“Synderesis” is a technical term from scholastic philosophy, signifying the innate principle in the moral consciousness of every person which directs the agent to good and restrains him from evil. It is first found in a singe passage of St. Jerome (d. 420) in his explanation of the four living creatures in Ezekiel’s vision. Jerome explains that most commentators hold that the human, the lion, and the ox of the vision represent the rational, the irascible, and the appetitive (or concupiscent) parts of the soul, according to Plato’s division, while the fourth figure, that of the eagle, represents a fourth part of the soul, above and outside these three:
This the Greeks call synderesis, which spark of conscience was not extinguished from the breast of Adam when he was driven from Paradise. Through it, when overcome by pleasures or by anger, or even as sometimes deceived by a similitude of reason, we feel that we sin; … and this in the scriptures is sometimes called spirit…. And yet we perceive that the conscience (conscientia) is itself also thrown aside and driven from its place by some who have no shame or modesty in their faults.
In this passage no distinction seems to be drawn between synderesis and conscientia. It has even been maintained that the former word is a copyist’s error for synderesis, the usual Greek equivalent for “conscientia”.
The use of synderesis as distinct from conscientia among the scholastics, and to a slight extent among early Protestant moralists, is founded on its description by Jerome as scintilla conscientiae – the spark – from which the light of conscience arises. Thus Jeremy Taylor calls it “the spark or fire put into the heart of humans,” while synderesis, which is specifically called conscience of the deed done, is the “bringing fuel to this fire (Ductor Dubitantium 1:1:1) As distinguished from synderesis, conscientia is applied by these writers to the particular attitude of a person to good or evil action, and may accordingly be an unsafe guide. Synderesis is thus a faculty or habit (it was disputed which) both of judging and of willing the right, in agreeement with “original righteousness” and persisting in the separate powers of the soul in spite of the corruption of human nature brought about by the Fall. In the earlier descriptions it is spoken of as volitional as well as intellectual. According to Aquinas, however, it is distinctly practical reason – certain principles belonging to the practical side of reason which point out the right direction for action, just as the theoretical axioms of the understanding do for thinking. Both synderesis and conscientia are placed among the intellectual powers. A different view is given by Bonaventura, who makes the whole distinction between conscientia and synderesis rest upon the distinction between judgment and will. God (he says) has implanted a double rule of right in human nature: one for judging rightly, and this is the moral strength of conscience; another for right volition, and this is the moral strength of synderesis, whose function is to dissuade from evil and stimulate to good, and which may therefore be described as the original moral tendency of the disposition.
This, however, does not seem to be either the best or the most prevalent view of scholasticism regarding synderesis. The question is fully discussed by Duns Scotus, who decided against Bonaventura that both synderesis and conscience belong to practial reason, the former giving the first principles or major premises of its practical syllogisms, the latter corresponding to their conclusions (In Sent. Reportationes Bk 2:39, Q1-2). Jeremy Taylor also follows the Thomistic use and makes synderesis “the general repository of moral principles or measures.” This is the “rule of conscience,” while conscience itself is “a conjunction of the universal practical law with the particular moral action.” It applies the rule to the particular case, and is thus both witness and judge of moral actions. It may be noted that the term “conscience,” when used (as by Kant) as equivalent to practical reason regarded as infallible, corresponds to the medieval synderesis, and not to the medieval conscientia.
The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.
Last updated: October 27, 2004 | Originally published: