“Symposium” is the Greek term for a drinking-party. The symposium must be distinguished from the deipnon; for though drinking almost always followed a dinner-party, yet the former was regarded as entirely distinct from the latter, was regulated by different customs, and frequently received the addition of many guests who were not present at the dinner. For the Greeks did not usually drink at their dinner, and it was not until the conclusion of the meal that wine was introduced. Symposia were very frequent at Athens. Their enjoyment was heightened by agreeable conversation, by the introduction of music and dancing, and by games and amusements of various kinds; sometimes, too, philosophical subjects were discussed at them. The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon give us a lively idea of such entertainments at Athens. The name itself shows that the enjoyment of drinking was the main object of the symposia: wine from the juice of the grape (oinos ampelinos) was the only drink partaken of by the Greeks, with the exception of water. The wine was almost invariably mixed with water, and to drink it unmixed (akraton) was considered a characteristic of barbarians. The mixture was made in a large vessel called the crater, from which it was conveyed into the drinking-cups. The guests at a symposium reclined on couches, and were crowned with garlands of flowers.
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Last updated: October 27, 2004 | Originally published: October/27/2004
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