Surveillance involves paying close and sustained attention to another person. It is distinct from casual yet focused people-watching, such as might occur at a pavement cafe, to the extent that it is sustained over time. Furthermore the design is not to pay attention to just anyone, but to pay attention to some entity (a person or group) in particular and for a particular reason. Nor does surveillance have to involve watching. It may also involve listening, as when a telephone conversation is bugged, or even smelling, as in the case of dogs trained to discover drugs, or hardware which is able to discover explosives at a distance.
The ethics of surveillance considers the moral aspects of how surveillance is employed. Is it a value-neutral activity which may be used for good or ill, or is it always problematic and if so why? What are the benefits and harms of surveillance? Who is entitled to carry out surveillance, when and under what circumstances? Are there any circumstances under which someone should never be under surveillance?
This article provides a brief overview of the history of surveillance ethics, beginning with Jeremy Bentham and George Orwell. It then looks at the development of surveillance studies in the light of Michel Foucault and the challenges posed by new techniques of surveillance which allow unprecedented collection and retention of information. The bulk of this article focuses on considering the ethical challenges posed by surveillance. These include why surveillance is undertaken and by whom, as well as when and how it may be employed. This is followed by an examination of a number of concerns regarding the impact of surveillance such as social sorting, distance and chilling effects.
Jeremy Bentham’s idea of the Panopticon is arguably the first significant reference to surveillance ethics in the modern period (Bentham 1995). The Panopticon was to be a prison, comprising a circular building with the cells adjacent to the outside walls. In the centre was a tower in which the prison supervisor would live and monitor the inmates. Large external windows and smaller internal windows in each cell would allow the supervisor to monitor the activities of the inmates, while a system of louvres in the central tower would prevent the inmates from seeing the supervisor. A rudimentary form of directed loudspeaker would enable the supervisor to communicate with the prisoners. Through not knowing when they were under surveillance, Bentham argued, the inmates would come to assume that they were always under surveillance. This would encourage them to be self-disciplined and well-behaved during their incarceration. The prospect of living in this way would also deter those who visited the prison from wanting to commit crimes. Hence the Panopticon would serve as a deterrent to the inmates from misbehaving or committing future crimes and to general society from committing crimes and finding themselves so incarcerated.
George Orwell’s 1984 extended the Panopticon to encompass the whole of society, or at least the middle classes (Orwell 2004). In this novel the Panopticon became electrical with the invention of the telescreen, a two-way television which allowed the state almost total visual and auditory access to the homes, streets and workplaces of the citizens. As the inmates of the Panopticon were reminded of the supervisor’s presence by the loudspeaker, so citizens in Orwell’s vision were told repeatedly that “Big Brother is watching you”. Orwell used the novel to discuss, among other things, both the reasons of the state for wanting ubiquitous surveillance and the impact that this has on the individual and the nature of a society under ubiquitous surveillance.
The theme of the Panopticon was revisited by Michel Foucault in Discipline and Punish, an overview of the history of prisons and the value they serve (Foucault 1991). Foucault’s particular concern was with the use of power and its increasing bureaucratization in the modern period. His study began with torture and the emphasis on the sovereignty and power of the king. With the Enlightenment the prison was introduced as a more efficient means of punishment, supported by society’s increasing acceptance of the value of discipline beyond merely the military or religious arenas. Oversight became a fundamental tool in enforcing discipline, and so the Panopticon served as both a means of punishment and a form of discipline of the inmates, owing to the seemingly persistent gaze of the supervisor. With time, Foucault argued, the prison was combined with the workhouse and the hospital to simultaneously deprive inmates of their freedom whilst attempting to discipline and reform them.
Aside from Foucault’s comments on the nature of prisons and their value in society, his reference to the Panopticon introduced the concept to a new generation of scholars unfamiliar with Bentham’s penal theories. As such it is the Panopticon read through the lens of Foucault, along with Orwell’s dystopian vision, that came to dominate early discussions of surveillance and its impact on society and the individual.
While Bentham/Foucault and Orwell successfully raised questions about the value and harms of surveillance, these had limited impact in many philosophy departments. As such there is little written on the ethics of surveillance from a strictly philosophical perspective. However, the interest sparked by Foucault, coupled with recent advances in technology, has led to a questioning of the role surveillance plays in contemporary society. This questioning has been increasingly reflected in academia with the creation of the inter-disciplinary field of Surveillance Studies, bringing together sociologists, jurists, political scientists, geographers, and increasingly philosophers, to consider issues connected with and arising from surveillance.
Although there may be a degree of continuity with earlier forms of surveillance, the “new surveillance” (Marx 1998) introduced by technological advances adds degrees of complexity and mobility with which society has not been faced before. Closed Circuit Television (CCTV) cameras offer a potentially ubiquitous gaze and a hidden, anonymous watcher akin to the Panopticon on a hitherto unimaginable scale. Wireless networks transmit vast quantities of information on systems vulnerable to intercept. The Internet has seen the creation of virtual identities, “data doubles” – reflections of the “real” person in cyberspace – which are vulnerable to abuse and theft; online storing of medical, banking and other personal data which may be hacked or simply lost by the institution responsible; and the increased commodification of personal information by web sites which sell that data to advertising companies or governments. In each of these cases not only are the technology and services offered new but the nature of the technology means that almost limitless information can be collected, stored indefinitely and returned to or searched at will.
Taken together these issues have moved on the discussion from analogies drawn with the Panopticon or 1984. While each maintains rhetorical force, the computerization of society has rendered them limited in their ability to capture the complexities of contemporary surveillance, still less the benefits and harms that it can bring. Furthermore, both the Panopticon and Big Brother are authoritarian and negative images which lend weight to the suggestion that surveillance is always unethical or problematic. However, this is not the case. There are instances in which surveillance can be not only justified but even embraced by the surveilled. Surveillance is itself an ethically neutral concept. What determines the ethical nature of a particular instance of surveillance will be the considerations which follow, such as justified cause, the means employed, and questions of proportionality. Before turning to these, however, we will discuss the areas of life most impacted by surveillance: Privacy, trust and autonomy.
One of the core arguments against surveillance is that it poses a threat to privacy, which is of value to the individual and to society. This raises a number of questions about privacy, what it is and to what extent and why it is valuable.
Much of the early work on privacy was carried out in the legal realm, particularly in the United States. Warren and Brandeis’ The Right to Privacy (Warren and Brandeis 1890) is generally taken as the first attempt to define the concept of privacy. Here the authors claim that the right to privacy is an instance of the “right to be let alone” and establish limits to that right, arguing that it is not absolute. Developments in technology then gave rise to defining legal cases, such as Katz v. United States (1967) which related privacy and surveillance to the Fourth Amendment of the US Constitution (forbidding unreasonable search and seizure by the state). Eisenstadt v. Baird (1972) then established that the right to privacy involved the right to make important choices without government intervention, drawing a connection between privacy and autonomy. This was drawn upon in Roe vs. Wade (1972) to argue for a woman’s rights in abortion.
In the aftermath of these legal decisions the concept of privacy was increasingly debated by philosophers. Judith Jarvis Thomson (Thomson 1975) argued that the right to privacy consists of a cluster of rights which overlap with both property rights and rights of the person. She held that there are no privacy rights which do not overlap with clusters of other rights, and so there is no distinct right to privacy. A violation of someone’s right to privacy only occurs when one of these other rights has also been violated in a relevant manner. Hence the illicit viewing of another’s diary involves a breach of his right to dispose of his property as he sees fit; extracting information through torture involves a violation of someone’s right not to be injured. In both cases there is a violation of a person’s privacy, but this is only because other, more fundamental rights have been violated.
Thomas Scanlon (Scanlon 1975) responded by arguing that Thomson’s analysis was convoluted and counter-intuitive. Instead he proposed that we have socially-defined zones of privacy which enable us to act with the assumption that we are not being monitored. These zones are motivated by our interest in not having to be alert to specific observation at all times. James Rachels (Rachels 1975), responding to both Thomson and Scanlon, argued that privacy was rather a matter of relationships. In defining our relationships with others, we use varying degrees of privacy to establish intimacy. With a stranger we uphold a high degree of privacy, whilst with a close family member we may have and expect much less privacy. Indeed, he argued, what it means to be a friend is for the relationship to involve less privacy than would otherwise be the case.
More recently W.A. Parent (Parent 1983) argued that privacy involved the control of undocumented information about oneself. This has been contested by Jeffrey Reimann (Reiman 2004) and Tony Doyle (Doyle 2009), who hold that privacy is not restricted to information. A porn star whose body is freely available for all to see may still have his or her privacy violated if spied upon in his or her own home. Daniel Nathan (Nathan 1990) and Danah Boyd (Boyd 2010) agree with Parent that control is an important issue, while Herman Tavani and James Moor (Tavani and Moor 2001) hold that privacy relates more accurately to the access another has to me than to who controls the information about me.
Despite the disagreements, most would agree that on an individual level, privacy affords us the space to be ourselves and to define ourselves through giving us a degree of autonomy and protecting our dignity. In our interactions with others we may define the intimacy of our relationships with them through the amount of privacy we relinquish in that relationship. As we engage with society at large we gain confidence and security from our privacy, safe that those we do not know do not in turn know all about us. We fear the stranger and what they might do if they knew our vulnerabilities. Through keeping those vulnerabilities private, we maintain a level of personal safety.
Privacy is also of value to society at large. As noted, we may appear in public safe in the knowledge that our weaknesses are not on display for all to see, allowing for confident personal interaction. When we vote we do so in the belief that no-one can see our decision and treat us well or poorly in the light of how we voted. Privacy is thus important in the social context of democracy. In many cases we do not want to know everything about everyone around us and so privacy can protect the rest of us from being exposed to too much information. Thanks to a level of anonymity I may also feel emboldened to speak out publicly against corruption or injustice, or simply to be more creative in self-expression. Many of these benefits can be seen through the contrast with states employing high levels of surveillance, such as the former German Democratic Republic. Here the surveillance carried out by the Ministerium für Staatssicherheit (Stasi) was instrumental in quashing open dissent and enforcing the behavioural uniformity foreseen by Orwell (Funder 2004).
There is also of a tension between the safety of the individual as granted by his or her privacy, and the safety of the community which comes from denying the individual his or her privacy. On the most basic level, I feel safest if you know nothing about me but I know everything about you. This is reversed from your perspective, leading to the tension of balancing privacy against security. This balance suggests that it may be morally justifiable to deny one person’s privacy in the interests of the security of the community, although it is by no means always clear when these situations might arise.
Linked closely to the issue of privacy is that of trust. As highlighted by Rachels (Rachels 1975), privacy is often held in an inverse relationship to trust such that the more trust exists between two people, the less need there is for privacy. This is not universally true as intimate partners may still lock the bathroom door. Nonetheless committed relationships are often marked by a higher degree of trust and a reduced level of privacy. When one of those elements is breached, either through intruding on (limited) privacy or through a breaking of trust, the relationship is damaged. One reflection of diminished trust in a relationship is increased surveillance, as when suspicious partners hire private investigators to determine an infidelity. Conversely, the discovery of increased surveillance, especially when the surveilled party is innocent, may also lead to decreased levels of trust. At a personal level trust is often reciprocal: Why should I trust you if you don’t trust me? The discovery of surveillance could well therefore damage personal relationships.
Surveillance also limits the opportunity to present oneself in the manner of one’s own choosing. It is hence limiting on the individual’s autonomy, impacting how that individual interacts with the world. While Bentham believed the Panopticon would encourage inmates to self-discipline, this would only occur through fear of repercussions. The inmates would be denied the opportunity to demonstrate willingness to reform without the surveillance. There would therefore be no opportunities for the supervisor of the prison to place his trust in the prisoner, nor for that prisoner to demonstrate his trustworthiness other than in the presence of surveillance. Any traits displayed would then arguably not be genuine reflections of the character of the inmate. The same is true of surveillance in the workplace, schools and society at large. If the surveilled is suspicious of or conscious of the surveillance then they might conform to the expected norm, but this will not necessarily reflect their character.
Surveillance therefore diminishes the need to trust the surveilled person. Its presence will pressure that person to conform and so render his actions more predictable. Furthermore, as in the Panopticon, if he does not conform there is the chance he will be subject to sanctions. Surveilled people therefore can become more predictable if they fear reprisals for acting in ways that merit the disapproval of the surveillant. In that sense they are therefore more trustworthy (an authority can trust that they will act in such a manner). If the purpose of surveillance is to control or deter people, then surveillance of which the subject is aware could be effective. If, on the other hand, the purpose is to assess the character of people as that character is expressed in integrity, then surveillance of which the subject is aware will be of little help.
We have seen the impacts of surveillance on privacy, trust and autonomy. We are now in a position to consider when surveillance may be justified in spite of (or because of) those impacts.
The purpose of surveillance, or one particular instantiation of surveillance, is probably the most fundamental ethical question that can be asked on this subject. We may think of security as an obvious response, especially as it concerns state surveillance in the form of espionage, or in the form of security cameras surrounding particular buildings. In a sense this throws the question back one degree to ask whether security, or this degree of security, is justified under the circumstances. This will then hinge in part on who it is that is carrying out the surveillance and in part on whom they are monitoring. Is state surveillance of political dissidents, for instance, really necessary for state security?
Security isn’t the only use of surveillance, however. Many retail establishments use surveillance for the mutual benefit of themselves and their customers. Loyalty cards in supermarkets enable the stores to see who is buying which goods and build up detailed pictures of their customer base. Customers participate in this surveillance in return for exclusive deals. Frequent users receive special offers either to widen their shopping experience or to encourage loyalty to the particular store.
Efficiency savings such as these are not limited to retail. They also apply on public and private transport when smart cards enable a person to use the subway or a toll road without using cash. They can aid the rapid transfer of information regarding a person’s health if they fall ill or have an accident when away from home. Security and customer benefit may also come together as, for example, when credit cards are suspended following atypical spending habits of the user. This might also be the case if law enforcement agencies find that they need to establish an alibi or build a profile of a suspect.
Finally there is the possibility of using surveillance for personal gain. This might be financial or emotional, but can extend to other reasons. An unethical computer hacker might break into a website to steal credit card numbers which she can then use for her own ends. Alternatively a Peeping Tom might steal up to someone’s window with voyeuristic intent, or an ex-spouse might seek to gain incriminating information in order to secure custody of their child (Allen 2008).
While issues of simple personal gain which involve violating the privacy of another seem to be unacceptable, although there might be exceptions, questions of security and efficiency are less clear-cut. Many choose to opt-in to supermarket or transport surveillance precisely for the benefits that these systems offer, despite the intensely personal knowledge of the customer that the store can gain from these interactions. In the case of state security the questions often fall along the lines of how far should the privacy of the few be sacrificed for the security of the many. As shall be seen when we come to consider social sorting, however, questions of distribution also arise: Who stands to gain and who to lose from a particular instance of surveillance?
Consent is a major consideration in the justification of surveillance, and particularly the cause of surveillance. If I invite you into my home I am consenting for you to see me in a context which would hitherto have been private and secluded from you. In the popular game show Big Brother contestants consented to being monitored round the clock for up to three months. This does not appear to be problematic from the perspective of the surveillance. As noted above, we do not feel an imposition has occurred if we choose to take up a supermarket’s offer of a loyalty card and the convenience that it brings. We might, however, object strongly if it transpires that the store has been monitoring the spending of individuals without such cards by recording their credit card usage and correlating this with itemised receipts.
While consent can justify surveillance, however, the lack of consent does not automatically thereby invalidate it. Law enforcement does not need to seek the consent of the criminals it wishes to monitor to accumulate evidence against them, nor does the state need to gain consent of those who are genuine threats to its security. As such, we must look to justifiable causes for non-consensual surveillance.
One justification often given for large-scale surveillance is the consequentialist appeal to the greater good. This might apply when the security of the community is best served by monitoring some or all in that community. If the community in question is a state then the numbers involved will be too great to realistically gain complete acceptance of the surveillance by every citizen. As such the state may then appeal to the benefits that will come to more people as a result of the surveillance to justify the imposition.
Deontologists are likely to resist this justification as it implies that the rights of the few may be overridden by the interests of the many. A deontological justification will look rather to the entity to be surveilled and ask what it is about that entity that means it deserves or is in some way liable to be monitored in this way. Given the aforementioned harms of surveillance, there must be a good reason as to why this person or group should be exposed to those harms.
In practice, justifications for surveillance often include both consequentialist and deontological considerations. Hence state security is justified in both protecting the majority and focusing its attention on particular wrongdoers who pose a threat to that majority. Similarly, CCTV in the public square is justified in providing peace of mind to the general public by monitoring all, but targeting only particular individuals or groups who are believed to pose a threat.
The type of surveillance might also have a bearing on whether a consequentialist or deontological justification is sought. CCTV, which is indiscriminate in whom it monitors, lends itself to a consequentialist perspective. In shopping malls the majority of people surveilled by CCTV have done nothing wrong and have no intention of wrongdoing. Nonetheless, the benefits which CCTV brings in detecting the minority of wrongdoers and punishing them may be taken to justify the surveillance of all. By contrast, a more discriminating form of surveillance, such as tapping a suspect’s telephone, lends itself more to a deontological approach. If a person has given an authority such as the police reasonable suspicion to believe he has committed a crime, so he has rendered himself liable to be monitored in this way.
Finally, differences between deontologists and consequentialists emerge in opposition to surveillance. Deontologists will typically find surveillance less acceptable when it violates certain rights of individuals such as the right to privacy. By contrast, consequentialists will tend to be more sanguine about concerns with individual rights in favour of overall costs and benefits to society. If a particular instance of surveillance can be shown to improve the wellbeing of society, albeit at the cost of the privacy of a few individuals, then consequentialists are less likely to see this as problematic than deontologists.
Much of the justification of surveillance, and particularly the cause of that surveillance, will depend on who it is that is carrying out the surveillance. State security can and should be carried out by state intelligence agencies. By contrast it should not be carried out by journalists or foreign aid workers, who need to maintain a level of neutrality in order to carry out their work effectively. If this is the role of state intelligence agencies then those agencies would not be justified in the surveillance of domestic employers to ensure that they are not abusing their workforce. This should rather be the domain of domestic law enforcement.
State surveillance of genuine enemies of the state is one of the less controversial elements of surveillance. Even here, though, it is important to be clear as to precisely whose security is being guarded: That of the state or of those currently empowered to run the state? When the protests occurred in Tiananmen Square in 1989, were the protestors challenging 1) the security of China, 2) the security of the Communist Party running China or 3) the security of those individuals leading the Communist Part of China? To what extent was China the Communist Party and how much of the identity of the state is tied up with those who run the state?
The decision to employ surveillance does not lie entirely with the state, although the state may chose to regulate the use of surveillance. Employers sometimes monitor their employees, either to prevent theft or whistle-blowing or to ensure that they are working to their maximum ability. Retailers, as noted above, monitor customer spending habits to improve efficiency and sales. Parents monitor sleeping infants so as to respond should the child wake in the night. Private investigators might engage in surveillance to establish infidelity, while Peeping Toms might do so for kicks. While it might be felt that the investigator is justified and the Peeping Tom is not, what of the case when the private investigator is attempting to establish infidelity and simultaneously enjoying his work a little too much?
In each case the ethical authority to carry out surveillance is intimately linked to the justifying cause of that surveillance. Hence an individual is justified in carrying out surveillance of his property if it is to secure the property from theft, but not if it is to spy on his tenants. Parents are justified (indeed, often expected) to monitor their infant children as they sleep, but whether they are also justified in monitoring the babysitter watching over their children is far more controversial. Groups of people are justified in watching their street, particularly if it has been subject to a recent spate of theft, through Neighbourhood Watch schemes, but not in intimidating an unpopular neighbour through persistent overt surveillance. This is not to suggest that intention alone can justify surveillance. A landlord might wish to secure his property by placing a camera in the bathroom (lest a burglar enter through the window). While his intention might not be to spy on his tenants the effect will be precisely that. Similarly, baby monitors left in areas where they are likely to record intimate phone conversations of a babysitter are still an invasion of the babysitter’s privacy, irrespective of the parents’ intentions.
Necessity is often cited as an important condition for justified surveillance. Article 8 of the European Union Convention on Human Rights, for example, states that “there shall be no interference by a public authority with the exercise of this right [to privacy] except such as is in accordance with the law and is necessary in a democratic society in the interests of national security, public safety or the economic well-being of the country, for the prevention of disorder or crime, for the protection of health or morals, or for the protection of the rights and freedoms of others” (Council of Europe 1950). We shall discuss proportionality and discrimination below. Here we shall focus on what is meant by necessity in the context of surveillance.
When is surveillance necessary, though? Should surveillance, like war, be a matter of last resort? If so, when is that moment of last resort reached?
The concept of necessity can limit surveillance from being undertaken arbitrarily or prematurely. An authority may not monitor anyone at any time. Surveillance must rather be required by the circumstances of the case. However, this is simply to replace “necessary” with “required” and so does not help. We are still left with the question as to when surveillance is required by the circumstances of the case.
John Lango (Lango 2006) has suggested two criteria for necessity: The feasibility standard and the awfulness standard. The first occurs when there is sufficient evidence to suggest that there is no feasible alternative, the second when the alternatives are worse than the proposed course of action. When one of these criteria is met the action may be deemed necessary. Given the harms of surveillance, it should therefore be avoided if there are less harmful alternatives. However, surveillance becomes necessary when either there is no alternative, or when the alternatives such as physical intrusion or arrest are more harmful than the surveillance itself.
How surveillance is carried out is a further consideration which should be taken into account. Is the surveillance proportionate to its aim and is it discriminate in whom it targets? Proportionality of action is a familiar concept in legal and military ethics, but it has application to surveillance as well. We might return to the images of Big Brother or the Panopticon to picture scenarios in which surveillance is total and unending, and the horror which this often arouses in our minds. In these cases it is hard to imagine the occasioning justification which would see such surveillance as a proportionate response. Even major wars do not justify the perpetual monitoring of all citizens around the clock.
More recent, non-fictional cases exist in the surveillance of school children through using fingerprinting technology either to grant entrance and egress from the school, or to pay for school lunches. While the former case might be seen as providing protection to the children from those who should not be in the school, the latter seems highly invasive and an extreme manner to respond to playground bullies stealing lunch money or parents’ desire to know what food their children are eating. Similar questions have been raised about the full-body screening of airline passengers which was introduced in 2009 in the US and the UK, leading to monochrome “nude” images of all those who went through the scanners. Irrespective of health concerns associated with the scanners, they were seen by many to be extremely invasive of privacy without offering a concomitant level of security to those flying on the airline.
If proportionality questions the depth, or intrusiveness of surveillance, discrimination considers its breadth. It asks how many people are likely to be monitored as a result of the particular form of surveillance. Some aspects of surveillance, such as wire tapping, are highly discriminating and target only those using the particular phone under observation. Others, such as CCTV in public places, are broadly indiscriminate and collect information about a great number of people, only some of which will be of interest to the surveillant. We may ask if there is an onus on the surveillant to be as discriminating as possible and only collect information or invade the privacy of as few people as absolutely necessary, given the confines of what is reasonably possible.
A related question is whether any form of surveillance should be absolutely prohibited. Possible candidates for impermissible surveillance would be that of public toilets or private bedrooms. However even here it would appear as if there are cases when these might become of critical importance to justifying causes, such as state security. This might occur if a civil servant with access to state secrets is believed to be involved in a sexual liaison with a member of a foreign intelligence agency. Less exotically, an organised crime syndicate might use a public toilet as a dead letter drop for passing drugs, guns or money. In each of these cases it might be felt that the perhaps obvious places for banning surveillance could in fact become legitimate contexts. In these cases, however, it would be important to protect the innocent as much as possible by limiting the intrusion. Film which is not useful as evidence should be promptly deleted; the monitoring of toilets should be carried out by a member of the same sex; and if possible software should be used which grants anonymity to all captured on film by default and can only reveal individual details upon request.
Much of the discussion surrounding the ethics of surveillance concerns threats to individual or group privacy, and the balance of power between the individual and the state or the individual’s employers. There is a further potential harm of surveillance in the form of social sorting (Lyon 2002). The purpose of surveillance, it is argued, is to sort people into categories for ends which are either good or ill. The danger, however, is that social stereotypes are carried over into these categories and may even be enshrined and institutionalized in them. As a result particular forms of surveillance might serve to have real impact on people’s life chances owing to such institutionalized prejudice. For example, a recent study found that CCTV operators were disproportionately monitoring the young, the male and ethnic minorities “for no obvious reason” (Norris & Armstrong 1999). That is, in the absence of suspicious behaviour they were choosing to focus their attention on these categories of people. The result is that anyone falling into these categories is more likely to be caught if doing something wrong than someone else, thus perpetuating the stereotype. Furthermore, as these groups were being watched more frequently than others, they were more likely to be seen as doing something suspicious. This in turn could lead to disproportionate response rates by security forces on the ground, contributing to a sense of alienation and rejection by society.
Function creep (Winner 1977) involves extending the use of a technology from the cause for which it was initially intended to a different cause. This is readily seen in the use of identity cards in the UK, introduced in the 1939 National Registration Act for the purposes of security, national service and rationing. By 1950 the same cards were being used by 39 government agencies for reasons as diverse as collecting parcels from the post office to routine police enquiries. While any or even all of these were arguably justified, few could be justified under the terms of the initial Act. It was a combination of protest and the eventual recognition of this extension of use which led to the abolition of the Act that same year.
It is not just an extension of surveillance technology which can count as function creep but also an extension of the information retrieved by that technology. CCTV may be installed in a public transport hub in order to better ease traffic flows and predict suicides in order to facilitate timely intervention. In the event of a terrorist atrocity occurring in that hub, though, the same images can be used to identify the terrorist and the means of carrying out the atrocity. In this way function creep can be seen to be complex in its application: Its new use might be fully justifiable. What is problematic is the application of the technology in a new area in one instance leading to its regular and repeated use in that area, especially when this extension has not been subject to ethical scrutiny.
Surveillance typically puts a distance between the surveillant and the person or group surveilled. This can be of benefit to both as it removes the surveillant from the immediacy of the situation and may provide her with time and space to deliberate before reacting to a situation. It might also mean that she does not feel personally threatened in a situation and so react more calmly than would otherwise be the case. However it also simplifies everyday levels of human interaction such as negotiation, discretion, and the use of subtlety: From the surveillant’s perspective someone is either a target or not, and the surveilled subject is not given a platform to respond. This is a concern which is exacerbated by the automation of surveillance and threat detection as the software operating the surveillance can only see people in these terms. There is a further concern that the distance between operator and subject means that the two might never meet. Yet without personal confrontation an operator with social prejudices may never be challenged in her views. She might never meet a person from an ethnic minority (or not one from the minority of which she is suspicious) and so fail to be challenged in her view that all members of that social group are, by virtue of their membership, inherently worthy of suspicion.
International law states that people have certain human rights, such as the right to free speech, the right to association and the right to protest (United Nations 1948). Suspicion as to a state’s motives, however, may lead to cynicism as to how the state will employ its surveillance technology in self-protection. Even if there is no evidence of wrong-doing the state may nonetheless choose to keep records on those who publicly confess to a certain belief, or who choose to associate with those whom the state believes pose a threat. These records may then be used against citizens at a later date by the state, or by a future iteration of the state if the individuals running the executive change. The knowledge of the accumulation and possession of these records by the state may disincline some citizens from engaging in these legitimate activities, preferring to keep their heads down and avoid notice by the state. These so-called “chilling effects” are at odds with human rights and democratic practice and can lead to behavioural uniformity and a stifling of creativity. In certain dictatorial regimes this may be seen as advantageous. Again one can return to Orwell’s 1984 for a dystopian vision of chilling effects (see also Funder 2004).
Throughout this article there has been a recurring theme of power. Through the act of surveillance the surveillant gains power over the surveilled, either through the gathering of information regarding that person which they would rather keep secret (or, at least, keep control over its distribution), or through distancing the person and treating them as acceptable or unacceptable for whatever is the purpose of that surveillance. The balance of power between individuals, or between individuals and groups such as employers or the state, is therefore an important consideration in assessing what it is that is wrong or dangerous about many forms of surveillance.
If we return to the parental monitoring of infants, the context is one of the empowered over the powerless and the cause of the monitoring is paternal care. As noted, this is often seen as a duty of the parent and so one which is justified. As children grow and become more independent, however, they require less care and gain an increasingly strong claim to their own privacy. This is true of surveillance in general as it transfers power from the surveilled to the surveillant. When consent is given then this is more, although possibly not always, justifiable. In the absence of consent, however, this disempowerment of the individual is highly problematic, threatening their dignity and ultimately their responsibility for their own lives.
University of Leeds
Last updated: August 9, 2011 | Originally published: