Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supervenience and Mind

This article is an informal introduction to the concept of supervenience and the role it plays in the philosophy of mind.  It surveys some of the many ways the concept has been used to reveal the manner and degree to which mental phenomena depend on facts about our bodies and their physical features. Philosophers usually construe the supervenience relation as a relation between classes of properties, where a class of properties, F, supervenes on a class of properties, G, just in case there is no difference in F-properties without some difference in G-properties.  As David Lewis puts it, “no difference of one sort without differences of another sort” (1986, p. 14).  It is in the philosophy of mind that we find the term’s most frequent contemporary occurrence.

The goal of asking whether one set of properties supervenes on another is to better understand the ontological relation between the two sets — especially, whether the one set of properties depends entirely on the other.  Suppose, for example, that two individuals can have different moral properties while being exactly alike in terms of their actual and potential behavior; that is, suppose that one’s moral features do not supervene on one’s behavioral features.  Then we can conclude that the former depend on something more than the latter.  And if we accept this conclusion, we are then led to search for a set of properties on which our moral features do supervene, a set of properties in terms of which any two individuals must differ with any moral difference.  The goal is to isolate just that set of features on which our moral properties do wholly rely.

Suppose we succeed in identifying a set of features on which F-properties supervene (where F-properties might be moral, mental, aesthetic, economic, or any other higher-level properties).  Then we can try to discover the nature of the dependence of F-properties on the underlying G-properties (for example, behavioral, physical, neurological, or intrinsic) by asking about the manner in which the former supervene on the latter.  Is it a logical truth that a difference in F-properties requires a difference in G-properties?  Is this covariance due to the causal laws that actually obtain?  Is it a matter of metaphysical necessity?  Asking these questions about the way in which F-properties supervene may help us decide whether the dependence is, for example, a wholly analytic affair, a type of causal dependence, a matter of constitution, or a matter of genuine identity.

Table of Contents

  1. Supervenience: The Basic Idea
  2. Supervenience and Non-Reductive Physicalism
  3. Varieties of Supervenience
    1. Global and Local Versions
    2. Varieties of Necessitation
  4. Two Common Complaints with Supervenience Theses
    1. Explanatory Failure
    2. Ontological Failure
  5. Concluding Remarks
  6. References and Further Readings

1. Supervenience: The Basic Idea

Nora’s latest sculpture has many intrinsic features, including its shape, density, texture, and constituent matter.  It also has various aesthetic properties — beauty, grace, elegance, and expressive power.  No doubt, the aesthetic properties of the sculpture are in some way and to some degree a result of its intrinsic features.  But in what way exactly, and to what degree?  Thinking in terms of supervenience is a good start to finding the answer.  Imagine an artwork, x*, that is intrinsically indistinguishable from Nora’s sculpture, x — a perfect duplicate of x.  Is it possible that despite the indiscernability, x* might differ aesthetically from x?  If it is not possible for x and the intrinsically indiscernable x* to differ aesthetically, then we say that the object’s aesthetic features supervene on its intrinsic features, where a class of properties, F, supervenes on a class of properties, G, just in case a difference in F-properties requires a difference in G-properties; in other words, all the same G-properties guarantee all the same F-properties.

If we decide that the object’s aesthetic properties do supervene on its intrinsic features, then we are led to inquire whether the former are identical with the latter or whether the dependence relation is of some weaker sort — for example, causal dependence or constitution.  On the other hand, if we conclude that the object’s aesthetic properties do not supervene on its intrinsic features, that is, if x* might differ aesthetically from x despite their intrinsic similarity, then we can conclude that those aesthetic properties are at least partly a function of certain relations the object bears to external items.  We are then led to ask what the relevant external relations are.  We think in terms of supervenience again, imagining various changes in x’s environment (different origins, differences in historical context, different standards of the qualified judges, differences in popular opinion), and for each of those changes we decide whether x’s aesthetic features might also differ, until we isolate just those features of the environment on which the aesthetic properties do rely.  The conclusion would then be that the object’s aesthetic features supervene on its intrinsic properties together with those external features.

As this line of inquiry shows, the concept of supervenience is an invaluable tool for deciding whether and how one set of properties depends on another.  An analogous line of inquiry is found in discussions of mental content.  The content of one’s mental states depends largely on what the individual is like internally — on the state of the brain and the brain’s causal relations to other parts of the body, including sense organs and limbs.  But does the content of one’s mental states depend entirely on these intrinsic features?  To decide this issue, we consider whether it is possible for an indistinguishable individual, a molecule-for-molecule duplicate, to differ in terms of the content of her mental states.  And thanks to the thought experiments of Hilary Putnam (1973, 1975) and Tyler Burge (1979), it is widely thought that intrinsic duplicates can indeed differ in the content of their mental states.  Putnam has us imagine a twin-earth that is exactly like earth except that what they call “water” on twin-earth is comprised of something other than H2O molecules.  The content of your water-thoughts, it seems, differs from the content of your doppelganger’s “water”-thoughts on twin-earth — simply because of the difference in the liquid toward which those thoughts are directed.  (But note that Putnam’s example is actually designed to show a difference in linguistic content, meaning, which does not in itself entail a difference in mental content.)  Likewise, Burge shows that given suitable differences in surrounding linguistic practice, the thoughts one expresses with the word ‘arthritis’ might differ in content from those that one’s doppelganger expresses.  For example, if your duplicate inhabits a possible world in which ‘arthritis’ is regularly used to describe various conditions in addition to inflammation of the joints, then it seems that the content of the duplicate’s ‘arthritis’ thoughts will differ from yours.  Examples such as these seem to show that the content of one’s mental states does not supervene on one’s intrinsic features alone, but only on a set of features that includes features of one’s environment.

While Putnam and Burge do not use the term ‘supervenience’ in the essays mentioned above (though Burge does use it in his 1986 discussion of externalism), it is clear that the concept of “no difference of one sort without differences of another sort” is being utilized.  It was Davidson’s use of ‘supervenience’ in “Mental Events” (1970) that made the term popular in the philosophy of mind.

2. Supervenience and Non-Reductive Physicalism

While Davidson denies that there are psychophysical laws, he acknowledges (in a widely cited passage) that

mental characteristics are in some sense dependent, or supervenient, on physical characteristics.  Such supervenience might be taken to mean that there cannot be two events alike in all physical respects but differing in some mental respect, or that an object cannot alter in some mental respect without altering in some physical respect” (1970, p. 88).

Not long after the appearance of Davidson’s essay, discussions of Non-Reductive Physicalism became the major locus of supervenience-talk in the philosophy of mind and the philosophical literature in general.  Due to the popularity of functionalist accounts of mentality and the wide degree of multiple realizability they entail (that is, that the same mental property can be realized by events of different physical, chemical, and neural types), a dominant view in the philosophy of mind for the past few decades is the belief that mental properties are not identical with neural properties or any other properties of the natural sciences.  Yet, many of those who reject psychophysical property-identities also claim to support Physicalism regarding mentality, the view that all mental phenomena obtain solely by virtue of physical phenomena.  One wonders: how can mentality obtain solely by virtue of physical phenomena, as Physicalism maintains, if mental properties are not physical?  The most popular answer is that while mental properties are not identical with physical properties, they nonetheless depend on nothing other than physical properties — that is, they supervene on physical properties.

Whether a mental-physical supervenience thesis captures the content of Physicalism regarding mentality depends on how exactly the supervenience relation is to be understood.  To say that there is no mental difference without some physical difference leaves the matter rather unclear.  Much of the literature on supervenience in the philosophy of mind is devoted to adding the needed precision.  Let us consider some of the many issues that arise.

3. Varieties of Supervenience

The philosophical literature is replete with all manner of ways to describe the supervenience relation — “an unlovely proliferation,” as Lewis puts it (1986, p. 14).  Here are some of the most popular brands.

a. Global and Local Versions

John Haugeland expresses the idea that all properties supervene on physical properties as follows: “[t]he world could not have been different in any respect, without having been different in some strictly physical respect” (1984, p. 1).  This is a global supervenience thesis, claiming that nonphysical difference entails physical difference at the level of possible worlds as a whole (where a possible world is a way the world could have been, which includes the actual world, the way the world actually is).  Applied to mental and physical properties, Haugeland’s global supervenience claim is that the total state of any possible world could not have been any different mentally without differing physically.  That is,

(GS)  for any possible worlds, w1 and w2, if w1 and w2 differ mentally, then w1 and w2 differ physically.

Equivalently, if w1 and w2 are exactly the same physically, then they are exactly the same mentally.

While GS goes a long way toward capturing the physicalist belief that the mental depends entirely on the physical, it is arguable that it does not go far enough.  Kim (1987, p. 321) has us imagine that some possible world b differs physically from the actual world in only the following respect: in b one of Saturn’s rings contains an additional ammonia molecule.  GS requires mental similarity only between worlds that are physically indistinguishable as a whole.  So despite the slight and innocuous physical difference between b and the actual world, GS allows that b mentally differs from the actual world as greatly as you please, perhaps being completely devoid of mentality.  This result clearly goes against the physicalist intuition that mental phenomena obtain solely by virtue of physical phenomena.  For in the case Kim describes, all of the physical features that are relevant to mentality remain constant.  So it seems that if b differs mentally from the actual world, as GS allows, then whatever mental differences there are would have to be due to something other than physical differences.  (Note that several authors identify and formulate different types of global supervenience; for a thorough description of varieties of global supervenience, see McLaughlin and Bennett, 2006.  These complexities are ignored in this introductory survey; here the concern is with global supervenience in general.)

To come closer to capturing the content of Physicalism regarding the mind, a supervenience thesis needs to require not only that worlds differing mentally differ physically, but also that individual objects and events cannot differ mentally without differing physically.  Consider, then, the following local supervenience thesis:

(LS)  for any worlds, w1 and w2, and any individuals, x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 differs mentally from y in w2, then x in w1 differs physically from y in w2.

Or one might choose what Kim (1984) calls “strong” supervenience.  To say that mental properties strongly supervene on physical properties is to say that

(SS) necessarily, for any mental property M, and any individual x that has M, there is a physical property (or set of physical properties) P, such that x has P, and necessarily, for any individual y, if y has P, then y has M.

The difference between LS and SS is that LS allows the possibility that some entities have mental properties without having any physical properties.  (Yet, SS and LS are equivalent when the base set of physical properties is closed under negation, that is, when for every physical property P in the base set, its negation, ~P, is also included.)

Now suppose that Carla and Marla inhabit worlds that are physically indistinguishable in every respect except for the extra ammonia molecule in a ring of Saturn.  While the worlds themselves differ physically, Carla and Marla do not.  So unlike GS, LS and SS entail that Carla and Marla are mentally indistinguishable.  So it seems that LS and SS better capture the physicalist intuition that mental facts obtain solely in virtue of physical facts.  (However, there is some debate over whether the global thesis might actually be equivalent to SS given the right closure principles.  See, for example, Petrie, 1987, Kim, 1987, Paull & Sider, 1992, and Stalnaker, 1996.)

Note that SS differs from Kim’s formulation of what he calls “weak” supervenience (WS), which lacks the second occurrence of the word ‘necessarily.’

(WS) necessarily, for any mental property M, and any individual x that has M, there is a physical property (or set of physical properties) P, such that x has P, and for any individual y, if y has P, then y has M.

Unlike SS and LS, WS requires only that physical duplicates are mental duplicates within possible worlds, thereby allowing that physical duplicates differ mentally across possible worlds.  So unlike SS and LS, WS allows that you could have had different mental properties from those you actually have without differing in any physical way.  But if you could have had different mental properties without differing physically in any way, then the mental facts about you do not depend solely on the way you are physically, which seems to be contrary to Physicalism.  Thus, SS and LS are preferable to WS.

As indicated above, by not allowing that Carla and Marla differ mentally, LS and SS might seem preferable to GS.  However, one might think that given externalist intuitions, GS is more desirable.  If externalism regarding mental content is correct, then individuals that are the same in terms of their intrinsic physical properties are not guaranteed to be mentally the same.  GS honors externalist intuitions by requiring sameness only at the level of whole worlds, thereby allowing individuals with all the same intrinsic physical properties to differ mentally.  However, Kim (1987, pp. 322-4) points out that the strong supervenience thesis, SS, can also allow the truth of externalism simply by including extrinsic properties of individuals in the supervenience base, properties such as being causally related to stuff comprised of H2O.  If the underlying physical properties, the subvening properties, include relations to external items, then LS can also accommodate externalist intuitions.  (Although, we cannot let just any extrinsic property into the supervenience base.  If we allow the extrinsic feature of occupying a world with such-and-such complete physical profile, then the strong and local supervenience theses automatically collapse into the global version.  For in that case, having all the same mental properties is not required unless the individuals occupy worlds that are physically indistinguishable in every respect.  Vera Hoffmann and Albert Newen, 2007, develop the idea of property-dependent supervenience as a way to include only those extrinsic properties that are relevant to the instantiation of a higher-level property.)

We saw that one worry about GS is that it allows great mental differences to be accompanied by what seem to be wholly irrelevant physical differences — allowing, for example, that Carla and Marla differ mentally despite their physical similarity, simply because in Marla’s world there is one more ammonia molecule in one of the rings of Saturn.  LS and SS prevent this possibility but they still fall short of fully capturing physicalist intuitions since differences irrelevant to one’s mentality are to be found not only in distant regions of space.  Suppose that Carla and Marla live in physically indistinguishable environments and their bodies are physically indistinguishable in all but the following respect: Marla has an additional electron in one of her toenails.  Since this cuticle difference seems to be completely irrelevant to mentality, we would expect that Carla and Marla are mentally indistinguishable.  However, since they are not physically indistinguishable, LS and SS allow vast mental differences between the two.  This result seems contrary to the spirit of Physicalism since Carla and Marla are physically indistinguishable in all the ways that are relevant to mentality.

The move from GS to LS and SS is an attempt to isolate those physical properties that are relevant to the exemplification of a mental property.  For a more successful attempt, one might appeal to Terence Horgan’s regional supervenience thesis.  With his notion of a P-region, a spatio-temporal region of a physically possible world, Horgan expresses his regional supervenience thesis as: “There are no two P-regions that are exactly alike in all qualitative intrinsic physical features but different in some other qualitative intrinsic feature” (1993a, p. 571).  (Also see Horgan 1982, p. 37).  Consider the region of space occupied by Marla’s whole body minus the toenail with the extra electron and the region of space occupied by the corresponding part of Carla’s body.  Since these two regions are physically indistinguishable, the regional supervenience thesis yields the correct result that Carla-minus (Carla minus the toenail) does not differ mentally from Marla-minus.  This result together with the fact that there is no mentality supervening on the physical features of the toenail itself yields that further desired conclusion that Marla as a whole is mentally the same as Carla as a whole.  (By the way, those mental and other higher-order states that require an externalist individuation will supervene on the intrinsic features of an expanded region of space, which Horgan points out, is “a region large enough to encompass, as intrinsic features, all the contextually relevant facts”: 1982, p. 39.)

Another way to isolate just those physical features that are relevant to mentality is to utilize Kim’s notion of a B-minimal property.  A property is B-minimal when “any property weaker than it is not a supervenience base” (1984, p. 165).  If a physical property, P, is B-minimal with respect to mental property M, then P is a least sufficient condition for M — that is, P’s instantiation guarantees M’s instantiation, and there is no proper constituent of P an instance of which guarantees an instance of M.  The properties that are B-minimal with respect to M do not include the number of electrons in one’s toenails.  Thus, with only B-minimal properties in the supervenience base, Carla and Marla have all the same subvening properties despite their cuticle difference, which guarantees that they have all the same mental properties.  Suppose, then, that we strengthen LS and SS to read:

(LS*) for any mental property M, there is a physical property P that is B-minimal with respect to M, such that for any possible worlds, w1 and w2, and any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 differs from y in w2 in terms of M, then x in w1 differs from y in w2 in terms of P


(SS*) necessarily, for any mental property M, and any individual x that has M, there is a physical property (or set of physical properties) P, such that (i) x has P, (ii) P is B-minimal with respect to M, and (ii) necessarily, for any individual y, if y has P, then y has M,

respectively.  Since no physical property that is B-minimal property with respect to M includes having an extra electron in a toenail, neither LS* nor SS* allows that Carla and Marla differ mentally, which is just as Physicalism seems to require given that they are physically indistinguishable in all respects relevant to mentality.

Jeffrey Poland’s (1994) formulation of Physicalism further narrows the class of relevant base properties by adding the notion of a B-minimal property to a regional supervenience thesis.  Poland worries that a physical property might qualify as a B-minimal supervenience base with respect to some higher-level (for example, mental) property without being the property by virtue of which the higher-level property is instantiated.  To remedy this defect Poland proposes that “[f]or each non-physical attribute, N, and for each region of space-time, R, if N is actually (or possibly) instantiated in R, then there exists a minimal class of physically-based attributes, P, such that the instantiation of the members of P does (or would) provide a realization of N on that occasion” (p. 191).

Apart from deciding which of these supervenience theses to endorse, there is another issue that needs to be addressed.  In formulating a supervenience thesis adequate for understanding the ontological relation between two sets of properties, we need to decide which brand of modality is to figure in our formulation?  How should the necessity operators in WS, SS, and SS* be interpreted, and what is the range of the possible worlds mentioned in GS, LS, and LS*?

b. Varieties of Necessitation

Suppose it is true that whenever there is a mental difference there is a physical difference.  It would seem that this is not merely an accidental fact, not merely a matter of the way things happen to be.  Rather it seems that the physical facts that obtain in some way necessitate the mental facts that obtain:

(N)  facts about the distribution of physical properties necessitate all the facts about the distribution of mental properties.

But what brand of necessity is at issue here?  Answering this modal question is essential to understanding how the mental depends on the physical.  The answer is also crucial to deciding whether a supervenience thesis can adequately capture all that Physicalism regarding mentality entails.

The physical facts clearly do not logically necessitate the mental facts.  The laws of logic alone do not allow us to derive the latter from the former.  However, one might wonder whether the laws of logic together with the meanings of physical and mental terms allow us to derive all true mentalistic sentences from sentences expressed in physical vocabulary.  That is, one might wonder whether

(NL-C)  facts about the distribution of physical properties logically/conceptually necessitate all the facts about the distribution of mental properties.

Yet, NL-C seems implausible on any reasonable interpretation of ‘physical.’  If we restrict the term ‘physical’ to properties described by the science of physics itself, then the obvious difference in meaning between mental vocabulary and the vocabulary of physics seems to show that NL-C is false.  Even if the word ‘physical’ were used loosely enough to include brain properties, and even if mental properties were identical with brain properties, NL-C would still be highly dubious.  Since mental talk is not synonymous with neural talk, mind-brain identity theorists rightly held their view, not as an analytic truth, but as a significant empirical hypothesis.  (See, for example, J.J.C. Smart, 1959 and U.T. Place, 1956.)  Suppose ‘physical’ is used liberally enough to include overt behavioral responses to environmental input — for example, bringing an umbrella when confronted with rain, grimacing and groaning as the punching continues, and responding appropriately in French to questions posed in French.  With this liberal use of ‘physical’ NL-C would be accepted by logical behaviorists.  Of course, this is no credit to NL-C given the well-known problems with logical behaviorism.  Although, one might think that with such a generous use of ‘physical,’ analytic functionalism (which is not as implausible as logical behaviorism) is committed to NL-C as well.  But that is not so.  Functionalists characterize mental properties in terms of their relations to environmental input, behavioral output, and other mental properties.  For instance, the belief that it is raining will be characterized in terms of an inclination to bring an umbrella if one wishes to keep dry.  Given that mental predicates are to be interdefined, even with a liberal definition of ‘physical’ the analytic functionalist would seem compelled to deny that a purely physical description logically/conceptually guarantees the truth of any mental description.

Not only does NL-C seem to be false, it also appears to be much more than what Physicalism requires.  It might be that mental phenomena depend entirely on physical phenomena (as physicalists regarding mentality contend) without there being a logical or conceptual tie between the two.  Since predicates that differ in meaning might denote the very same property, it seems that even if mental properties were identical with physical properties, it would not follow that facts about the latter logically or conceptually guarantee facts about the former.  (However, Robert Kirk claims otherwise.  Imagine the complete set, P, of facts about the world expressed in the vocabulary of an ideal physics, and suppose that this set includes all of the physical laws that obtain.  According to Kirk, Physicalism requires that the relation between P and the set of mental facts is one of strict implication, where “statement A strictly implies a statement B just in case ‘A and not-B’ involves inconsistency of a broadly logical or conceptual kind,” 2006, p. 525.  There are also the arguments of Jackson (1994 & 1998) and Chalmers’ (1996) to consider, arguments purporting to show that much more follows a priori from the physical facts than what we might be inclined to think.  Although, for Chalmers and Jackson, these do not include facts about the qualitative character of conscious experience.)

The fact that mental differences require physical differences would seem to have something, perhaps everything, to do with the laws of nature that actually obtain.  It is arguable that the laws of nature that actually obtain are what make it the case that mental sameness guarantees physical sameness.  Consider, then, the proposal that:

(NN)  facts about the distribution of physical properties nomologically necessitate all the facts about the distribution of mental properties.

However, while it is reasonable to think that the supervenience of the mental on the physical is a matter of the laws of nature that actually obtain, NN is too weak to do the work a physicalist would want a supervenience thesis to do.  The physicalist who appeals to supervenience is trying to honor the fact that the mental depends entirely on the physical without being committed to the view that mental properties are identical with physical properties.  Suppose, as is widely believed, that mental properties are not identical with physical properties.  Then the psychophysical laws by virtue of which the physical facts fix the mental facts are not purely physical laws.  In that case, NN allows that there is a possible world that is physically indistinguishable from the actual world, including all the same purely physical laws, but with a very different distribution of mental properties.  As Crane puts it, “if fixing the mental facts requires psychophysical laws, then fixing the physical facts alone is not sufficient to fix the mental facts” (1991, pp. 237-8).

To support our physicalist intuitions, it seems that we need a supervenience relation that is committed to the following necessitation claim:

(NP)  facts about the distribution of physical properties physically necessitate all the facts about the distribution of mental properties,

where p physically necessitates q just in case ‘p and not q’ is not true in any possible world with all the same physical laws as those that actually obtain.  If the physical laws did allow worlds with the same distribution of physical properties but a different distribution of mental properties, then there would be a clear sense in which the mental facts are at least partly due to something other than physical facts.  So it is arguable that our physicalist intuitions do entail just what NP states. Indeed, Np does capture a popular way that the necessity involved in supervenience theses applied to mentality are in fact understood.  (See, for example, Papineau’s formulation of Physicalism: 1993, p. 21.)

Yet, there are some worries about NP.  Lewis, Horgan, and Jackson address what is called the Problem of Extras.  Lewis claims that “Materialism is meant to be a contingent thesis, a merit of our world that not all other worlds share” (1983, p. 362).  Even if all concrete phenomena obtain solely by virtue of physical phenomena, as Physicalism maintains, it seems that things did not have to be that way.  The world could have been such that angels, ghosts, or other immaterial beings reside alongside the physical items that actually exist.  It is also arguable that Physicalism allows non-actual possible worlds where all the actual physical laws obtain but with immaterial extras — provided that these extras do not causally interfere with the physical world.  Horgan imagines that “[i]n such worlds the spirits would not interfere with the ordinary operations of physical laws upon physical substances; they would simply co-exist with the physical” (1982, p. 35).  The concern, then, is that a possible world with the same distribution of physical properties that actually obtains and all the same physical laws might nonetheless differ from the actual world by having immaterial mental extras.  If such a possible world is consistent with the truth of Physicalism, as Lewis and Horgan think, then the truth of Physicalism does not require that physical sameness (including physical laws) guarantees mental sameness.  And if so, then NP is not necessary for the truth of Physicalism.

One way to solve the Problem of Extras is to identify some restricted class of physically possible worlds and then characterize Physicalism as the view that physical sameness entails mental (and other higher-order) sameness in that restricted class of worlds.  For example, Frank Jackson (1998) appeals to the notion of a minimal physical duplicate, where “a minimal physical duplicate of our world is a world that (a) is exactly like our world in every physical respect (instantiated property for instantiated property, law for law, relation for relation), and (b) contains nothing else in the sense of nothing more by way of kinds or particulars than it must to satisfy (a)” (p. 13).  With this notion of a minimal physical duplicate, Jackson proposes that we characterize Physicalism in general as the view that “[a]ny world which is a minimal physical duplicate of our world is a duplicate simpliciter of our world” (p. 12).  That is, if you physically duplicate the actual world and stop right there, then what results does not differ mentally or in any other way from the actual world.  To restrict the class of physically possible worlds where physical sameness entails mental sameness, Lewis (1983) relies on the notion of a property’s being “alien” to a world, where “a property is alien to a world iff (1) it is not instantiated by any inhabitant of that world, and (2) it is not analysable as a conjunction of, or as a structural property constructed out of, natural properties all of which are instantiated by inhabitants of that world” (p. 364).  With the notion of an alien property, Lewis offers the following supervenience claim: “[a]mong worlds where no natural properties alien to our world are instantiated, no two differ without differing physically; any two such worlds that are exactly alike physically are duplicates” (p. 364).  If we think that a physically possible world with the distribution of physical properties that actually obtains might nonetheless contain immaterial mental extras, then we might restrict NP with the help of either Lewis’ proposal or Jackson’s (or Horgan’s proposal, which appeals to the notion of a physically accessible world, a P-world, 1982, p. 36-7).

Another potential concern about NP is expressed by Francescotti (2000, 1998).  Suppose, as many believe, that mental properties are not identical with physical properties.  Then the purely physical laws do not range over mental properties.  In that case, Francescotti argues, the physical properties instantiated would determine which mental properties are instantiated only given the truth of irreducibly psychophysical laws.  But if so, it is arguable that the truth of Np requires that mental properties are identical with physical properties (which seems to be a threat to Non-Reductive Physicalism assuming that Physicalism requires the physical necessitation of mental facts).

The search for the exact way in which the physical facts necessitate the mental facts continues.  There are also the remaining issues described in section 3-a — whether to prefer local to global supervenience, and whether and how to make the thesis super-local to capture only those physical properties that are relevant to mentality.  There is also the issue of whether the supervenience base should be restricted to qualitative properties or whether non-qualitative, impure properties should also be included — properties such as containing a neural event that is numerically identical with neural event x.  (Recall that Horgan’s regional supervenience thesis is restricted to qualitative properties.)  There is also the question of whether it is acceptable for a supervenience thesis to be restricted to same-subject necessitation, where the base properties are restricted to properties of the very same object that bears the supervening properties.  Should we prefer multiple-domain supervenience (where the supervening properties are exemplified by a domain of items that differs from the domain of the subvening properties) — allowing, for example, that the base properties are properties of constituents of the individuals with the supervening properties?  While supervenience theorists have been dealing for years with these technical matters and many others regarding the details of the supervenience relation, some general objections have been raised to the whole project of trying to describe the dependence of the mental on the physical in terms of supervenience.  Let’s consider two common complaints.

4. Two Common Complaints with Supervenience Theses

Kim (1993) tells us that a supervenience thesis “itself says nothing about the nature of the dependence involved; it tells us neither what kind of dependency it is, nor how the dependency grounds or explains the property covariation” (pp. 165-6).  So a supervenience thesis leaves us wondering:

Is it a matter of causal dependence?  Is it in some way analogous to mereological supervenience?  Is it after all a matter of meaning dependence, as logical behaviorists and some functionalists claim?  Perhaps, a matter of divine intervention or plan as Malebranche and Leibniz thought?   Or a brute and in principle unexplainable relationship which we must accept “with natural piety,” as some emergentists used to insist?  (p. 167)

There are two distinct worries expressed here — the failure of a supervenience thesis to explain mental phenomena and its failure to ontologically ground mental phenomena.

a. Explanatory Failure

If the mental supervenes on the physical as a matter of logical-conceptual necessity, then there would be an easy explanation (in terms of the laws of logic and meanings of our mental and physical terms) for why physical sameness guarantees mental sameness.  Yet, if NL-C is to be rejected, as it seems it should, then the worry is that the dependence of the mental on the physical is left unexplained.  One might appeal to psychophysical laws as the explanation — P guarantees M because it is a law that P → N.  But this does not explain why the psychophysical law P → N obtains.  The complaint that an account expressed solely in terms of supervenience commits us to unexplained psychophysical laws has been raised by many.  See, for example, Gardner (2005, p. 201-2), Kim (1989, sec. IV, 1993, pp. 165-9), Heil, (1998), Horgan (1993a, sec. 8, 1993b, sec. 5), and Moreland (1998, pp. 50-1).  A physicalist might allow that there are brute laws, provided that these are purely physical.  But if a law is not purely physical, if it is irreducibly psychophysical, then as a physicalist one would expect an explanation in terms of purely physical laws of why that psychophysical law obtains, and this explanation is what a mere supervenience claim does not provide.  As a result, a physicalist might be compelled to find some suitable brand of what Horgan calls “superdupervenience” — “ontological supervenience that is robustly explainable in a materialistically acceptable way” (1993, p. 577).

Regarding the explanatory concern, two points are worth mentioning.  First, if we are offering an ontological account of mentality, then it is not clear that a “materialistically acceptable” explanation is required.  According to Physicalism as an ontological doctrine, mental (and other higher-level) phenomena obtain solely by virtue of physical phenomena.  However, it might be that mental phenomena are entirely due to physical phenomena in a way that is inexplicable to us.  So if our concern is with the ontological status of mentality, then it is arguably not a fault of a supervenience-based account that it falls short of superdupervenience.  Secondly, it seems that a supervenience thesis by itself can take us some way, perhaps a long way, toward understanding the nature of the psychophysical dependence.  Recall that an adequate formulation of a supervenience thesis will need to make clear what brand of necessity is involved.  Suppose that mental properties supervene on physical properties with physical necessity.  Then the purely physical laws that actually obtain provide the explanation of why changes in mental properties require changes in physical properties.  Suppose that mental properties supervene on physical properties with nomological necessity only.  Then the explanation of why the mental supervenes on the physical would appeal to irreducibly psychophysical laws.  This explanation might not (and should not) satisfy a physicalist, but it is an explanation nonetheless, and perhaps even the correct explanation.  Or maybe the physical facts fix the mental facts with a type of necessity that lies between the logical/conceptual variety and the physical brand — with the metaphysical necessity that some philosophers discuss.  Then we might decide that the mental supervenes on the physical, not because of the physical laws that actually obtain, but due to some other type of relation, perhaps identity or maybe some mereological (part-whole) relation.  It seems, then, that thinking about the modality involved in a supervenience thesis can profitably guide our thoughts about why mental properties covary with physical properties in the way that they do.

There is another reason, and perhaps a better reason than explanatory failure, to be dissatisfied with a mere supervenience thesis.

b. Ontological Failure

Since a mental-physical supervenience thesis tells us only how mental properties covary with physical properties, it is compatible not only with property dualism (as the non-reductive physicalist would hope) but also with substance dualism.  Even if substance dualism were true, it might be that immaterial minds are causally connected or otherwise related to physical bodies in such a way that any variation in the properties of these immaterial minds occurs only with a variation in physical properties of the body.  Physicalism certainly does not allow that substance dualism is true.  So, since a supervenience thesis is compatible with substance dualism, it does not fully capture our physicalist intuitions.

However, there is still hope for an adequate formulation of Physicalism regarding mentality that is largely supervenience-based.  To avoid substance dualism, we simply need to conjoin a supervenience thesis with some constraint on the composition of mental items.  For example, as Geoffrey Hellman and Frank Thompson (1975) state with their Principle of Physical Exhaustion, “everything concrete is exhausted by basic physical objects” (p. 555).  Likewise, Phillip Pettit (1993) insists that “[e]verything in the empirical world is composed in some way — composed without remainder — out of (subatomic) entities of the kind that microphysics posits, or it is itself uncomposed and microphysical” (p. 215).  Applied to mentality, the claim is: all mental particulars (all instances and bearers of mental properties) are ultimately comprised entirely of physical particulars.

Or we might wish to combine a supervenience thesis with a realization claim.  The claim that mental properties are realized physically is popular among those who support Physicalism while denying psychophysical identities.  The notion of physical realization adds to the Principle of Physical Exhaustion the idea that mental properties are functional properties that are exemplified by virtue of instances of physical properties playing the definitive functional roles.  So the idea that mental properties are realized physically would also seem to rule out immaterial mental items.  (Indeed, Andrew Melynk, for example, 1996, 2003, and 2006, argues that a realization thesis itself, suitably refined, is enough to capture the content of Physicalism even without an independent supervenience claim.)

5. Concluding Remarks

It is widely agreed that the notion of supervenience cannot by itself fully explain the dependence of the mental on the physical.  Yet, we must not underestimate the value of the concept to understanding how mental properties relate to the physical properties on which they depend.  Whether or not we actually use the term ‘supervenience,’ our first step in deciding whether F-properties depend solely on G-properties is to decide whether a difference in the former requires a difference in the latter.  On the basis of various thought-experiments, we might conclude that (i) F-properties do not supervene on G-properties, that is, that the former are not entirely a function of the latter (as many conclude regarding the relation between mental content and intrinsic bodily features).  While (i) is a negative result, it is quite useful insofar as it directs our attention to features, perhaps previously overlooked, on which F-properties do depend (for example, surrounding linguistic practice or the internal structure of the external objects of our thought).  Suppose, on the other hand, we conclude that F-properties do supervene on G-properties.  Establishing this conclusion is an essential step to concluding further that (ii) F-properties are identical with G-properties (since any set of properties trivially supervenes on itself).  Or instead of (ii), we might conclude that (iii) F-properties depend entirely on but are not identical with G-properties.  Whichever of (i)-(iii) we choose, that choice inevitably involves deciding whether supervenience obtains.

Regarding the mental and the physical, we might decide either that (ii*) mental properties are physical properties or that (iii*) while non-physical, mental properties nonetheless depend entirely on physical properties.  Being a physicalist regarding mentality seems to require accepting at least (iii*).  And since both (ii*) and (iii*) entail that the mental supervenes on the physical, it seems Kim is right to note that “mind-body supervenience represents the minimal physicalist commitment” (1993, p. 168).  A supervenience thesis, however, is not merely a minimal physicalist commitment, for it need not leave the mental-physical covariance wholly unexplained.  Suppose we accept (ii*).  Then we have a simple explanation of the covariance: changes in the mental require changes in the physical simply because the mental is the physical.  On the other hand, if we accept (iii*), then as noted in section 3-a, thinking about the brand of necessity involved in our supervenience thesis (conceptual, metaphysical, physical, or nomological) can take us some way, perhaps a long way, toward figuring out what type of dependence obtains.  And since even making a decision regarding (i)-(iii), or (ii*)-(iii*), requires engaging in thoughts about supervenience, the concept is not only helpful, but indispensible to understanding the relation between the two sets of properties.  So whether or not the term ‘supervenience’ remains in vogue, the very notion will remain a crucial and potentially highly useful part of our inquiry into the relation between the mental and the physical.  As Dean Rickles, another writer for this encyclopedia puts it, “supervenience deserves the central place that is has found in the philosophers’ toolbox” (2006).

6. References and Further Readings

  • Beckermann, A., H. Flohr, and J. Kim (1992).  Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter).
  • Bennett, K. (2004). “Global Supervenience and Dependence,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 68: 510-529.
  • Burge, T. (1979).  “Individualism and the Mental,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4: 73-121.
  • Burge, T. (1986).  “Individualism and Psychology,” The Philosophical Review 95: 3-45.
  • Chalmers, D. (1996).  The Conscious Mind (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Chalmers, D. and F. Jackson (2001).  “Conceptual Analysis and Reductive Explanation,” Philosophical Review 110: 15-60.
  • Crane, T. (1991).  “All God Has To Do,” Analysis 51: 235-244.
  • Davidson, D. (1970).  “Mental Events,” in L. Foster and J. W. Swanson (eds.), Experience and Theory (Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press): 79-101.
  • Francescotti, R. (2000).  “Ontological Physicalism and Property Pluralism: Why They are Incompatible,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 81: 349-362.
  • Francescotti (1998).  “The Non-Reductionist’s Troubles with Supervenience,” Philosophical Studies 89: 105-124.
  • Gardner, T. (2005).  “Supervenience Physicalism: Meeting the Demands of Determination and Explanation,” Philosophical Papers 34: 189-208.
  • Hare, R.M. (1952).  The Language of Morals (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Haugeland, J. (1984). “Ontological Supervenience,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, Supplement 22: 1-12.
  • Heil, J. (1998).  “Supervenience Deconstructed,” European Journal of Philosophy 6: 146-155.
  • Hellman, G. and F. W. Thompson, (1975). “Physicalism: Ontology, Determination, and Reduction,” The Journal of Philosophy 72: 551-564.
  • Hoffmann-Kolss, V. (2010).  The Metaphysics of Extrinsic Properties (Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag).
  • Hoffmann, V. and A. Newen (2007).  “Supervenience of Extrinsic Properties,” Erkenntnis 67: 305-319.
  • Hofweber, T. (2005).  “Supervenience and Object-Dependent Properties,” The Journal of Philosophy 102: 5-32.
  • Horgan, T. (1993a).  “From Supervenience to Superdupervenience: Meeting the Demands of a Material World,” Mind 102: 555-586.
  • Horgan, T. (1993b).  “Nonreductive Materialism and the Explanatory Autonomy of Psychology,” in S. J. Wagner and R. Warner (eds.), Naturalism (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press): 295-320.
  • Horgan, T. (ed.) (1984). Southern Journal of Philosophy 22: The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement, Supervenience.
  • Horgan, T. (1982).  “Supervenience and Microphysics,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 63: 29-43.
  • Howell, R. J. (2009).  “Emergentism and Supervenience Physicalism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87: 83-98.
  • Jackson, F. (1998).  From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Analysis (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Jackson, F. (1994).  “Armchair Metaphysics,” in M. Michael and J. O’Leary-Hawthorne (eds.), Philosophy in Mind, (Dordrecht: Kluwer): 23-42.
  • Kim, J. (1993).  Supervenience and Mind: Selected Philosophical Essays (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Kim, J. (1990).  “Supervenience as a Philosophical Concept,” Metaphilosophy 21: 1-27.
  • Kim, J. (1989).  “The Myth of Nonreductive Physicalism,” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 63: 31-47.
  • Kim, J. (1987).  “‘Strong’ and ‘Global’ Supervenience Revisited,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 48: 315-326.
  • Kim, J. (1984).  “Concepts of Supervenience,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 45: 153-176.
  • Kirk, R. (2006).  “Physicalism and Strict Implication,” Synthese 151: 523-536.
  • Kirk, R. (1996).  “Strict Implication, Supervenience, and Physicalism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 244-256.
  • Lewis, D. (1986).  The Plurality of Worlds (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Lewis, D. (1983).  “New Work for a Theory of Universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61: 343-377.
  • McLaughlin, B. and K. Bennett (2005).  “Supervenience,” in E. N. Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • McLaughlin, B. (1995).  “Varieties of Supervenience,” in E. Savellos and U. D. Yakrin (eds.), Supervenience: New Essays (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): 16-59.
  • McLaughlin, B. (1992).  “The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism,” in A. Beckermann, H. Flohr, and J. Kim (eds.), Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism (Berlin: De Gruyter): 49-93.
  • Melnyk, A. (2006).  “Realization and the Formulation of Physicalism,” Philosophical Studies 131: 127-155.
  • Melnyk, A. (2003).  A Physicalist Manifesto (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Melnyk, A. (1996).  “Formulating Physicalism: Two Suggestions,” Synthese 105: 381-407.
  • Moore, G. E. (1922).  Philosophical Studies (London: Routledge).
  • Moreland, J. P. (1998). “Should a Naturalist be a Supervenient Physicalist?,” Metaphilosophy 29: 35-57.
  • Moser, P. (1992).  “Physicalism and Global Supervenience,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 30: 71-82.
  • Papineau, D. (1993).  Philosophical Naturalism (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Paull, C. and T. Sider (1992).  “In Defense of Global Supervenience,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 32: 830-45.
  • Petrie, B. (1987).  “Global Supervenience and Reduction,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 48:119-30.
  • Pettit, P. (1993).  “A Definition of Physicalism,” Analysis 53: 213-223.
  • Place, U. T. (1956).  “Is Consciousness a Brain Process?,” The British Journal of Psychology 47: 44-50.
  • Poland, J. (1994).  Physicalism: The Philosophical Foundations (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Putnam, H. (1975). “The Meaning of Meaning,’ in K. Gunderson (ed.), Language, Mind, and Knowledge, Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7:131-193.
  • Putnam, H. (1973).  “Meaning and Reference,” The Journal of Philosophy 70: 699-711.
  • Rickles, D. (2006).  “Supervenience and Determination,” in J. Fieser and B. Dowden (eds.), Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Shoemaker, S.  (1998).  “Causal and Metaphysical Necessity,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 79: 59-77.
  • Shoemaker, S.  (1980).  “Causality and Properties,” in P. van Inwagen (ed.), Time and Cause (Dordrecht: D. Reidel): 109-135.
  • Shrader, W. (2008).  “On the Relevance of Supervenience Theses to Physicalism,” Acta Analytica 23: 257-271.
  • Smart, J. J. C. (1959).  “Sensation and Brain Processes,” The Philosophical Review 68: 141-156.
  • Stalnaker, R. (1996). “Varieties of Supervenience,” Philosophical Perspectives 10: 221-41.
  • Steward, H.  (1996).  “Papineau’s Physicalism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56: 667-672.
  • Van Cleve, J. (1990).  “Mind-Dust or Magic?: Panpsychism versus Emergence,” Philosophical Perspectives 4: 215-226.
  • Witmer, D. G. (1999).  “Supervenience Physicalism and the Problem of Extras,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 37: 315-331.
  • Wilson, J.  (2005).  “Supervenience-based Formulations of Physicalism,” Nous 39: 426-459.
  • Yoshimi, J. (2007).  “Supervenience, Determination, and Dependence,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 88: 114-133.


Author Information

Robert Francescotti
San Diego State University
U. S. A.

Last updated: July 21, 2011 | Originally published: