Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

17th Century Theories of Substance

In contemporary, everyday language, the word “substance” tends to be a generic term used to refer to various kinds of material stuff (“we need to clean this sticky substance off the floor”) or as an adjective referring to something’s mass, size, or importance (“that is a substantial bookcase”).  In 17th century philosophical discussion, however, this term’s meaning is only tangentially related to our everyday use of the term.  For 17th century philosophers the term  is reserved for the ultimate constituents of reality on which everything else depends.  This article discusses the most important theories of substance from the 17th century: those of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Although these philosophers were highly original thinkers, they shared a basic conception of substance inherited from the scholastic-Aristotelian tradition from which philosophical thinking was emerging.  In a general sense each of these theories is a way of working out dual commitments: a commitment to substance as an ultimate subject and a commitment to the existence of God as a substance.  In spite of these systematic similarities between the theories, they ultimately offer very different accounts of the nature of substance.  Given the foundational role substance plays in the metaphysical schemes of these thinkers, it will not be surprising to find that these theories of substance underlie dramatically different accounts of the nature and structure of reality.

Table of Contents

  1. 17th Century Theories of Substance: A Shared Background
  2. Descartes
    1. Descartes’ Account of Substance
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Are Embodied Human Beings Substances?
    4. How is Substance Independent?
    5. How Many Material Substances?
  3. Spinoza
    1. Spinoza’s Account of Substance
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Why doesn’t Spinoza Countenance Created Substance?
    4. How Can a Substance Have More than One Attribute?
    5. An Extended and Indivisible Substance?
  4. Leibniz
    1. Leibniz’s Account of Substances
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Experience and Reality
    4. What is Wrong with Composite Beings?
    5. Leibniz and Spinoza
  5. 17th Century Theories of Substance in Perspective
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts in English
    2. Secondary Texts

1. 17th Century Theories of Substance: A Shared Background

In thinking about 17th century accounts of substance we need to keep in mind that a concern with substance and its nature was nothing new to the period. In fact, philosophical thinking about the nature of substance stretches all the way back to ancient Greece.  While the new philosophers of the 17th century were keen to make a break with the past and to tackle philosophical and scientific problems from new foundations, their views did not develop in an intellectual vacuum.  Indeed, the scholastic-Aristotelian tradition of the day informed their thinking about substance in a number of ways, and contributed to a number of commonalities in their thought. Before looking at specific theories of substance, it is important to note four commonalities in particular.

Substance, Mode, Inherence

For the philosophers we will discuss, at the very deepest level the universe contains only two kinds or categories of entity: substances and modes.  Generally speaking, modes are ways that things are; thus shape (for example being a rectangle), color (for example redness), and size (for example length) are paradigm modes.  As a way a thing is, a mode stands in a special relationship with that of which it is a way.  Following a tradition reaching back to Aristotle’s Categories, modes are said to exist in, or inhere in, a subject.  Similarly, a subject is said to have or bear modes.  Thus we might say that a door is the subject in which the mode of rectangularity inheres.  One mode might exist in another mode (a color might have a particular hue, for example), but ultimately all modes exist in something which is not itself a mode, that is, in a substance.  A substance, then, is an ultimate subject.

Independence and Priority

The new philosophers of the 17th century follow tradition in associating inherence with dependence.  They all agree that the existence of a mode is dependent in a way that the existence of a substance is not.  The idea is that modes, as the ways that things are, depend for their existence on that of which they are modes, e.g. there is no mode of ‘being 8’0 long’ without there being a subject that is 8’0 long.  Put otherwise, the view is that the existence of a mode ultimately requires or presupposes the existence of a substance.  This point is sometimes put by saying that substances, as subjects, are metaphysically prior to modes.

Degrees of Reality

In contrast to contemporary philosophers, most 17th century philosophers held that reality comes in degrees—that some things that exist are more or less real than other things that exist.  At least part of what dictates a being’s reality, according to these philosophers, is the extent to which its existence is dependent on other things: the less dependent a thing is on other things for its existence, the more real it is.  Given that there are only substances and modes, and that modes depend on substances for their existence, it follows that substances are the most real constituents of reality.

God Exists and is a Substance

Furthermore, each of the philosophers we will discuss maintains (and offer arguments on behalf of the claim) that God exists, and that God’s existence is absolutely independent.  It is not surprising then, given the above, that each of these philosophers holds that God is a substance par excellence.

2. Descartes

Descartes’ philosophical system, including his account of substance was extremely influential during the 17th century.  For more details see the IEP entry René Descartes: Overview.  Unlike Spinoza and Leibniz, however, Descartes’ theory of substance was not the centerpiece of his philosophical system.  Nonetheless, Descartes offered a novel theory of substance which diverged in important ways from the Scholastic-Aristotelian tradition.

a. Descartes’ Account of Substance

It is sometimes said that Descartes gives two different definitions of substance, and indeed in the Principles and Second Replies he defines substance in distinct ways.  We should not, however, see this as evidence that Descartes changed his mind.  On the contrary, it is clear that for Descartes these definitions express two sides of a unified account of substance.

Let us begin with the definition he offers in his Principles of Philosophy (I.51-52).  There he defines ‘substance’ in terms of independence.  He begins by making clear that there are really two different philosophical senses of the term (corresponding to two degrees of independence).  For reasons that will become clear in a moment, let us distinguish the two senses by calling one Substance and the other Created Substance.  Descartes’ definitions can be paraphrased as follows:

Substance: A thing whose existence is dependent on no other thing.

Created Substance: A thing whose existence is dependent on nothing other than God.

Strictly speaking, for Descartes there is only one Substance (as opposed to Created Substance), since there is only one thing whose existence is independent of all other things: God.  However, within the universe that God has created there are entities the existence of which depends only on God.  These lesser substances are the ultimate constituents of the created world.

The definition of substance that Descartes offers in the Second Replies (and elsewhere), ignores the distinction between God and creation and defines substance in a much more traditional way, claiming that a substance is a subject that has or bears modes, but is not itself a mode of anything else.  This fits right in with his other comments about substance in the Principles.  Thus, he tells us that each created substance has exactly one attribute (Principles I. 53).  An attribute of a substance, Descartes explains, is its “principle property which constitutes its nature and essence, and to which all its other properties are referred” (Ibid.).  A substance’s attribute, consequently, dictates its kind since attributes “constitute” a substance’s nature and all and only those things of the same nature are of the same kind.  Moreover, in claiming that all a substance’s properties are referred through the substance’s attribute, Descartes is claiming that a substance’s attribute dictates the properties that a substance may have.

Descartes specifies two attributes: thought and extension.  Consequently, there are at least two kinds of created substance—extended substances and thinking substances.  By ‘extension’ Descartes just means having length, breadth, and depth.  More colloquially we might say that to be extended is just to take up space or to have volume.  Whereas by ‘thinking substance’ Descartes just means ‘mind’.  Although Descartes only ever discusses these two attributes, he never explicitly rules out the possibility of other attributes.  Nevertheless, the tradition has interpreted Descartes as holding that there are only two kinds of created substance and it is for this reason that Descartes is often called a substance dualist.

With this specification in hand we are in a better position to understand what Descartes means when he says that all a substance’s properties are referred through the substance’s attribute or “principle property.”  Consider an extended substance, say, a particular rock.  Among this rock’s properties are shape and size; but having these properties presupposes the property of extension.  Put otherwise, something cannot have a shape or a size without also being extended.  Furthermore, the properties that the rock may have are limited to modifications of extension—a rock cannot have the property of experiencing pain for example, since the property of experiencing pain is not a way of being extended.   In general, we can say that for Descartes i) the attribute of a substance is its most general property, and that ii) every other property of a substance is merely a specification of, way of being, or mode of that attribute.

b. What Substances are There?

Given this account of the nature of substance, what substances exist?  Descartes famously argues in Meditation Six that human minds and bodies are really distinct—that is, that they are each substances.  Indeed, every individual consciousness or mind is a thinking substance.  Furthermore Descartes treats bodies, including the objects of our everyday experience (chairs, trees, spoons, etc.) as extended substances. This makes sense: extension is an attribute of substance, so it would seem to follow that anything that is extended (has the attribute of extension) is itself a substance.  Moreover the parts of extended substances, as themselves extended, would seem to be extended substances for Descartes (see Principles I. 60). Given that Descartes thinks that matter is infinitely divisible (Principles II. 20)—that each part of matter is itself extended all the way down—it follows that there are an infinite number of extended substances.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  The most real thing is God on which all other things depend.  However, within the created realm there are entities that are independent of everything besides God.  These are the created substances.  Created substances come in two kinds—extended substances and minds, and there is a plurality of both.

This brief summary of Descartes’ account of substance raises a number of deeper questions and controversies.  One central question that naturally arises is why Descartes thinks that extension and thought are the most general properties of substances.  For a detailed discussion of Descartes’ reasons see the IEP entry René Descartes: The Mind-Body Distinction. This entry will briefly consider the role of embodied human beings in Descartes metaphysics, what Descartes means in calling substances independent, and a related controversy concerning the number of material substances to which Descartes is entitled.

c. Are Embodied Human Beings Substances?

Embodied human beings fit uneasily into Descartes’ metaphysics.  As embodied, humans are composite beings; an embodied human being consists of a mental substance (our mind) and a physical one (our body), for Descartes.  Descartes thinks that this composite being is, however, something over and above a mere aggregation.  He writes in Mediation Six: “Nature also teaches me…that I am not merely present in my body as a sailor is present in a ship, but that I am very closely joined and, as it were, intermingled with it, so that I and the body form a unit” (my italics).  In general, it is clear that Descartes thinks that embodied humans are exceptional beings in some regard, but how we should understand this mind/body union and its place in Descartes’ metaphysics has been a matter of some controversy among scholars.  One of the more prominent disputes has been between those scholars who read Descartes as holding that embodied human beings are a distinct kind of created substance, and those scholars who do not.  The former see Descartes as a substance trialist, whereas the latter read him along traditional lines as a substance dualist.  For trialist readings see Hoffman 1986 and Skirry 2005: Chapter 4).  For recent defenses of substance dualism against trialist interpretations see Kaufman 2008 and Zaldivar 2011.

d. How is Substance Independent?

As we have seen, Descartes defines substance in terms of independence.  This, however, is only a very general claim.  In order to better understand Descartes’ account of substance we need to have a better idea of the way in which substances are independent.  On one hand, in his thinking about substance Descartes is working with the traditional conception of independence according to which a substance’s existence is independent in a way that a mode’s existence is not, since substances are ultimate subjects.  Accordingly, let us say that substances are subject-independent.  On the other hand, in his account of substance Descartes is also working with a causal sense of independence.  After all, the reason that God is the only Substance (as opposed to Created Substance) is that all other things “can exist only with the help of God’s concurrence” (Principles I.51), and Descartes understands this as the causal claim that all other things are God’s creation and require his continual conservation.  Consequently scholars have seen Descartes as holding that in general i) God is both causally and subjectively independent (God is not, after all, a mode of anything else), ii) created substances are causally independent of everything but God and subjectively independent, and iii) modes are both causally and subjectively dependent in that they both depend on God’s continual conservation and on created substances as subjects. (See for example, Markie 1994: 69; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2008: 79-80)

e. How Many Material Substances?

That created substances are causally independent of everything but God suggests a startling conclusion—that despite what Descartes seems to say, bodies are not material substances, since they are not sufficiently independent.  Bodies are causally dependent on other bodies in a host of different ways.  For example, bodies come to be and are destroyed by other bodies: a person is the product of  their parents and could die as the result of getting hit by a car.  Indeed, according to one scholarly tradition, there is only one material thing that satisfies Descartes’ definition of created substance—the material universe as a whole (see for example, Cottingham 1986: 84-85).  Again, following tradition we can call this view the Monist Interpretation, and the opposing view that there are many material substances, the Pluralist Interpretation (for a distinct view see Woolhouse 1993: 22-23).  It would appear, then, that there is philosophical evidence of Monism; in other words, it would seem that Descartes’ views about created substance commit him to thinking there can be only one material substance.  Proponents of this interpretation claim that there is textual evidence as well, pointing to a passage in the Synopsis to the Meditations.  There Descartes writes:

[W]e need to recognize that body, taken in the general sense, is a substance, so that it too never perishes.  But the human body, in so far as it differs from other bodies, is simply made up of a certain configuration of limbs and other accidents of this sort; whereas the human mind is not made up of any accidents in this way, but is a pure substance.

Monists read ‘body, taken in the general sense’ as referring to the material universe as a whole.  Consequently, they see this passage as claiming that the material universe is a substance, but that the human body is not—since it is made up on a configuration of limbs and accidents.   Assuming the monists are right, two questions immediately arise.  First, if bodies are not substances, then what are they?  Monists typically claim that bodies are modes.  This makes sense: if bodies are not substances, they must be modes, given Descartes’ ontology.  Second, if Descartes does not think that bodies are substances, why does he so often talk as if they are?  Monists answer that Descartes is speaking loosely in these contexts using the term ‘substance’ in a secondary or derivative sense of the term.

Pluralists have objected on a number of grounds.  First, pluralists have challenged the monist’s textual evidence, offering alternative readings of the Synopsis.  Second, they have challenged the motivation of monism, pointing out that the monist interpretation requires a very strong conception of causal independence, and that it just isn’t clear that this is Descartes’ view. Third, pluralists note that although Descartes writes of bodies as substances on numerous occasions, he never clearly refers to them as modes.  Last, pluralists have denied that Descartes could have held that bodies are modes noting that for Descartes i) parts of things are not modes of them and ii) bodies are parts of the material universe.  Hoffman 1986 briefly raises each of these objections.  For more lengthy discussions see Skirry 2005: Chapter 3 and Slowik 2001.

3. Spinoza

Spinoza’s most important work is his Ethics Demonstrated in Geometric Order—henceforth the Ethics. Spinoza worked on the text throughout the 1660s and 70s.  By this time Descartes’ philosophy had become widely read and indeed Spinoza’s thinking was heavily influenced by it—including his account of substance.  Nevertheless, Spinoza’s account diverges in important ways and leads to a radically different picture of the world.

a. Spinoza’s Account of Substance

Spinoza offers a definition of substance on the very first page of the Ethics.  He writes:  “By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself… “ (E1d3).  Spinoza follows Descartes (and the tradition) in defining substance as “in itself” or as an ultimate subject.  Correspondingly, he follows the tradition in defining ‘mode’ as that which is had or borne by another; as Spinoza puts it a mode is “that which is in another…” (E1d5).  For a discussion of the scholastic-Aristotelian roots of Spinoza’s definition see Carriero 1995.  Spinoza also follows Descartes in thinking that i) attributes are the principle properties of substance, ii) among those attributes are thought and extension, iii) all other properties of a substance are referred through, or are ways of being, that attribute, and iv) God exists and is a substance.  Here the agreement ends.

The first obvious divergence from Descartes is found at E1P5.  For Descartes there are many extended substances (at least on the pluralist interpretation) and many minds.  Spinoza, however, thinks this is dead wrong.  At E1P5 Spinoza argues that substance is unique in its kind—there can be only one substance per attribute.  This fact about substance (in combination with a number of other metaphysical theses) has far-reaching consequences for his account of substance.

It follows, Spinoza argues at E1P6, that to be a substance is to be causally isolated, on the grounds that i) there is only one substance per kind or attribute and ii) causal relations can obtain only between things of the same kind.  Causal isolation does not, however, entail causal impotence.  An existing substance must have a cause in some sense, but as causally isolated its cause cannot lie in anything outside itself.  Spinoza concludes that substance “will be the cause of itself…it pertains to the nature of a substance to exist” (E1P7).  Not only is a substance the cause of itself, but Spinoza later tells us that it is the immanent cause of everything that is in it (E1P18).  Spinoza continues, in E1P8, by claiming that “every substance is necessarily infinite.”  In general Spinoza argues that if there is only one substance per attribute, then substance cannot be limited since limitation is a causal notion and substances are causally isolated.  Last, Spinoza makes the case that substances are indivisible.  He argues in E1P12-13 that if substance were divisible, it would be divisible either into parts of the same nature or parts of a different nature.  If the former, then there would be more than one substance of the same nature which is ruled out by E1P5.  If the latter, then the substance could cease to exist which is ruled out by E1P7; consequently substance cannot be divided.

b. What Substances are There?

Given this account of the nature of substance, what substances exist?  From what has been said so far in the Ethics it would be reasonable to suppose that, for Spinoza, reality consists of the following substances: God, one extended substance, one thinking substance, and one substance for every further attribute, should there be any.  As it turns out, however, this is only partially right.  It is true that Spinoza ultimately holds that God exists, that there is one extended substance, and one thinking substance.  However, Spinoza denies that these are different substances. The one thinking substance is numerically identical to the one extended substance which is numerically identical to God.  Put otherwise, there is only one substance, God, and that substance is both extended and thinking.

Spinoza’s official argument for this conclusion is at E1P14.  He argues as follows: God exists (which was proven at E1P11).  Given that God is defined as a being that possesses all the attributes (E1d6) and that there is only one substance per attribute (E1P5), it follows that God is the only substance.  For a detailed discussion of this argument see the IEP entry Spinoza: Metaphysics.

Given that God is the only substance and Spinoza’s substance/mode ontology, it follows that the material objects of our experience are not independently existing substances, but instead are modes of the one extended substance.  So too, minds which Descartes had thought of as thinking substances are, according to Spinoza, modes of the attribute of thought.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  Like Descartes, Spinoza holds that the most real thing is God on which all other things depend.  However, there are no created substances.  God as the one substance has all the attributes, and consequently is both an extended substance and a thinking one.  What Descartes had taken for created substances are actually modes of God.  Nevertheless, Spinoza agrees with Descartes that the contents of reality come in two kinds—modes of extension and modes of thought, and there is a plurality of both.

This account of the nature of substance yields a very different picture of the metaphysical structure of the world from Descartes (and from common sense).  This entry will focus on three questions in particular: i) why doesn’t Spinoza accept created substances, ii) how can a substance have more than one attribute, and iii) how can a substance be indivisible as Spinoza suggests?

c. Why doesn’t Spinoza Countenance Created Substance?

Spinoza will not countenance Descartes’ distinction between Substance and Created Substance for a number of reasons.  First, created substances are the causal products of God.  However, substances are causally isolated, and so even if there were multiple substances, one could not be the causal product of the other.  Second, as we have seen Descartes holds that despite their causal dependence on God, finite minds and bodies warrant the name ‘substance’ at least partially because such beings are ultimate subjects.  Spinoza agrees that being an ultimate subject is an essential part of being a substance; the problem is that finite bodies and minds are not ultimate subjects.  Spinoza’s official grounds for this thesis are found in the arguments for E1P4 and 5.  In general, Spinoza claims that what is distinctive of substances as ultimate subjects is that they can be individuated by attribute alone.  According to Spinoza there are only two kinds of mark by which entities might be individuated—by attribute and by mode.  Substances as ultimate subjects cannot be individuated by mode, since subjects are metaphysically prior to modes.  Two finite bodies, for example, are not individuated by attribute (since they are both extended) and so cannot be substances.

d. How Can a Substance Have More than One Attribute?

As we’ve seen, for Descartes each substance has one—and only one—attribute.  Spinoza’s argument for substance monism, on the other hand, claims that there is a substance that possesses all the attributes.  Spinoza justifies this move defensively; at E1P10s Spinoza claims that nothing we know about the attributes entails that they must belong to different substances, and consequently there is nothing illegitimate about claiming that a substance may have more than one attribute.  Although this is Spinoza’s stated defense, a number of scholars have claimed that Spinoza has the philosophical resources to make a much stronger argument.  Specifically, they claim he has a positive case that, in fact, a substance possessing anything less than all the attributes (and hence, just one) is impossible.  In brief Lin 2007 asks us to suppose that Spinoza is wrong, and that it is possible for there to be a substance that has fewer than all of the attributes (but at least one).  Spinoza is a strong proponent of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (see for example, E1P8s2) according to which there is an explanation for every fact.  Given the PSR it follows that there is an explanation of why the substance in question fails to have all the attributes.  However, any such explanation will have to appeal to the substance’s existing attribute (or attributes).  Attributes are conceptually independent however, and consequently one cannot appeal to an existing attribute to explain the absence of another.  For a different but closely related version of this argument see Della Rocca 2002.

e. An Extended and Indivisible Substance?

Unlike Descartes, Spinoza holds that substance is indivisible, and this raises a number of questions about the consistency of Spinoza’s account of substance.  For example, how is substance’s indivisibility consistent with Spinoza’s claims that (i) substance has many attributes which constitute its essence and (ii) that substance is extended?  For a discussion of i) see the IEP entry Spinoza: Metaphysics.  Here the focus is on ii).

Spinoza’s extended substance, or God considered under the attribute of extension, is normally understood as encompassing the whole of extended reality (though for an alternative see Woolhouse 1990).  According to a philosophical tradition going back at least to Plato’s Phaedo, to be extended or corporeal is to have parts, to be divisible, and hence to be corruptible.  Spinoza, however, holds that “it pertains to the nature of substance to exist.”  Consequently, it would seem to follow that Spinoza cannot consistently hold that substance is extended.  Spinoza was well aware of this argument and his official rejoinder is found in E1P15s.  The problem with the argument is that it is “founded only on [the] supposition that corporeal substance is composed of parts.”  On its face, this is a confusing claim—if extended or corporeal substance just is the whole of extended reality, it surely has parts.  For example, there is the part of extension which constitutes an individual human body, a part which constitutes the Atlantic Ocean, a part that constitutes Earth, etc.  Despite his wording, Spinoza is not denying that extended substance has parts in every sense of the term.  Rather, Spinoza is especially concerned to counter the idea that his extended substance is a composite substance, built out of parts which are themselves substances, and into which it might be divided or resolved.  This makes sense, since a) it is not having parts that is the problem, but being corruptible, and b) this account of extended substance as divisible into further extended substances is just what Descartes (one of the main influences on Spinoza’s thought) seems to have held.

Spinoza makes his case in two ways in E1P15s.  First, Spinoza points us back to the arguments at E1P12 and 13 for the indivisibility of substance.  Second Spinoza offers a new argument that focuses specifically on extended substance, one that, interestingly, does not presuppose the prior apparatus of the Ethics.  In putting aside his own previous conclusions, Spinoza’s apparent goal is to show that a view like Descartes’ according to which any extended substance has parts which are themselves extended substances, fails on its own terms.  In general, he argues as follows.  Consider an extended substance, say a wheel of cheese.  If the parts of this wheel are themselves extended substances, then it is—at least in principle—possible for one or more of the parts to be annihilated without any consequence for the other parts.  The idea here is that because substances are independent subjects, the annihilation of one subject cannot have any consequence for the others.  Suppose then that the middle of our wheel of cheese is annihilated; we are thus left with a “donut” of cheese.  The problem with this is that the hole in the cheese is measurable—it has a diameter, a circumference, etc.  In short, it is extended.  However, we have supposed that the extended substance—the subject of the extension—in the middle was destroyed.  We are thus left with an instance of attribute, extension, without a substance as its subject—an impossibility by both Descartes’ and Spinoza’s standards.  For detailed discussions of this argument see Huenemann 1997 and Robinson 2009.

4. Leibniz

Leibniz’s views were informed by the accounts of both Descartes and Spinoza.  In fact, Leibniz corresponded with Spinoza during the early 1670s and briefly visited with Spinoza in 1676.  Unlike Spinoza, Leibniz did not write a single authoritative account of his metaphysical system.  Not only that, but his metaphysical views changed in significant ways over his lifetime.  Nevertheless, it is possible to identify a core account of the nature of substance that runs throughout his middle to later works (from the Discourse on Metaphysics of 1686 through the Monadology of 1714).

a. Leibniz’s Account of Substances

Substances are independent and are ultimate subjects.

Like Descartes, Leibniz thinks that God is the only absolutely independent thing, and that there are, in addition, created substances which are “like a world apart, independent of all other things, except for God” (Discourse on Metaphysics §8).  Second, Leibniz explicitly agrees with Descartes, Spinoza, and the tradition in maintaining that substances are the ultimate bearers of modes or properties.  He writes “when several predicates are attributed to a single subject and this subject is attributed to no others, it is called an individual substance” (Ibid.).

Substances are unities.

To be a unity for Leibniz is to be simple and without parts, and so the ultimate constituents of reality are not composite or aggregative beings. That substances are simple has metaphysically significant consequences; Leibniz infers in the Principles of Nature and Grace and elsewhere that “Since the monads have no parts, they can neither be formed nor destroyed.  They can neither begin nor end naturally, and consequently they last as long as the universe.”  A being comes to be naturally only as the result of a composition; an entity is destroyed naturally only through dissolution or corruption.  Thus only composite entities are naturally generable or destructible.  Leibniz emphasizes, however, that substances’ unity and consequent simplicity is entirely consistent with the possession of and changes in modes or properties.

Substances are active.

To say that a substance is active is to say not only that it is causally efficacious, but that it is the ultimate (created) source of its own actions. Thus he writes, “every substance has a perfect spontaneity…that everything that happens to it is a consequence of its idea or of its being, and that nothing determines it, except God alone” (DM §32).  Substances, in some sense, have their entire history written into their very nature.  The history of each substance unfolds successively, each state causally following from the previous state according to laws.  From this it follows that if we had perfect knowledge of a substance’s state at a time and of the laws of causal succession, we could foresee the entire life of the substance.  As Leibniz elegantly put the point in the Principles of Nature and Grace “the present is pregnant with the future; the future can be read in the past; the distant is expressed in the proximate.”

Substances are causally isolated.

Like Spinoza, Leibniz holds both that substances are causally efficacious, and that their efficacy does not extend to other substances.  In other words, although there is intra-substantial causation (insofar as substances cause their own states), there is no inter-substantial causation.  Leibniz offers a number of different arguments for this claim.  On some occasions he argues that causal isolation follows from the nature of substance.  If a state of a substance could be the causal effect of some other substance, then a substance’s spontaneity and independence would be compromised.  Elsewhere he argues that inter-substantial causation is itself impossible, claiming that the only way that one substance might cause another is through the actual transfer of accidents or properties.  Thus Leibniz famously writes that substances “have no windows through which something can enter or leave.  Accidents cannot be detached, nor can they go about outside of substances” (Monadology §7).  For a more detailed discussion of Leibniz’s views of causation see the IEP entry Leibniz: Causation.

b. What Substances are There?

Although Leibniz agrees with Descartes that God is an infinite substance which created and conserves the finite world, he disagrees about the fundamental constituents of this world.  For Descartes there are fundamentally two kinds of finite substance—thinking substances or minds and extended substances or bodies.  Leibniz disagrees; according to Leibniz (and this is especially clear in the later works) there are no extended substances.  Nothing extended can be a substance since nothing that is extended is a unity.  To be extended is to be actually divided into parts, according to Leibniz, and consequently to be an aggregate.  The ultimate created substances, for Leibniz, are much more like Cartesian thinking substances, and indeed Leibniz refers to simple substances as “minds” or “souls.”  This terminology can be confusing, and it is important to be clear that in using these terms Leibniz is not thereby claiming that all simple substances are individual human consciousnesses (although human consciousnesses are simple substances for Leibniz).  Rather, there is a whole spectrum of simple substances of which human minds are a particularly sophisticated example.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  God exists and is responsible for creating and continually conserving everything else.  The ultimate constituents of reality are monads which are indivisible and unextended minds or mind-like substances.  Although monads are causally isolated, they have properties or qualities that continually change, and these changes are dictated by the monad’s nature itself.  Leibniz’s account of substance and his metaphysics in general, raise a number of questions.  This article will take up three in particular.  First, Leibniz’s account of substance yields (in conjunction with a number of other metaphysical commitments) a picture of reality that diverges in significant ways both from common sense and from Descartes and Spinoza.  How does our experience of an extended world of causal interaction fit into Leibniz’s metaphysical picture?  Second, that substances are unities is a crucial feature of Leibniz’s account, and it is important to consider why Leibniz is so opposed to composite substances.  Last, Spinoza and Leibniz offer very similar accounts of substance, yet end up with very different metaphysical pictures, and so this article will consider where Leibniz’s account diverges from Spinoza’s.

c. Experience and Reality

How does the world of our experience fit into Leibniz’s account of reality?  Our everyday experience is of extended objects causally interacting, but for Leibniz at the fundamental level there is no inter-substantial causation and there are no extended substances.  How, then, is the world of our experience related to the world as it really is?

Let us begin with the apparent causal relations between things.  Recall that, for Leibniz, monads are active and spontaneous.  Each individual human mind is a monad, and this means that all of a human’s experiences—including their sensations of the world—are the effects of their own previous states.  For example, a person’s sensation of a book’s being on the desk is not caused by the book (or the light bouncing off the book, entering the eye,…etc.) but is rather a progression in the unfolding of the history written into the person’s nature.  Although a monad’s life originates from its nature alone, God has created the world so that the lives of created monads perfectly correspond.  Leibniz writes in A New System of Nature,

God originally created the soul (and any other real unity) in such a way that everything must arise for it from its own depths…yet with a perfect conformity relative to external things…There will be a perfect agreement among all these substances, producing the same effect that would be noticed if they communicated through the transmission of species or qualities, as the common philosophers imagine they do.

Thus, when Katie walks around the corner and sees Beatrice, and Beatrice sees Katie, they do so because it was written into Katie’s very nature that she would see Beatrice, and into Beatrice’s nature that she would see Katie.  This is Leibniz’s famous doctrine of pre-established harmony.  For more see the IEP entry Leibniz: Metaphysics.

How does our experience of an extended world of bodies arise? To start, Leibniz certainly doesn’t think that bodies are built out of, or are composites of, monads.  Thus he writes in his Notes on Comments by Michel Angelo Fardella, “just as a point is not a part of a line…so also a soul is not a part of matter.”  Instead in many cases Leibniz characterizes bodies as phenomena or appearances.  He writes in an oft-cited passage to DeVolder:

[M]atter and motion are not substances or things as much as they are the phenomena of perceivers, the reality of which is situated in the harmony of the perceivers with themselves (at different times) and with other perceivers.

Leibniz seems to be saying here and elsewhere that bodies are merely appearances (albeit shared appearances) that do not correspond to any mind-independent reality, and indeed a number of scholars have claimed that this is Leibniz’s considered view (see for example, Loeb  1981: 299-309).  In other texts however Leibniz claims that bodies result from, or are founded in, aggregates of monads, and this suggests that bodies are something over and above the mere perceptions of monads.  In general, scholars have offered interpretations that attempt to accommodate both sets of texts and which see bodies as being aggregates of monads that are perceived as being extended.  There is a great deal of debate, however, about how such aggregates might ultimately be related to bodies and their perception (for one account see Rutherford 1995b: 143-153).

d. What is Wrong with Composite Beings?

Leibniz thinks composite beings are excluded as possible substances on a number of grounds.  First, no composite is (or can be) a unity, since according to Leibniz there is no way that two or more entities might be united into a single one.  He famously illustrates this claim by appealing to two diamonds.  He writes in his Letters to Arnauld: “One could impose the same collective name for the two…although they are far part from one another; but one would not say that these two diamonds constitute a substance…Even if they were brought nearer together and made to touch, they would not be substantially united to any greater extent… contact, common motion, and participation in a common plan have no effect on substantial unity.”  In general, there is no relation that two or more entities might be brought into that would unify them into a single being.

A second and perhaps even deeper problem with composites is that according to Leibniz they cannot be ultimate subjects. He writes, again in the Letters to Arnauld, “It also seems that what constitutes the essence of a being by aggregation is only a mode of things of which it is composed.  For example, what constitutes the essence of an army is only a mode of the men who compose it.”  Leibniz’s claim is that no aggregate is a substance because aggregates are modes or states of their parts, and no mode is an ultimate subject.  This leaves us with a question, however: why does Leibniz think that aggregates are mere modes or states of their parts?  In his influential book R.C. Sleigh (1990: 123-124) makes the case that Leibniz’s grounds for thinking aggregates are modes is that aggregates are semantically and ontologically dispensable.  That is, everything that is true of an aggregate can be expressed by attributing various modes to the parts, all without appealing to the aggregate itself.  This tells us that that all of an aggregate’s purported modes are in fact modes of the parts, and that consequently the aggregate is not an ultimate subject.  Given a substance/mode ontology, it follows that to the extent that aggregates exist, they must be modes.

e. Leibniz and Spinoza

Although Spinoza and Leibniz offer very different pictures of the structure of reality, their respective accounts of substance overlap in important ways: both agree that to be a substance is to be at least i) an ultimate subject, ii) causally isolated but causally efficacious, and iii) indivisible.  Indeed, a number of scholars have suggested that Leibniz briefly adopted or was at least tempted by a Spinozistic metaphysics early in his philosophical career (see for example, the discussion in Adams 1994: 123-130).  Even later in life Leibniz seems to have held Spinoza’s views in high regard saying in a Letter to Louis Bourguet that “[A]ccording to Spinoza…there is only one substance.  He would be right if there were no monads.”  Given this it is worth considering where Leibniz breaks with Spinoza and why.

Although they differ in a number of important ways, perhaps the most prominent difference between the metaphysics of Spinoza and Leibniz is that Leibniz holds that reality is split into two: God and creation.  God is a substance and He produces finite substances—created monads.  This signals a break from Spinoza in at least two significant ways.  First, it means that Leibniz’s agreement with Spinoza about the causal isolation of substances applies only to created substances; although for Leibniz God is a substance, He is not causally isolated.  Recall that at least one of Leibniz’s reasons for denying inter-substantial causation is that it would require the actual transfer of properties or accidents, and that such a transfer is impossible.  Jolley (2005) makes the case that, for Leibniz, God’s causal activity is of a different kind.  God does not produce effects in a metaphysically intolerable way, and consequently, God need not be causally isolated.

Second, Leibniz holds, in contrast to Spinoza, that created substances are ultimate subjects.  Leibniz is very explicit about his objection to Spinoza on this score.  Although he agrees that substances require individuation, he holds that Spinoza’s proof at E1P5 that there can be only one substance per nature or attribute is unsound.  Furthermore Leibniz holds that Monads can be individuated, ultimately claiming in the Monadology that “Monads…are…differentiated by the degrees of their distinct perceptions.”

5. 17th Century Theories of Substance in Perspective

Looking back we might see Descartes, but especially Spinoza and Leibniz, as working through the metaphysical consequences of holding that substances are ultimate subjects.  More generally, we can see these theories of substance as different ways of trying to reconcile the notion of substance as an ultimate subject with a commitment to God’s existence and independence.

Epistemological considerations led prominent late 17th and 18th century philosophers to abandon such questions, and to give substance a much more modest position in their metaphysical systems.  John Locke, for example, holds that there are substances and that they are ultimate subjects, but is wary of drawing any further conclusions.  As Locke famously claims, “if any one will examine himself concerning his Notion of pure Substance in general, he will find he has no other Idea of it at all, but only a Supposition of he knows not what support of such Qualities…commonly called Accidents” (EHU 2.23.2).  David Hume goes further claiming that it is not within out power to know the ultimate structure of reality, and that further that our idea of a substance as a subject is merely the result of our imagination: “the imagination is apt to feign something unknown and invisible, which it supposes to continue the same under all these variations; and this unintelligible something it calls a substance” (Treatise 1.4.3).  Humean skepticism about substance (and about metaphysics more generally) survives in one form or another to the present day.

Of course not everyone agrees with this tradition, and the nature of substance has been a question that many contemporary philosophers have taken up—albeit from different starting points than Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Unlike the 17th century, in contemporary philosophical use the term ‘substance’ is not necessarily intended to refer to the ultimate constituents of reality (although it may).  Rather the term is usually taken to refer to what are sometimes called “concrete particulars”, that is, to individual material things or objects.  Furthermore, among contemporary philosophers there is nothing like the consensus that we find among the 17th century philosophers regarding ontology, dependence, reality, and God.  Thus, it is commonly held that there are categories of reality beyond substance and mode (or property), perhaps most prominently events or processes.  Many philosophers have questioned both the relation of inherence and the connection between inherence and ontological dependence (bundle-theories of substance, for example, deny that substances are subjects at all—they are merely bundles or collections of properties).  Furthermore, most contemporary philosophers deny that it makes sense to talk about degrees of reality: things are either real or not.  Last, and perhaps most obviously, contemporary philosophers no longer agree that God exists and is a substance.  For a contemporary effort to offer an account of substance that is in the spirit of 17th century discussions see Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1997.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts in English

  • Descartes
  • John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny ed. and trans. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991.
    • This is the standard English edition of Descartes’ work.
  • Spinoza
  • Edwin Curley, trans. and ed. The Collected Works of Spinoza Vol. 1. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.
    • This is the standard English translation.
  • Leibniz
  • Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber trans. and ed. G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
    • This is a great collection of many of Leibniz’ most important works.
  • Leroy L. Loemker trans. and ed. Philosophical Papers and Letters 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
    • This is a much broader collection of Leibniz’s work than the Ariew and Garber text.

b. Secondary Texts

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • This is one of the most influential books written on Leibniz in recent years.  Adams’ book includes detailed discussions of Leibniz on modality and identity, the ontological argument, and the place of bodies in Leibniz’s mature metaphysics, among other topics.
  • Carriero, John.  “On the Relationship Between Mode and Substance in Spinoza’s Metaphysics,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 33, no. 2 (1995), pp. 245-273.
    • In this article Carriero argues that Spinoza’s account of substance is a traditional one according to which substances are ultimate subjects.
  • Cottingham, John.  Descartes.  New York: Blackwell, 1986.
    • This is a good introduction to Descartes thought, and raises the question of a trialist interpretation.
  • Cottingham, John. The Rationalists.  Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988.
    • This is a clearly written summary and comparison of the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Chapter 3 on substance is recommended.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  “Spinoza’s Substance Monism,” Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes. Ed. Olli Koistinen and John Biro. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • In this article Della Rocca considers Spinoza’s official argument that there is only one substance, and defends it from a number of objections—including the claim that Spinoza is not entitled to hold that substance can have more than one attribute.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  Spinoza. Routledge: 2008.
    • This book is an excellent overview of Spinoza’s life and philosophy; Della Rocca’s discussion of Spinoza’s account of substance in contrast to Descartes’ is especially good.
  • Huenemann, Charles. “Predicative Interpretations of Spinoza’s Divine Extension,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, vol. 14, no. 1 (1997), pp. 53-76.
    • In this article Huenemann offers an account of Spinoza’s extended substance which differs from other influential interpretations in important ways.  In doing so, he takes up the question of the divisibility of substance and Spinoza’s vacuum argument.
  • Hoffman, Paul.  “The Unity of Descartes’s Man,” Philosophical Review, vol. 95, no. 3 (1986), pp. 339-370.
    • In this often cited article, Hoffman makes the case for a trialist reading of Descartes and along the way offers a number of criticisms of monist interpretations of substance.
  • Hoffman, Joshua, and Rosenkrantz, Gary S.  Substance: Its Nature and Existence.  Routledge, 1997.
    • In this book Hoffman and Rosenkrantz draw on the ideas of philosophers from the past (including Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz) as well as from contemporary philosophical advancements to develop and defend an account of substance based on independence.
  • Jolley, Nicholas.  Leibniz. Routledge: 2005.
    • This book is an excellent overview of Leibniz’s life and philosophy.  The book is written for the non-specialist and would be a good place for a person with no previous knowledge to start.
  • Kaufman, Dan. “Descartes on Composites, Incomplete Substances, and Kinds of Unity,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, vol. 90, no. 1 (2008), pp. 39-73.
    • In this excellent article Kaufman argues the Descartes is a dualist and that the trialist interpretation espoused by Hoffman (see above) and others is mistaken.
  • Lin, Martin. “Spinoza’s Arguments for the Existence of God,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, vol. 75, no. 2 (2007), pp. 269-297.
    • In this article Lin takes a new look at Spinoza’s arguments for God’s existence, and attempts to defend Spinoza from the charge that it is incoherent to think that God’s has more than one (much less, all) the attributes.
  • Loeb, Louis E. From Descartes to Hume: Continental Metaphysics and the Development of Modern Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1981.
    • This book is one of the standards of the field, and in chapter 2 Loeb offers a comparison of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz on substance.
  • Markie, Peter.  “Descartes’s Concepts of Substance,” Reason, Will and Sensation: Studies in Descartes’s Metaphysics. Ed. John Cottingham. Oxford: Clarenden Press, 1994.
    • In this influential article, Markie claims to find not two, but three accounts of substance in Descartes’ work.
  • Robinson, Thaddeus S.  “Spinoza on the Vacuum and the Simplicity of Corporeal Substance,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, vol. 26, no.1 (2009), pp. 63-81.
    • In this article Robinson offers a novel interpretation of Spinoza’s vacuum argument, and makes the case that Descartes’ account of extended substance, at least by Spinoza’s lights, is incoherent.
  • Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo.  “Descartes’s Substance Dualism and His Independence Conception of Substance,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 46, no. 1(2008), pp. 69-90.
    • In this article Rodriguez-Pereyra focuses on clarifying the respects in which Descartes’ substances are independent, and argues that other prominent features of Descartes’ account of substance follow from independence so understood.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995a.
    • Although written for specialists, this influential book is highly readable.  Rutherford offers an account of Leibniz’s metaphysics which gives Leibniz’s theodicy and especially important role.
  • Rutherford, Donald. “Metaphysics: The Late Period.” The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. Ed. Nicholas Jolley.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995b.
    • This article is an excellent summary and discussion of Leibniz’s metaphysics from 1695’s New System of Nature to 1714’s Monadology, and focuses on Leibniz’s account of matter during this period.
  • Skirry, Justin.  Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature.  New York: Continuum, 2005.
    • This book traces Descartes’ scholastic influences and develops a pluralist and trialist interpretation of Descartes’ account of substance.
  • Sleigh, R.C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on Their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • This is an extremely influential book which offers a reading of one of the most important of Leibniz’s philosophical exchanges.
  • Slowik, Edward. “Descartes and Individual Corporeal Substance,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 9 no. 1 (2001) pp. 1-15.
    • Slowik picks up where Hoffman leaves off, developing several arguments against the monist interpretation of Descartes.
  • Woolhouse, R.S. “Spinoza and Descartes and the Existence of Extended Substance,” Central Themes in Early Modern Philosophy. Ed. J.A. Cover and Mark Kulstad. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990.
    • In this article Woolhouse offers a novel reading of Spinoza’s extended substance, claiming that it refers to an essence as opposed to an actually existing infinite extension.
  • Woolhouse, R.S. The Concept of Substance in Seventeenth Century Metaphysics.  New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • This is a good general work on substance during the 17th century.  In addition, Woolhouse offers novel readings of Descartes and Spinoza (see above) on extended substance.  This work offers an especially good look at the relations between mechanics, causation, and substance during the period.
  • Zaldivar, Eugenio E. “Descartes’s Theory of Substance: Why He Was Not a Trialist,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 19, no. 3 (2011), pp. 395-418.
    • The title says it all.  Zaldivar argues against Cottingham, Skirry, and others.

Author Information

Tad Robinson
Mullenburg College
U. S. A.

Last updated: January 9, 2013 | Originally published: