Guidelines for Authors

Authors should follow these guidelines before submitting their final draft. Not following the guidelines adds time to the copy editing and formatting process, and very often requires multiple exchanges of emails about this or that feature of the article. The most common mistakes are to use footnotes, to write an opening summary that is too short, and to include a bibliography that is too long.

Table of Contents

  1. General
    1. Author Copyright and Licensing Agreement
    2. Length
    3. Article's Purpose
  2. Content
    1. Level of Sophistication
    2. Opening Summary
    3. Structure of Articles on People
    4. Structure of Articles on Topics
  3. Style
    1. Formal Style
    2. Simple Style
    3. Minimize Use of Quotations and References
    4. Stylistic Conventions
  4. Format
    1. Table of Contents and Headings
    2. References & Bibliographies
    3. Hyperlinks
    4. Graphics, Photos, & Charts
    5. Foreign Language Terms
    6. Description of Author
    7. Acknowledgments
  5. Miscellaneous
    1. How to Submit an Article
    2. Authors Who Are Non-Native English Speakers
    3. Editing After Acceptance
    4. Atypical Review and Publication Delays

1. General

a. Author Copyright and Licensing Agreement

The author of an article enters into an agreement with the IEP such that:

  1. The author grants exclusive and perpetual license to the IEP to use and distribute the article through Internet media.
  2. This license covers the present version/edition of the IEP, all future versions/editions of the IEP, and all derivations of the IEP in the present media format as well as other possible formats such as new IEP sites, printed works, DVD, and CD ROM.
  3. The author receives no financial payment for his/her article from the IEP.
  4. Authors retain copyright to their article and the right to publish the article in a format that does not compete with the IEP in nature and scope. IEP articles cannot be posted elsewhere on the internet where there is public access; those websites should link to our articles instead. The IEP has an interest in preventing the dilution of this resource that can occur when IEP articles are copied and posted on external sites. The IEP also has an interest in assuring that only the most recently updated versions of its articles are on the internet, and external duplication compromises this interest. With some types of password protected websites, reproducing complete articles may be allowable. With printed publications, authors must inform the IEP general editors of any secondary publishing opportunity and also inform the secondary publisher about the author's prior agreement with the IEP.  You, as the author, can use all or any part of your IEP article elsewhere in printed formats. However, you need to be careful that you do not accidentally sign over the copyrights of that material to your publisher whose standard contract may say that none of your material be published elsewhere. If this happens, then the IEP could have to remove your article. The best way to avoid that is by including an acknowledgement somewhere in your new article or book that says that the passages in question are revised versions of articles in the IEP and appear in your book by permission of the IEP.
  5. The IEP reserves the right to grant permission to reprint articles at the request of third-parties (such as universities or book publishers), particularly when the third-party publication is in keeping with the nonprofit and educational mission of the IEP; for-profit requests will be deferred to the author.
  6. The IEP routinely re-evaluates posted articles for their academic rigor, currentness, readability, length, intended audience, and placement within the overall vision of the IEP. The IEP reserves the right to discontinue using a posted article. To assist in such re-evaluations, the editors may solicit post-publication peer reviews of articles and contact authors for needed revisions. In some cases, if an author is not able to revise an article as requested by the IEP editors, it may be removed and replaced with one on the same topic by a different author. In other cases, an article topic itself may fall outside the evolving vision of the IEP and may be removed without replacement. In either case, the licensing agreement with the author will terminate, and the author will regain full copyrights to the article, including the right to publish it elsewhere on the Internet.

b. Length

Most articles on the IEP are 6,000 – 15,000 words. Articles on minor topics should be at least 6,000 words in length, not counting bibliographical material. Those on the most important topics should be between 10,000 and 15,000 words. There are no space restrictions, and authors are encouraged to err on the side of being too long rather than too short. Articles about major philosophers may require a series of articles to adequately cover the scope of their contributions; see for example the set of articles on Aristotle and the set on Hume.

c. Article's Purpose

The purpose of your article is to present information accepted by colleagues working in the area. An encyclopedia article is not the place to defend an original thesis. Your article will explain the topic in language the reader can understand, and it will present the important distinctions, the main results, and the main points of view on controversial issues. Your article should call attention to related topics and should provide some references in case the reader wishes to read further on your topic.

2. Content

a. Level of Sophistication

The Encyclopedia's articles should be written with the intention that most of the article can be understood by advanced undergraduates majoring in philosophy and by other scholars who are not working in the field covered by that article. The IEP articles are written by experts but not for experts in analogy to the way the Scientific American magazine is written by scientific experts but not primarily for scientific experts. For topics that are unavoidably technical, such as an article on Einstein's General Theory of Relativity or on Ramsey sentences in logic, the goal should be to make the early parts easy going so that the technically unsophisticated reader will still profit from reading much of the article.

b. Opening Summary

Preceding the table of contents, the beginning of each article should contain a summary of the article in 200 to 500 words. The purpose of the summary is to give readers a quick overview of your topic. See the article on Descartes as an example. You have three goals to achieve simultaneously: (1) to convey some understanding of your topic to those readers who will read the summary with no intention of reading the entire article, (2) to say something intriguing that will make readers want to continue reading beyond the summary, and (3) to give readers who do intend to read the full article some idea of the territory ahead. Think of the opening summary as functioning as a brief entry that might appear in a philosophy dictionary.

Here is what not to do in the opening summary. Do not focus primarily on saying your topic or your philosopher is influential and important. Instead add more information about what philosophical contributions are made and how. Put yourself in the shoes of a reader who probably will not be reading your full article but only its opening summary and who wants to learn something about what issues are covered and in what manner. For articles on an individual philosopher, focus on what theses the philosopher defended, and what style of doing philosophy were represented. It would be preferable not to include quotations and citations but to make your points in your own words. The more detailed quotations and citations can be included later in your article. Do not list the opening summary in the table of contents.

c. Structure of Articles on People

The body of the article should begin with a biography of the philosopher. The bulk of the article will consist of a discussion of the philosopher's main philosophical contributions; in most cases a topical presentation of this material is preferred over a strictly chronological presentation. The discussion might include influences on the philosopher, traditional criticisms of the philosopher, and the impact of the philosopher on later philosophers. See the article on Francis Bacon as an example.  As in the Bacon article, you are encouraged to include a copyright-free picture with your own article.

d. Structure of Articles on Topics

The opening sentence of the summary paragraph should be a general definition of the term being used, such as, "The term 'category' means ultimate or fundamental division." The opening of the article body should say something about the origin of the term, the context in which the term is used, or alternative definitions of the term. The article will typically consist of a chronological survey of philosophical theories relating to the term. Where appropriate, include traditional criticisms of the theories in question. Please see the article on Logical Paradoxes as an example.

3. Style

a. Formal Style

All articles should be written in a formal, yet simple style, such as that used in the Encyclopedia Britannica, the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, or the Encyclopedia of Philosophy edited by Paul Edwards. Avoid slang.  Avoid reference to yourself, as in "I find this argument to be unconvincing," or "As I've shown in the previous paragraph...."

b. Simple Style

Articles should be written in a straightforward style that is accessible to intelligent but general readers. Although the IEP is regularly visited by professional philosophers, many users of the IEP are philosophy students or philosophically curious web surfers. To best serve these latter users, authors should minimize unnecessary technical vocabulary.

c. Minimize Use of Quotations and References

The expectation is that authors will paraphrase and interpret and not primarily excerpt or quote. Do not adopt the attitude that every claim needs to be supported by a reference (that is, a citation). Encyclopedia articles are different than journal articles in the sense that they aren't expected to defend all their remarks, but rather are expected simply to lay out the accepted wisdom on the topic. If an article has a decent annotated bibliography, then the IEP would publish the article even if it were to have no in-line citations. On the other hand, sometimes it can be helpful to readers of an encyclopedia article to offer citations or references for key points; the editors won't remove any of these if they are included.

d. Stylistic Conventions

Spelling and punctuation using U.S. English conventions are preferred, but articles using U.K. English conventions are acceptable; stick to one style or the other. Footnotes and endnotes are not allowed. Convert any footnotes into in-line citations to the bibliography. Avoid using underlining or bold face. Minimize the use of  italics. Minimize the use of in-text references such as " shown in section (4) second paragraph below and also in section (6)." Authors who are non-native English speakers have the responsibility to submit articles that do not read like broken English, and that are stylistically intelligible to native English speakers. Many of our foreign authors recruit English-speaking proofreaders before submitting their articles.

Avoid the use of most Latin abbreviations. Here are the replacements:

cf. | compare
et. al. | and others
etc. | and so forth
e.g. | for example
i.e. | that is
NB | note
viz. | namely

It is OK to use "ibid." and "op. cit." Of course it is proper to use Latin quotations and names of Latin books.

4. Format

a. Table of Contents and Section Headings

When your article has been accepted and is being formatted, the sections headings in the body of the article will be generated automatically from the table of contents, not from whatever you have within the body of your article. So, a last-minute change by the author to a section title without a corresponding change in the table of contents will be missed when the article is formatted.

For typical articles, please use between 5 and 15 section headings. Less than five will make the article difficult to follow. More than 15 will make the contents list too complex and, in most cases, make some of the sections too short and thus appear visually awkward. Do not mention the opening summary in the table of contents. Use capitals and small case, not all capitals.  Use of subheadings is optional.  That is, the table of contents can either be flat or hierarchical.

Use the following numbering and lettering conventions:

  1. Heading One
    1. Subheading One
      1. Subsubheading One
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
      2. Subsubheading Two
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
    2. Subheading Two
  2. Heading Two
  3. Heading Three
  4. References and Further Reading

Although a hierarchical table of contents may have up to four levels, we encourage you to restrict yours to at most three levels (that is, to only headings and two subheadings, or only to a, b, c and i, ii, iii) for visual elegance. Try to avoid needing another level that is numbered. The final heading of any article must be called "References and Further Reading."

b. References and Bibliographies

Bibliographies should be brief at around 20 entries. Do not exceed 50 entries except in special cases with approval from the general editors. Whenever possible, the IEP prefers bibliographies that are annotated with a short sentence describing the nature of the work cited; see Fallibilism for an example. The rationale for these policies is that long, unannotated lists will confuse casual readers, and will not be needed by professional researchers who already will have more extensive lists available from elsewhere.

We suggest that you follow MLA format for your bibliographies, but other formats are acceptable. The heading for the bibliography must be "References and Further Reading," but it may contain subheadings.  Typical subheadings are "Primary Sources" and "Secondary Sources."  Italicize all names of books and journals; do not use underlining.  Do not use dashes in place of author names, although this is commonly done in journals. The IEP does not allow references to forthcoming publications.

c. Hyperlinks

When appropriate, include hyperlinks in your article to other IEP articles. Please see the article on Comparative Philosophy as an example. You may simply indicate where hyperlinks are inserted; you do not need to include the actual html coding. However, do not include any hyperlinks to non-IEP web sites unless these are stable sites that are very unlikely to be changed during the next fifty years. The IEP aims at being a self-contained resource, rather than a link list. Also, because external links require continual updating, we hope to avoid this time-consuming task. If you do include a link, never include a date of access, as you might for a journal article.

d. Graphics, Photos, and Charts

Authors are encouraged to include graphics in their articles, provided they do not infringe on copyrights. See the article on Francis Bacon as an example. The graphics (including photos, charts and tables) need to be in either .jpg or .gif or pdf format. The IEP staff cannot create graphics, but can crop a graphic and make simple adjustments to a graphic's size and border.

e. Foreign Language Terms

Authors should minimize the use of italics with foreign language terms. Regarding diacritical marks, use those that have html codes. Replace other diacritical marks with ordinary letters. Please see our helpsheets on Chinese and Indian languages.

f. Description of Author

When you send your article to be refereed, do not include information about yourself. However, when you are submitting your final draft after acceptance, then do include your name, email address, your university's name, and your country.  Do not include your title (for example, "associate professor"), your department name (for example "Department of Humanities and Philosophy"), your university's street address, or your personal webpage address.

g. Acknowledgments

Do not include acknowledgements to colleagues who provided input on your article, nor to institutions that provided you with funding. Thank them privately.

5. Miscellaneous

a. How to Submit an Article

Remove all page numbers and any right justification in the article. Save your article in MS Word format. Send it to your area editor or to the general editors as an e-mail attachment. In that email, add separate attachments for all the graphics, photos, and charts. The editors will then reformat the article to fit the standard IEP design and layout.

If you submit your article along with a photograph to be used in your article, then you should send the general editors a note asserting that the photo is in the public domain and so no longer under copyright or that you are the photographer and that you and the person photographed agree that the copyright for the photograph will belong with the author and the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy. The version of the photograph that would appear in the IEP might be resized or altered in some other way, and, in any case, would not become open source or public domain.

b. Authors Who Are Non-Native English Speakers

Authors who do not speak English as their primary language must have their articles revised by a native English speaker, or equivalent, prior to submission.

c. Editing After Acceptance

The acceptance process for articles is described in the page on the Submissions Page. After acceptance, the IEP staff copy edits the article before publication, but the author is not sent proofs, as is the case in journal articles. Instead, the changes are made, and the article is provisionally posted in the Encyclopedia; then in the early days of the publication (before Google and other search engines re-index the IEP site to include new articles) the author is notified and encouraged to read the article and request changes.

After the article is submitted and accepted by the area editor, the general editors and their copy editors will usually make minor stylistic changes that are intended not to affect the article's content. The general editors have the right of final acceptance of all articles. In carrying out a unified plan for the entire IEP, the general editors may solicit additional peer reviews of submitted articles, and request that authors make additional changes including changes to content, style and length. At any time the general editors may also alter article titles and revise the opening summary of articles.

After your article is published, feel free to come back in later weeks or years and request further changes, including changes of content. You may make any minor content changes you wish. Major changes in content should be approved by the area editor. Examples of major changes would be the elimination of several paragraphs covering a particular topic, the addition of a lengthy discussion of a new topic, or a reorganization that requires addition or deletion of a heading or subheading in the table of contents. A minor change is one that improves the presentation of a point and that does not involve the alteration or removal of a heading or subheading.

When telling us what to change, we prefer that you not send a revision of the Word document that you originally sent when the article was posted. That removes all the improvement made by the copy editor and by the formatter. Instead, do the following if you can:

Make a small number (less than 20) minor changes by sending your area editor or the general editors a list of desired changes in an email or an attached Word document. Indicate where the change is to be made by giving the section number and the paragraph number such as: Change 2nd sentence of 3rd paragraph of section 4b to be "Kant said Aristotle meant 1 + 1 = 2." Do not mention page numbers because page numbers on your own computer can be different than those on another person's computer.

For more major changes or extensive minor changes, authors are encouraged to make changes directly to the HTML source code after saving the posted document. You may access the HTML source code through various web browsers; with Internet Explorer, this is done by going to “Page | View Source” in the pull down menu. We request that you revise the HTML source in either Wordpad or Notepad; doing so in Word, WordPerfect, or an HTML conversion tool often will introduce stray HTML codes upon saving.

There are alternatives. Save your article as an html document, then edit it with an html editor and send the result. Accompany this with a second document giving some explanation of the kinds of changes you are making.

Capture the content of your online article as a Word document, indicate changes in red font in the Word document, and send that.

d. Atypical Review and Publication Delays

Authors should contact their area editor if, after submission, there is an unusually long delay at a particular juncture in the process from the article's initial submission to its final appearance on the IEP website. Each submission typically passes through five hands (area editor, reviewer, general editor, copy editor, formatter). While we strive to maintain an efficient production process, occasionally there are unexpected delays as a result of scheduling issues with our all-volunteer staff. In the rare event that this occurs, the author should send a follow up email if there is a delay of more than one month at any given stage.

An encyclopedia of philosophy articles written by professional philosophers.