistic — not that we must vocalize thoughts (for parrots can articulate human sounds), but that human thinking seems to follow a syntactical and propositional structure in the manner of language. The Stoics considered thinking in rational animals as a form of internal speech.
The Stoic hierarchy of pneuma should not be confused with Aristotle’s theory of the hierarchy of the soul to which there is some resemblance. While the Stoic scala naturae explains both organic and inorganic substances, Aristotle’s hierarchy is limited to biological organisms. Aristotle’s theory is also based on a very different idea of soul.
The physical theory underlying Stoic psychology has some rather startling implications. For example, the Stoics held that active substances could pervade passive substances. Hence the soul, which is a body, is able to pervade the physical body. The soul does not pervade the body like the water in a sponge, that is, by occupying interstitial spaces; rather, the Stoics held that the corporeal pneuma occupied the exact same space as the passive matter, that is, both substances are mutually coextended [antiparektasis]. The soul permeates the body in the same way as heat pervades the iron rod, occupying the same space but being qualitatively distinct. The Stoics called this sort of mixture crasis or total blending.
Total blending should be contrasted with particulate mixture and fusion mixture. An example of a particulate mixture is the mixture of different kinds of seeds. Each seed remains unaffected by the mixture, only the distribution is altered. This is sometimes called juxtaposition. Fusion mixture occurs when the items mixed are physically altered and a new, single substance emerges. Once eggs, milk, yeast, and flour are mixed together a new substance is produced (bread). In contrast to fusion mixture, in total mixture or crasis the blended substances (such as water and wine) were held to retain their properties and in principle could be separated.
A particular and highly controversial characteristic of total blending is that for mutual coextension to occur, it is not necessary that both bodies be of the same in quantity. Thus Chrysippus provocatively claimed that in total blending a drop of wine could pervade (coextend through) the entire ocean. This is an explicit rejection of Aristotle’s theory of mixture in De generatione et corruptione. The pneuma in active substances seems to have great elasticity and is able to exist in a very rarified form while maintaining distinct properties.
The doctrine of pneuma and total blending allowed the Stoics to adopt Plato’s definition of death as “the separation of the soul from the body.” The Stoics, however, used this definition against Plato, arguing that since only physical things can separate from physical things, the soul must be corporeal. Since the soul pervades the body as a crasis type mixture, separation is possible. The separation seems to occur by a loosening of the tension of the soul. Sleep is said to be a kind of mild relaxing, whereas death is a total relaxing of the tension which results in the departure of the soul from the body.
Dying is not the end of a person’s existence, according to the Stoics. Once the soul has separated from the body it maintains its own cohesion for a period of time. Chrysippus and Cleanthes disagreed regarding the fate of the soul after death. Cleanthes held that the souls of all men could survive until the conflagration, a time in which the divine fire totally consumes all matter. Chrysippus, on the other hand, held that only the souls of the wise are able to endure. The souls of the unwise will exist for a limited time before they are destroyed or reabsorbed into the cosmic pneuma. The souls of irrational beasts are destroyed with their bodies. In no case is there any indication that the survival of the soul after death had any direct benefit to the individual or that the Stoics used this as a motivator toward ethical or intellectual behavior. There is no heaven or hell in Stoicism; the time to live one’s life and to perfect one’s virtues is in the present.
The pneuma of the soul has a specific structure which helps account for its capacities. The Stoics held that the soul consists of eight parts which are spatially recognized portions or streams of pneuma. The eight parts of the soul are the five senses (sight, vision, smell, taste, touch), the reproductive faculty, the speech faculty, and the central commanding faculty [hêgemonikon]. All of the parts of the soul can be seen as extensions of pneuma originating in the hêgemonikon. Several analogies were employed to explain the structure of the soul: the soul is like an octopus, a tree, a spring of water, and even a spider’s web. The analogies of the octopus, tree, and spring emphasize the unity of the soul and the idea that the individual powers or faculties are rooted in or sprout from the hêgemonikon in the heart. The Stoics, like Aristotle and Praxagoras of Cos, believed that the cognitive center is in the chest and not the head. These analogies are also consistent with Stoic views on embryological development; for the Stoics recognized that the heart is the first functioning organ of the fetus and held that the pneuma of the soul begins in the heart of the fetus and extends through the body, refining its powers as the fetus grows. The powers of sense perception, speech, and reproduction are extensions of the pneuma of the hêgemonikon which reaches its mature state as the child approaches adulthood.
Some have compared the Stoic contrast between the commanding faculty and the distal faculties to the modern distinction between the central and peripheral nervous systems. This comparison can be justified by the fact that the Stoics held that the higher cognitive functions and all cognitive experience take place exclusively in the hêgemonikon . While Aristotle seemed to be comfortable with attributing the experience of touch to the flesh and sight to the eyes, the Stoics tell us that the senses merely report the information to the central faculty where it is experienced and processed.
The idea of sensation as the transmission [diadosis] of sensory information is illustrated in the final two analogies of the soul. The first states that activity of the soul is like a king who sends out messengers. When the messengers acquire information they report it back to the king. Likewise, the hêgemonikon extends its pneuma to the sense organs, and when these in turn acquire sensory information, the pneuma transmits the information back to the heart. The second analogy states that the soul is like a spider in a web. When the web is disturbed by an insect the movement is transmitted through vibrations to the spider sitting at the center. The human soul in a like manner extends through the body like a sensory grid establishing a sensory tension [tonos]. All perceptual information is transmitted by a tensional motion [kinesis tonikê]. In the case of the senses of hearing and sight, the external medium between the sense organs and the sense object operates as an extension of the soul-pneuma. Air also contains a degree of tension which a sound disturbs like a pebble tossed into a calm pool; the sound is transmitted through the air and sends the auditory information in a spherical pattern. Once the tensional motion of the sound reaches the ears, the sound pattern is picked up by the pneuma of the body which in turn transmits the information to the hêgemonikon . Vision works similarly; the pneuma from the eyes interacts with external light to establish a cone shaped visual field. This tensed field can detect the shapes of the objects within as though by touch. Indeed all of the senses were thought to be forms of touch. Color was held to be a sort of surface texture on the object; apparently the Stoics held that each color had its own pattern of disturbance in the visual pneuma.
These analogies capture the relationship between the commanding faculty and the senses; they do not as effectively capture or explain the remaining two distal faculties: speech and reproduction. Whereas the senses are passive insofar as they receive the tensional motion of a sense object and communicate it to the command center, in the case of speech and reproduction the motion goes in the opposite direction. Speech is an expression and articulation of the tensional motion produced by the construction of thought in the hêgemonikon. Interestingly, it is the fact that speech is produced in conjunction with breath that Chrysippus used as a central argument for the location of the hêgemonikon in the heart and not the brain. Little survives on how the Stoics viewed the relationship between the commanding faculty and the reproductive faculty. Sources do tell us that seminal information which produces the child is drawn from the entire body of both parents; this is in contrast to the Aristotelian claim that the male parent contributes the form and the female the matter.
In addition to the eight parts of the soul, the human hêgemonikon itself was characterized by four basic powers: presentation [phantasia], impulse [hormê], assent [sugkatathesis], and reason [logos]. Iamblicus tells us that the eight parts of the soul differ in bodily substrata while the four powers of the hêgemonikon must be individuated by quality in regards to the same. In other words, the four powers of the hêgemonikon are not individually isolated in space; their identity seems to be characterized exclusively by their function.
The most basic power of the hêgemonikon is the ability to form presentations [phantasiai]. Other psychological states and activities such as mental assent, cognition, impulse, and knowledge are all either extensions or responses to presentations. Zeno defined a presentation as an imprinting [tupôsis] in the commanding faculty. He suggested that the soul is imprinted by the senses much in the same way as a signet ring imprints its shape in soft wax. At birth the hêgemonikon is said to be like a blank sheet of paper which is ready to receive writing; all our cognitive experience is drawn either directly or indirectly from sense experience, that is, empirically. Zeno held that the term phantasia comes from the word for light [phôs]. Like light, the presentation is said to reveal itself and its cause. Although few agree with his etymology, the report shows that Zeno saw the phantasia as containing two elements: the phenomenal experience of its object and the representational content (i.e. it represents an object in the world). The Stoics sometimes called the phantasia an affection [pathos] in the soul; this seems to emphasize that there is a qualitative experience inseparable from the representational information. When we see a red circle, we don’t just acquire information, we also experience it as a red circle.
Chrysippus was not comfortable with the imprint analogy that Zeno and Cleanthes employed. Taken literally the analogy fails to capture the complexity of mental content. What kind of imprint would a color or sound make? How could the pneuma within the chest maintain and store such a rich collection of patterns and information? Chrysippus suggested that the imprinting metaphor must be abandoned and instead preferred to call presentations “alterations” [alloiôsis or heteroiôsis] of the hêgemonikon . He stated that just as the same air can be simultaneously altered by many sounds, maintaining each, so the hêgemonikon could retain such diverse and complex information. Although this is a far from satisfying solution, we should remember that contemporary philosophy of mind still has much work to do in explaining memory and concept retention.
The Stoics distinguished presentations drawn directly from the senses [aisthetike phantasiai] and those which are produced by the mind from previously experienced phantasiai. The doctrine of presentation also provided the foundation for a theory of memory and concept formation. Memory was seen to be stored phantasiai. Conceptions [ennoêmata] on the other hand seemed to be collections or patterns of stored phantasiai. The Stoic theory is flexible enough to account for real and fictional (intentional) objects, thereby establishing a plausible theory of imagination. The Stoics distinguished between phantasia, phantaston, phantastikon, and phantasma. The phantaston is the object producing the phantasia. A phantastikon is a phantasia which does not come from a real object, such as those produced by the imagination. Imagination was explained as the manipulation of mental content. By taking elements from stored experience and enlarging, shrinking, transposing, or negating parts of the phantasiai it is possible imagine monsters; thus one can produce mental content which has no real object. For example we can create a mermaid by transposing a body of a fish onto a young woman’s torso. Although mermaids and monsters don’t exist, we need to explain how non-existing things can be the object of thought and even produce desire or attraction. The Stoics did this by drawing a distinction between the imagined object (phantasma), i.e. the mermaid, and the mental construct (phantastikon), the thought of the mermaid. We are not attracted to the idea or mental image of the mermaid but to the intentional object of the idea, namely to the mermaid herself. Similar distinctions were pursued in the early 20th century by philosophers such as Meninong and Russell.
The Stoics made a further distinction in their doctrine of presentations: some presentations are rational, some are not. Rational presentations are limited to human beings and are said to be “thoughts” [noeseis]. Thoughts, like other phantasiai, are physical states of the soul-pneuma. The characteristic feature of a rational presentation seems to be its structure or syntax. Something is said about something, and consequently the thought now has meaning — and if it is a proposition, it has a truth value associated with it. Simple thoughts, when expressed in language, have three elements: the object (thing signified), the sound (the signifier), and the linguistic/mental content (what is said). For example, in the sentence “The cat is black” the thing signified is the black cat; the signifier is the sounds of the words uttered; and finally the thing signified is the content of what is being said, namely, the claim regarding the color of a specific animal. The latter, the intelligible content of the statement, is called a lekton which is said to subsist with the rational presentation or thought; it is the content which is either true or false, not the object or the sound. A lekton is not a corporeal entity like a thought or the soul; it seems to be a theoretical entity which loosely corresponds to the contemporary notion of a proposition, a statement, or perhaps even the meaning of an utterance. It is the lekton that makes the sounds of a sentence to be more than just sounds. The doctrine of the lekta has generated much controversy in current scholarship and is recognized to be an important link between Stoic theory of mind and Stoic logic.
Although we may entertain and experience all sorts of presentations, we do not necessarily accept or respond to them all. Hence the Stoics held that some phantasiai receive assent and some do not. Assent occurs when the mind accepts a phantasia as true (or more accurately accepts the subsisting lekton as true). Assent is also a specifically human activity, that is, it assume the power of reason. Although the truth value of a proposition is binary, true or false, there are various levels of recognizing truth. According to the Stoics, opinion (doxa) is a weak or false belief. The sage avoids opinions by withholding assent when conditions do not permit a clear and certain grasp of the truth of a matter. Some presentations experienced in perceptually ideal circumstances, however, are so clear and distinct that they could only come from a real object; these were said to be kataleptikê (fit to grasp). The kataleptic presentation compels assent by its very clarity and, according to some Stoics, represents the criterion for truth. The mental act of apprehending the truth in this way was called katalepsis which means having a firm epistemic grasp.
The idea of katalepsis as a firm grasp reappears in Zeno’s famous analogy of the fist. According to Cicero, Zeno compared the phantasia to an open hand, assent, to a closing hand, the katalepsis, to a closed fist, and knowledge to a closed fist grasped by the other hand. Zeno’s analogy however may be a little misleading if the reader assumes there to be a temporal succession and a series of discreet processes. Other evidence indicates that this is not the point of the analogy. For example, katalepsis was defined as a kind of assent, not as a discrete post-assent process. A katalepsis is an assent to a kataleptic presentation. Moreover knowledge [epistemê] was defined as a katalepsis that is secure and unchangeable by reason. The point of the fist analogy then seems to be that the central powers of the commanding faculty have different and progressively greater epistemic weight. The analogy emphasizes the epistemic progression from simple presentations to the systematic coherence of knowledge (it being confirmed by and consistent with other katalepseis); the analogy is not fundamentally about the discreteness of the psychological powers.
The emphasis on assent in Stoic psychology and epistemology is an important contribution to ancient philosophy. The Stoics used assent to indicate that a phantasia had been accepted by the mind. It also allows the agent to entertain a cognition while at the same time reject it. Indeed, philosophical prudence often demands that we withhold assent in cases of doubt. The introduction of assent as a distinct process provided a plausible way to explain how an agent may entertain a specific thought without necessarily accepting it.
In addition to epistemology, assent plays an important role in the Stoic theory of action. Presentational content often provokes an inclination to act by representing something as desirable. This kind of presentation was called phantasia hormetikê or impulse-generating presentation and was held to produce an impulse to act. The impulse is therefore a sort of call to action which is manifested as a motion of pneuma directed toward the specific organs of action.
The basic function of impulse is to initiate motion. When we perceive an object or event in the physical world, a phantasia or presentation is produced in the commanding faculty which is then evaluated by the rational faculty. Depending on the content of the presentation and the individual’s conception of what is good, the object of perception may be classified as good, evil, or indifferent. Thefaculty of assent in conjunction with reason will accept, reject, or withhold judgement based on the value of the object. If the object is deemed good, an impulse is initiated as a kind of motion in the soul substratum. If the object is bad, repulsion [aphormê] is produced, and the agent withdraws from the object under consideration.
We have seen that the Stoics held that at birth the soul is free of experiential content. The Stoics, however, did not hold that this excluded the possibility that we are born with innate characteristics and psychological impulses. The most basic impulse found in new-born creatures is the impulse toward self-preservation. This is the primary human impulse and the starting point of Stoic ethics. This impulse is implanted by Nature and entails a certain consciousness of things appropriate to (or belonging to) the organism and of things alien or hostile to the creature. In contrast to the Epicureans, who held that the primary impulse was toward pleasure, the Stoics argued that the innate impulse toward self-regard and an awareness of one’s own constitution was even more elementary. This innate impulse explains how animals naturally know how to use their limbs and defensive organs and why it is that animals naturally recognize predators as enemies.
Children and animals, however, are not rational; Nature must therefore supply the primary impulse as a foundation for behavior. In the case of animals the innate impulses explain a range of complex behavior, which in many cases appears intelligent. For example, the Stoics held that a spider does not possess rationality despite the apparently intelligent use of a web to catch insects. Primary impulses in animals are therefore identified with complex instincts. In the case of human beings, primary impulse is ideally a transitional mechanism. As children mature into adults, they develop rationality so that the impulse toward self-preservation falls under the scrutiny of reason. Rationality permits the agent to develop the notion of duty and virtue, which may at times take precedence over self-preservation. As the agent progresses in virtue and reason, children, family members, neighbors, fellow citizens, and finally all humankind are likewise seen as intrinsically valuable and incorporated into the agent’s sphere of concern and interest. This process is called oikeiôsis or the doctrine of appropriation and is central to the Stoic ethics.
Also closely associated with the doctrine of the primary impulse is the Stoic doctrine of preconception [prolepsis]. A preconception is an innate disposition to form certain conceptions. The most frequently mentioned preconceptions are the concept of the good and the concept of God. Since the Stoics held that the soul is a blank sheet at birth, the preconception cannot be a specific cognition but only an innate disposition to form certain concepts.
The final element of Stoic philosophy of mind to be presented in this article is the doctrine of the passions. Plato and Aristotle held that the soul had both rational and irrational parts and used this view to explain mental conflict. For example, the irrational “appetitive part” of the soul may desire a steady diet of rich and fatty foods. The rational part of the soul, however, will resist the demands of the irrational part since such a diet is unhealthy. The result is emotional conflict and in somecases moral conflict. Most Stoics (Posidonius being the most famous exception), in contrast, denied the existence of an irrational faculty. However, in order to explain the phenomenon of mental conflict, the Stoics developed a theory of passion which they believed could do the same work as Plato’s or Aristotle’s.
The Stoics defined passion in several ways, each emphasizing a different facet of the term. The four most common accounts or definitions of passion are:
Each definition emphasizes a different aspect of passion. The first two definitions tell us that a passion is a kind of impulse. The first of these focuses on force. A passion is a runaway impulse or emotion. Chrysippus compared a passion to a person running downhill and unable to stop at will. The soul is carried away by the sheer force and strength of the impulse. Passions often develop a momentum that cannot easily be stopped. Some texts also emphasize that there is a temporal dimension to passion. The fresher the passion, the stronger the impulse; passions usually weaken over time.
The second and third definitions emphasize the logical side of passion. Passions are unruly and contrary to reason. They are based on mistaken thinking or false opinions. The fact that passions are irrational does not mean that they come from an irrational faculty. They can be errors produced by the rational faculty. Having a rational faculty does not imply infallibility. Rather, it implies that cognitive states are produced through an inferential process which operates with a syntax similar to language. Mathematics operates in a similar fashion. When we make mathematical errors, we do not appeal to a non-mathematic part of the soul which conflicts with the mathematical. Rather we attribute the error to a single, though limited and fallible, rational faculty. The Stoics saw passion in the same way. Passions are false judgements or mistakes in regards to the value of something and are thereby misdirected impulses. According to Stoic ethics, only virtues are truly good, whereas externals such as wealth, honor, power, and pleasure are indifferent to our happiness since each can also harm us and each ultimately lies beyond our control. These externals then are said to be morally “indifferent” (adiaphoron). When we mistakenly value something indifferent as though it were a genuine good, we form a false judgement and experience passion.
The traditional Stoic passions can be broken down into four different kinds or classes of errors in judgement. These errors concern the good and bad (value), and the present and the future (time):
When one identifies something as good in the present when in fact it is not truly a good we have the passion called pleasure and its subspecies. When we do the same in the future we have appetite. Likewise when we misidentify something as bad in the present, we experience the passion called distress; when we err regarding something in the future we call it fear.
The fourth and final definition of passion as “a fluttering in the soul” is most likely a physical description of passion much as Aristotle describes anger as a boiling of blood around the heart. As corporealists, the Stoics frequently described activities as physical descriptions of the pneuma of the soul. The Stoics defined the individual passions as an irrational swelling or rising [heparsis]. When our impulses are excessive and unruly, the pneuma in one’s chest canfeel like a fluttering. In contrast, Zeno described happiness, a state which presupposed rationality and virtue, as a smooth flowing soul. The fluttering may also signify the instability of passions as judgements. Chrysippus illustrated emotional disruption caused by the fluttering of passion with the example of Euripides’ Medea, who continually flipped back and forth from one judgement to another.
These four definitions or descriptions of passion are in agreement though each emphasizes a different aspect of passion. For example, grief over lost or stolen property is considered a passion, a species of distress. Since the object of concern (the stolen property) is in truth of no moral worth (indifferent), for it is only our virtuous response to the situation that qualifies as morally good or bad, the impulse identified with the grief is excessive (1). Since we do not heed reason which would tell us that happiness lies in virtue alone, it is also an impulse disobedient to reason (2). Likewise, since the value attributed to an object does not represent its true worth, it is a false judgement (3). Finally, the distress which we experience in the grief manifests itself not as a smooth calm state but as a fluttering or disturbance in our soul (4).
If passions are excessive impulses and mistaken judgements resulting in emotional disquietude, there must also be appropriate impulses and correct judgements resulting in emotional peace. It is a mistake to assume that if the Stoics reject passion that they seek a life void of any emotion, that is, that they seek to be emotionally flat. A better reading of Stoicism is that the goal is not absence of emotion, but a well-disposed emotional life. This is a life in which impulses are rational, moderate, and held in check. It is a state in which one’s impulses are appropriate to and consistent with the nature of things, both regarding the truth of the judgement and the degree of the response. This view is supported by the Stoic doctrine of the eupatheiai. Calling positive emotions “good-passions” may have been an attempt to rectify the misrepresentation of their school as being void of emotion. Examples of the eupatheiai are joy [khara], caution [eulabeia], and reasonable wishing [boulêsis]. Joy is said to be the counterpart of pleasure, caution is contrasted with fear, and reasonable wishing is contrasted with appetite. The difference is that in the eupatheiai the force of the impulse is appropriate to the value of the object, the impulse is consistent with rational behavior, and finally the belief or judgement regarding the nature of the object is true.
One should note that there are only three categories for the eupatheiai in contrast to the four for passions [é]. There is no eupatheia corresponding to distress. This is due to the Stoic conception of moral invincibility. Distress was defined as an incorrect judgement regarding a present evil. The Stoics, however, held that the good lies not in external events or objects but in the virtuous response of the moral agent to any situation. Since it is always possible to respond virtuously, there is no true evil in the present. The good is always possible here and now.
Last updated: July 28, 2005 | Originally published: October/22/2002
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