Surrogate parenting is an arrangement in which one or more persons, typically a married infertile couple (the intended rearing parents), contract with a woman to gestate a child for them and then to relinquish it to them after birth. Surrogate parenting is also sometimes referred to as “contract pregnancy,” in part, so as not to beg the question about who is the child’s real mother, but also to refer to the non-nuclear-familial nature of the arrangement. That is, this is a mode of parenting which allows a couple to have a child by involving a third party to their relationship who serves as birth mother, whether there is a contract or not. As will become apparent, surrogate parenting complicates the parenting terrain and, as such, raises significant philosophical and ethical issues. This article briefly examines some of the principal differences between commercial and non-commercial forms of surrogate/contract parenting arrangements, including the presentation of arguments against and for the moral appropriateness of this sort of parenting arrangement. After raising some of the principal challenges, four legal remedies for this complex mode of parenting are considered. This is followed by a brief summary of some healthcare organizations’ and professionals’ attitudes toward surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements. The article concludes with an assessment of the current availability and accessibility of surrogacy services and some observations about the future of surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements.
Based on available statistics, which are quite incomplete due to a lack of reporting regulations, about 1,500 to 2,000 surrogate/contracted babies are born per annum in the United States (Ali and Kelley 2008, 44). In addition, several thousands more are born each year as the result of a surrogate arrangement in a wide-variety of nations worldwide. Australia, Canada, and Brazil report numbers at least as large as those reported in the United States (Covington and Burns 2006, 371); and in India, where commercial surrogacy was legalized in 1992, poor women are recruited to gestate what may amount to hundreds (more likely thousands) of babies for couples throughout the world (Gentleman 2008, A9).
Although surrogate parenting arrangements are spreading across the globe, such arrangements apparently remain the exception rather than the rule. Most people prefer not to involve third parties in their attempts to procreate, and most people cannot afford to finance expensive third-party pregnancies. Still, the existence and use of surrogacy arrangements lead society to raise substantial questions about the nature of parenthood. What makes a parent the real parent of a child? The fact that she or he is genetically related to the child? The fact that she or he rears the child? Or the fact that she gestates the child (at present, gestation is an exclusively female task)? Is surrogate parenting just one of a series of steps towards what some term “collaborative reproduction”? In the future, will an increasing number of people form families that consist of an egg and/or sperm donor(s), a gestational mother, and one or more men and women who collaboratively produce and rear a child to adulthood? Or will most people continue to form the kind of nuclear, biologically-based families that exist today?
There are two basic types of surrogate parenting: traditional surrogacy and gestational surrogacy. In traditional surrogacy, the surrogate is inseminated with the sperm of the man who intends to be the child’s rearing parent. Because the surrogate is both the genetic mother and the gestational mother of the child, she must legally terminate her parental rights to the child after its birth, at which point the intended female rearing parent may adopt the child as her stepchild. The intended male rearing parent does not need to adopt the child because he is the child’s genetic father.
The situation is quite different in a gestational surrogacy arrangement where both of the intended rearing parents may have a genetic connection to the child. The intended rearing mother’s eggs are fertilized with the intended rearing father’s sperm in vitro (outside the womb). The resulting embryo(s) are then implanted in the surrogate’s womb. The surrogate’s only connection to the child is gestational. In a variation on this arrangement, the intended rearing parents provide the surrogate with an embryo(s) to gestate for them. If the intended rearing parents are also the child’s genetic parents, they are not required to adopt the child. However, if one or both of the intended rearing parents do not have a genetic connection to the child, they may be required to adopt the child. For example, if a couple adopt surplus frozen embryos from an assisted reproduction clinic, they may be required to adopt any child(ren) that result from the embryo(s)’ gestation in a surrogate.
Infertile, heterosexual couples are the group most likely to contract a surrogate mother. However, single people, lesbian couples, gay couples, and even fertile people may also seek the services of a contracted mother. Collaborative reproductive and/or parenting arrangements have a long history throughout the world. For example, in the Judeo-Christian tradition, the Old Testament octogenarian couple, Abraham and Sarah, used a surrogate mother to carry a child to term for them. Much later, throughout the European continent and England, middle- and upper-class women used wet nurses to nurture their infant children. Moreover, in polygamous families, two or more wives of one husband collaboratively raise all of his children. Thus, it should not surprise us that people are increasingly entering into formal surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements.
Of particular significance in any discussion of surrogate parent arrangements is the fact that some of them are commercial while others are noncommercial. Commercial surrogate parenting arrangements involve monetary payments both to the surrogate and to other third parties. Depending on state laws regulating commercial surrogacy, the cost of such arrangements in the early 21st Century ranged anywhere from $20,000 to as high as $150,000 in the United States. Surrogates typically received about $20,000 with the rest of the costs being paid out to healthcare professionals, counselors, screeners, lawyers, and surrogate brokers. In an effort to hold their costs down, some intended parents have engaged in reproductive tourism, traveling to developing nations, where the total cost for a surrogate parenting arrangement ranges from $5,000 to $12,000 largely because women are willing to rent their wombs for a relatively low sum of money.
In contrast to commercial surrogacy, non-commercial surrogacy involves an arrangement where the intended rearing parents use the services of a family member or a friend. The surrogate’s compensation supposedly consists in the satisfaction she derives from giving the gift of a new human life to people for whom she personally cares. Typically, the surrogate does not expect or want monetary compensation for her gestational services. At the most, she will accept funds to cover costs such as physician’s bills.
As noted above, the number of surrogate babies born annually in the United States or elsewhere is relatively small. In large measure, it is probably failed, highly-publicized surrogate parenting arrangements such as the notorious Baby M case that continue to put a damper on intended rearing parents using surrogate parenting arrangements. In the 1980s New Jersey Baby M case, Mary Beth Whitehead contracted with William Stern to be artificially inseminated with his sperm, to get pregnant (if possible), to carry the child to term, and then to relinquish the child to Stern. Whitehead and Stern also agreed that Whitehead would receive $10,000 for a healthy child, but only $1,000 for a miscarried or still-born child. In addition, Whitehead agreed not to engage in sexual relations with her husband until she was pregnant; to abstain from harmful substances during the pregnancy; to undergo amniocentesis; and to submit to abortion if Stern so requested. Finally, Whitehead agreed that, upon the child’s birth, she would terminate her maternal rights so that Stern’s wife could adopt the baby.
Whitehead became pregnant and gave birth to a baby girl. But she did not relinquish the baby to Stern. Feeling very attached to the baby, Whitehead refused to abide by the terms of the contract. At first, lawyer Noel Keane, who had brokered the surrogacy arrangement, did not take Whitehead that seriously. He managed to persuade Whitehead to give the baby to the Sterns for an overnight stay. But when Whitehead became extremely upset the next day, the Sterns gave the baby back to her. They thought that within a short time, the $10,000 fee would start looking better to Whitehead than the responsibility of adding another child to her existing two-child family. The Sterns’ speculation turned out to be false. Whitehead soon told the Sterns she had reached a final decision and would never relinquish the child to them. Money was not nearly as important to her as love for the baby. At one point, the entire Whitehead family fled to Florida with the baby to escape the arm of the law, but the New Jersey police tracked the Whiteheads down and seized the baby. By then the Sterns had persuaded Judge Harvey Sorkow to grant them sole custody of the baby.
After a prolonged custody battle between Whitehead and Stern, presided over by none other than Judge Sorkow, the court determined it was in the best interests of “Baby M” to enforce the surrogacy contract. Judge Sorkow thought that Whitehead was unfit parent material because of her emotional instability and the fact that she had entered into the arrangement at all. Stern was given custody of the baby, Whitehead was stripped of her parental rights, and Stern’s wife was permitted to adopt the baby. Whitehead appealed the court’s decision and, after another protracted legal battle, the New Jersey Supreme Court overturned Sorkow’s decision, invalidating commercial surrogacy contracts as a disguised form of baby-selling. As the immediate consequence of its decision, the New Jersey Supreme Court voided the termination of Whitehead’s parental rights and invalidated Mrs. Stern’s adoption of the baby. However, the high court allowed the Sterns to keep the baby with the proviso that Whitehead be given visitation rights. The high court reasoned it was in the best interests of the two-year-old child to remain in the home of the only family she had ever known: the Sterns. Although many people thought this decision was fair, others complained it was an instance where privileged people, the Sterns, were presumed by virtue of their wealth and status to be better parents than poor, working-class people like the Whiteheads.
Cases like the Baby M case have prompted opponents of commercial surrogacy to emphasize that such parenting arrangements tend to exploit poor, young, single, or ethnic/minority women desperate for money, and that some surrogacy agencies instruct surrogates to view themselves as mere incubators for intended rearing parent(s)’ babies. In addition, some opponents of surrogacy object to non-commercial surrogacy for at least two reasons. First, a female family member may be pressured to demonstrate love for another female family member, for example, by serving as a surrogate mother for her. Second, a child may be deeply troubled upon discovering that not the mother who is raising her but actually her aunt is her gestational and perhaps also genetic mother. Finally, yet other opponents of surrogacy object that surrogacy arrangements risk the commoditization of babies as goods or products that can be contracted for as if they were mere things rather than human persons.
Advocates of surrogate parenting accuse its opponents of distorting empirical facts to rationalize their discomfort about breaking the formerly seamless web between genetic, gestational, and rearing forms of parentage. Although those who favor surrogacy concede that intended rearing parents are typically more affluent than most of the surrogates they hire, they deny that intended rearing parents routinely exploit surrogates. They note that, truth be told, most surrogates are white, between 20 and 30 years old, working class (not underclass), and married. Moreover, most surrogacy agencies prefer to use surrogates who have had at least one child and are altruistically as well as financially motivated to work as surrogates. Advocates of surrogate parenting also stress that when intended rearing parents and surrogates have and maintain good relationships with each other, no harm befalls the very-much wanted child. If anything, such a child generally finds him or herself in a particularly loving family. Finally, they claim that in a society that increasingly favors open adoptions and celebrates blended families, surrogate parenting is just another way for people to establish a family.
In the United Sates, four legal remedies (each with varying permutations) have been proposed at the state level to regulate surrogate parenting. They are: (1) banning commercial surrogate parenting arrangements; (2) legally enforcing most commercial and even non-commercial surrogate parenting arrangements; (3) assimilating most surrogate parenting arrangements into either traditional or modified adoption law; and (4) refusing to legally enforce any surrogate parenting arrangement whatsoever. Each of these remedies has its strengths and weaknesses, and none of them is the clear winner in attempts to properly regulate surrogate parenting arrangements.
A relatively small number of states ban commercial surrogacy, imposing civil and criminal penalties on surrogacy brokers in particular. Michigan is probably the most anti-surrogacy state in the Union. In 1993, Michigan legislators ruled it is a misdemeanor to be party to a surrogacy contract and a felony to serve as a “surrogate broker,” with a maximum penalty of a $50,000 fine and five years in prison (MICH. COMP. LAWS, 1993). Even though states like Michigan typically do not prohibit non-commercial surrogate parenting arrangements, they do refuse to enforce them as binding contracts. States that ban commercial surrogacy do so on the grounds that it is a disguised form of baby-selling that exploits women and commodifies children. They dismiss arguments that the intended rearing parents do not actually pay for the baby, but only for the surrogate’s gestational services. Such states also dismiss arguments that most women who serve as surrogates do so freely, and that the children to which they give birth are not viewed as merchandise but as very much wanted children. Whether outright bans of commercial surrogate parenting arrangements are constitutionally permissible remains an open question, however. Advocates of these arrangements argue that if the only way a married infertile couple, for example, can have child genetically-related to them is to use a surrogate mother service, then prohibiting them from doing so is probably a violation of their fundamental right to procreate.
An increasing number of states use codified law to recognize and enforce properly negotiated surrogate parenting contracts. One state, California, uses case law to enforce parenting contracts. Importantly, these states regulate the terms of the surrogacy contract. For example, in most states, intended rearing parents are not permitted to pay for more than the surrogate’s medical and ancillary expenses; and, in all states, intended rearing parents may not interfere with a surrogate’s abortion rights. Interestingly, most states that enforce surrogacy contracts are maximally supportive of intended rearing parents who are also the genetic parents of the child. These states reason that the intended rearing parents have two parental claims—one based on the intent to rear the child and the other based on genetics—which in combination trump any parental claim a surrogate might make solely on the basis of her gestational relationship to the child. In instances of gestational surrogacy where the intended rearing parents supply the surrogate with an embryo that is genetically unrelated to them, codified law and case law rely solely on the intended rearing parents’ intent to establish legal parenthood. Moreover, in some states where intent is recognized as the factor which establishes parenthood, the intended rearing parents may apply for an order, prior to the baby’s birth, directing that their names rather than the names of the surrogate and her husband (if she has one) be entered on the birth certificate.
Some states that recognize surrogate parenting arrangements maintain features of adoption law in their codified-law and case-law frameworks. Typically, these states provide the surrogate with a change-of-heart period, usually around 72 hours, during which she may decide not to revoke her parental rights to the child. In the estimation of some legal theorists, intent alone does not necessarily determine rightful parenthood. They believe that the “sweat equity” of gestation should count as establishing some sort of parental claim to a child.
Nearly half of the states do not view surrogate parenting arrangements as legally enforceable. Deeming a contract for a mother unenforceable means that, if either the surrogate mother or the intended rearing parents breach the contract, the state will not intervene. The parties to the contract will need to work out their differences in custody court. So, for example, if the intended rearing parents fail to pay the surrogate mother her fee, the state will not help her collect it. Or if the intended rearing parents refuse to take the child from the surrogate mother because they no longer want the child, the state will not force them to become rearing parents. Instead, the state will require the surrogate mother either to maintain her parental relationship with the child or to put the child up for adoption. In the former case, she may be entitled to child support from the genetic or intended rearing father.
As it so happens, a non-enforcement situation is just as risky for the intended rearing parents as it is for the surrogate. If the surrogate mother refuses to relinquish the child to the intended parents, they will not be able to secure custody of the child based solely on the contract they made with the surrogate mother. However, because of the state’s interest in the well-being of the child, a family-law court will rely on the traditional “best interests of the child” standard to resolve custody disputes between the surrogate and the intended rearing parents. In cases of traditional surrogacy, virtually all family law courts will view the custody dispute as one between two genetic parents: the surrogate mother and the intended father. In cases of gestational surrogacy, some family-law courts will view the custody dispute as a conflict between the gestational mother (the surrogate mother) and the genetic mother (most typically the intended mother but in some instances an egg donor) to be decided by appeal to the original intention of the involved parties.
Largely because the legal remedies for surrogacy arrangements in many states are either non-existent or ambiguous, healthcare leaders have been cautious about either total bans of or wholesale endorsements of surrogate parenting. The two main medical societies that set the gold standards for assisted-reproduction accept with some reservations surrogate parenting arrangements. The American College of Obstetrics and Gynecology (ACOG) accepts surrogacy arrangements only when they are medically necessary, and the compensation to the surrogate or gestational mother is based on her services and not on her ability to produce a child for the intended rearing parents. Adopting the assimilationist view described above, ACOG also suggests that private nonprofit agencies, similar to adoption agencies, oversee surrogacy arrangements (ACOG 1990, 133), and that subsequent to the birth of the child, the surrogate or gestational mother be given a short period of time during which she can change her mind about giving up the child.
The other main assisted-reproduction medical society, the American Society for Reproductive Medicine (ASRM), recommends that intended rearing parents avoid a traditional surrogacy arrangement and instead use a gestational surrogacy arrangement. Although the ASRM is not enthusiastic about any widespread use of surrogate mothers, it recognizes surrogacy arrangements as a way for a limited number of people to exercise their procreative freedom. Like ACOG, the ASRM frowns on assisting surrogacy arrangements unless there is a medical reason to do so.
Because the assisted-reproduction industry is regulated primarily by non-enforceable practice guidelines, assisted reproduction centers and infertility clinics usually decide their own policies and procedures for surrogacy arrangements. Some centers and clinics limit their services to infertile married couples, whereas other centers and clinics welcome anyone who can pay for their services. Limiting one’s practice to certain groups of people is sometimes a covert form of discrimination against other groups of people, however. It may be morally and legally justifiable for a center or clinic to refuse to assist people who do not have a medical reason, specifically infertility, to contract a surrogate mother. After all, physicians and nurses have no clear obligation to use their skills and/or connections to serve people who do not suffer from a disease, disability, or medical abnormality. However, when physicians and nurses refuse to help gay or lesbian individuals or couples who need to enter into a surrogacy arrangement in order to have a child, their refusal to extend help to these individuals or couples may constitute an act of discrimination.
As surrogate/contract parenting arrangements are normalized and routinized, the U.S. public will probably press federal and state authorities to pass clear legislation governing surrogacy. People in the United States view their procreative rights as sacrosanct: too important to be left to the unpredictable rulings of courts and/or the sometimes arbitrary policies of infertility clinics and assisted reproduction centers. Developing ideal laws to govern surrogate parenting arrangements will be no easy matter, however, not when a gay man can use donor sperm and donor eggs to produce embryos that are then implanted in the womb of a gestational mother. Should the law, on the basis of this gay man’s intentions alone, deem him the legal father of the child? Perhaps so, despite the fact that it will be quite some time before the majority of the U.S. population and the feminist community is comfortable with such a novel surrogate parenting arrangement.
University of North Carolina, Charlotte
U. S. A.
Last updated: February 9, 2011 | Originally published: