Like many domain-specific subfields of philosophy, such as philosophy of physics or philosophy of biology, philosophy of technology is a comparatively young field of investigation. It is generally thought to have emerged as a recognizable philosophical specialization in the second half of the 19th century, its origins often being located with the publication of the Ernst Kapp’s book, Grundlinien einer Philosophie der Technik (Kapp, 1877). Philosophy of technology continues to be a field in the making and as such is characterized by the coexistence of a number of different approaches to (or, perhaps, styles of) doing philosophy. This highlights a problem for anyone aiming to give a brief but concise overview of the field because “philosophy of technology” does not name a clearly delimited academic domain of investigation that is characterized by a general agreement among investigators on what are the central topics, questions and aims, and who are the principal authors and positions. Instead, “philosophy of technology” denotes a considerable variety of philosophical endeavors that all in some way reflect on technology.
There is, then, an ongoing discussion among philosophers, scholars in science and technology studies, as well as engineers about what philosophy of technology is, what it is not, and what it could and should be. These questions will form the background against which the present article presents the field. Section 1 begins by sketching a brief history of philosophical reflection on technology from Greek Antiquity to the rise of contemporary philosophy of technology in the mid-19th to mid-20th century. This is followed by a discussion of the present state of affairs in the field (Section 2). In Section 3, the main approaches to philosophy of technology and the principal kinds of questions which philosophers of technology address are mapped out. Section 4 concludes by presenting two examples of current central discussions in the field.
The origin of philosophy of technology can be placed in the second half of the 19th century. But this does not mean that philosophers before the mid-19th century did not address questions that would today be thought of as belonging in the domain of philosophy of technology. This section will give the history of thinking about technology – focusing on a few key figures, namely Plato, Aristotle, Francis Bacon and Martin Heidegger.
Philosophers in Greek antiquity already addressed questions related to the making of things. The terms “technique” and “technology” have their roots in the ancient Greek notion of “techne” (art, or craft-knowledge), that is, the body of knowledge associated with a particular practice of making (cf. Parry, 2008). Originally the term referred to a carpenter’s craft-knowledge about how to make objects from wood (Fischer, 2004: 11; Zoglauer, 2002: 11), but later it was extended to include all sorts of craftsmanship, such as the ship’s captain’s techne of piloting a ship, the musician’s techne of playing a particular kind of instrument, the farmer’s techne of working the land, the statesman’s techne of governing a state or polis, or the physician’s techne of healing patients (Nye, 2006: 7; Parry, 2008).
In classical Greek philosophy, reflection on the art of making involved both reflection on human action and metaphysical speculation about what the world was like. In the Timaeus, for example, Plato unfolded a cosmology in which the natural world was understood as having been made by a divine Demiurge, a creator who made the various things in the world by giving form to formless matter in accordance with the eternal Ideas. In this picture, the Demiurge’s work is similar to that of a craftsman who makes artifacts in accordance with design plans. (Indeed, the Greek word “Demiourgos” originally meant “public worker” in the sense of a skilled craftsman.) Conversely, according to Plato (Laws, Book X) what craftsmen do when making artifacts is to imitate nature’s craftsmanship – a view that was widely endorsed in ancient Greek philosophy and continued to play an important role in later stages of thinking about technology. On Plato’s view, then, natural objects and man-made objects come into being in similar ways, both being made by an agent according to pre-determined plans.
In Aristotle’s works this connection between human action and the state of affairs in the world is also found. For Aristotle, however, this connection did not consist in a metaphysical similarity in the ways in which natural and man-made objects come into being. Instead of drawing a metaphysical similarity between the two domains of objects, Aristotle pointed to a fundamental metaphysical difference between them while at the same time making epistemological connections between on the one hand different modes of knowing and on the other hand different domains of the world about which knowledge can be achieved. In the Physics (Book II, Chapter 1), Aristotle made a fundamental distinction between the domains of physis (the domain of natural things) and poiesis (the domain of non-natural things). The fundamental distinction between the two domains consisted in the kinds of principles of existence that were underlying the entities that existed in the two domains. The natural realm for Aristotle consisted of things that have the principles by which they come into being, remain in existence and “move” (in the senses of movement in space, of performing actions and of change) within themselves. A plant, for instance, comes into being and remains in existence by means of growth, metabolism and photosynthesis, processes that operate by themselves without the interference of an external agent. The realm of poiesis, in contrast, encompasses things of which the principles of existence and movement are external to them and can be attributed to an external agent – a wooden bed, for example, exists as a consequence of a carpenter’s action of making it and an owner’s action of maintaining it.
Here it needs to be kept in mind that on Aristotle’s worldview every entity by its nature was inclined to strive toward its proper place in the world. For example, unsupported material objects move downward, because that is the natural location for material objects. The movement of a falling stone could thus be interpreted as a consequence of the stone’s internal principles of existence, rather than as a result of the operation of a gravitational force external to the stone. On Aristotle’s worldview, contrary to our present-day worldview, it thus made perfect sense to think of all natural objects as being subject to their own internal principles of existence and in this respect being fundamentally distinct from artifacts that are subject to externally operating principles of existence (to be found in the agents that make an maintain them).
In the Nicomachean Ethics (Book VI, Chapters 3-7), Aristotle distinguished between five modes of knowing, or of achieving truth, that human beings are capable of. He began with two distinctions that apply to the human soul. First, the human soul possesses a rational part and a part that does not operate rationally. The non-rational part is shared with other animals (it encompasses the appetites, instincts, etc.), whereas the rational part is what makes us human – it is what makes man the animal rationale. The rational part of the soul in turn can be subdivided further into a scientific part and a deductive or ratiocinative part. The scientific part can achieve knowledge of those entities of which the principles of existence could not have been different from what they are; these are the entities in the natural domain of which the principles of existence are internal to them and thus could not have been different. The deductive or ratiocinative part can achieve knowledge of those entities of which the principles of existence could have been different; the external principles of existence of artifacts and other things in the non-natural domain could have been different in that, for example, the silver smith who made a particular silver bowl could have had a different purpose in mind than the purpose for which the bowl was actually made. The five modes of knowledge that humans are capable of – often denoted as virtues of thought – are faculties of the rational part of the soul and in part map onto the scientific part / deductive part dichotomy. They are what we today would call science or scientific knowledge (episteme), art or craft knowledge (techne), prudence or practical knowledge (phronesis), intellect or intuitive apprehension (nous) and wisdom (sophia). While episteme applies to the natural domain, techne and phronesis apply to the non-natural domain, phronesis applying to actions in general life and techne to the crafts. Nous and sophia, however, do not map onto these two domains: while nous yields knowledge of unproven (and not provable) first principles and hence forms the foundation of all knowledge, sophia is a state of perfection that can be reached with respect to knowledge in general, including techne.
Both Plato and Aristotle thus distinguished between techne and episteme as pertaining to different domains of the world, but also drew connections between the two. The reconstruction of the actual views of Plato and Aristotle, however, remains a matter of interpretation (see Parry, 2008). For example, while many authors interpret Aristotle as endorsing the widespread view of technology as consisting in the imitation of nature (for example, Zoglauer, 2002: 12), Schummer (2001) recently argued that for Aristotle this was not a characterization of technology or an explication of the nature of technology, but merely a description of how technological activities often (but not necessarily) take place. And indeed, it seems that in Aristotle’s account of the making of things the idea of man imitating nature is much less central than it is for Plato, when he draws a metaphysical similarity between the Demiurge’s work and the work of craftsmen.
In the Middle Ages, the ancient dichotomy between the natural and artificial realms and the conception of craftsmanship as the imitation of nature continued to play a central role in understanding the world. On the one hand, the conception of craftsmanship as the imitation of nature became thought of as applying not only to what we would now call “technology” (that is, the mechanical arts), but also to art. Both were thought of as the same sort of endeavor. On the other hand, however, some authors began to consider craftsmanship as being more than merely the imitation of nature’s works, holding that in their craftsmanship humans were also capable of improving upon nature’s designs. This conception of technology led to an elevated appreciation of technical craftsmanship which, as the mere imitation of nature, used to be thought of as inferior to the higher arts in the Scholastic canon that was taught at medieval colleges. The philosopher and theologian Hugh of St. Victor (1096-1141), for example, in his Didascalicon compared the seven mechanical arts (weaving, instrument and armament making, nautical art and commerce, hunting, agriculture, healing, dramatic art) with the seven liberal arts (the trivium of grammar, rhetoric, and dialectic logic, and the quadrivium of astronomy, geometry, arithmetic, and music) and incorporated the mechanical arts together with the liberal arts into the corpus of knowledge that was to be taught (Whitney, 1990: 82ff.; Zoglauer, 2002: 13-16).
While the Middle Ages thus can be characterized by an elevated appreciation of the mechanical arts, with the transition into the Renaissance thinking about technology gained new momentum due to the many technical advances that were being made. A key figure at the end of the Renaissance is Francis Bacon (1561-1626), who was both an influential natural philosopher and an important English statesman (among other things, Bacon held the offices of Lord Keeper of the Great Seal and later Lord Chancellor). In his Novum Organum (1620), Bacon proposed a new, experiment-based method for the investigation of nature and emphasized the intrinsic connectedness of the investigation of nature and the construction of technical “works”. In his New Atlantis (written in 1623 and published posthumously in 1627), he presented a vision of a society in which natural philosophy and technology occupied a central position. In this context it should be noted that before the advent of science in its modern form the investigation of nature was conceived of as a philosophical project, that is, natural philosophy. Accordingly, Bacon did not distinguish between science and technology, as we do today, but saw technology as an integral part of natural philosophy and treated the carrying out of experiments and the construction of technological “works” on an equal footing. On his view, technical “works” were of the utmost practical importance for the improvement of the living conditions of people, but even more so as indications of the truth or falsity of our theories about the fundamental principles and causes in nature (see Novum Organum, Book I, aphorism 124).
New Atlantis is the fictional report of a traveler who arrives at an as yet unknown island state called Bensalem and informs the reader about the structure of its society. Rather than constituting a utopian vision of an ideal society, Bensalem’s society was modeled on the English society of Bacons” own times that had become increasingly industrialized and in which the need for technical innovations, new instruments and devices to help with the production of goods and the improvement of human life was clearly felt (compare Kogan-Bernstein, 1959). The utopian vision in New Atlantis only pertained to the organization of the practice of natural philosophy. Accordingly, Bacon spent much of New Atlantis describing the most important institution in the society of Bensalem, Salomon’s House, an institution devoted entirely to inquiry and technological innovation.
Bacon provided a long list of the various areas of knowledge, techniques, instruments and devices that Salomon’s House possesses, as well as descriptions of the way in which the House is organized and the different functions that its members fulfill. In his account of Salomon’s house Bacon’s unbridled optimism about technology can be seen: Salomon’s House appears to be in the possession of every possible (and impossible) technology that one could think of, including several that were only realized much later (such as flying machines and submarines) and some that are impossible to realize. (Salomon’s House even possesses several working perpetuum mobile machines, that is, machines that once they have been started up will remain in motion forever and are able to do work without consuming energy. Contemporary thermodynamics shows that such machines are impossible.) Repeatedly it is stated that Salomon’s House works for the benefit of Bensalem’s people and society: the members of the House, for example, regularly travel through the county to inform the people about new inventions, to warn them about upcoming catastrophic events, such as earthquakes and droughts the occurrence of which Salomon’s House is been able to forecast, and to advise them about how they could prepare themselves for these events.
While Bacon is often associated with the slogan “knowledge is power”, contrary to how the slogan is often understood today (where “power” is often taken to mean political power or power within society) what is meant is that knowledge of natural causes gives us power over nature that can be used for the benefit of mankind. This can be seen, for instance, from the way Bacon described the reasons of the Bensalemians for founding Salomon’s House: “The end of our foundation is the knowledge of causes, and secret motions of things; and the enlarging of the bounds of human empire to the effecting of all things possible.” Here, inquiry into “the knowledge of causes, and secret motions of things” and technological innovation by producing what is possible (“enlarging of the bounds of human empire to the effecting of all things possible”) are explicitly mentioned as the two principal goals of the most important institution in society. (It should also be noted that Bacon himself never formulated the slogan “knowledge is power”. Rather, in the section “Plan of the Work” in the Instauratio Magna he speaks of the twin aims of knowledge – Bacon’s term is ‘scientia” – and power – “Potentia” – as coinciding in the devising of new works because one can only have power over nature when one knows and follows nature’s causes. The connection between knowledge and power here is the same as in the description of the purpose of Salomon’s House.)
The improvement of life by means of natural philosophy and technology is a theme which pervades much of Bacons’ works, including the New Atlantis and his unfinished opus magnum, the Instauratio Magna. Bacon saw the Instauratio Magna, the “Great Renewal of the Sciences”, as the culmination of his life work on natural philosophy. It was to encompass six parts, presenting an overview and critical assessment of the knowledge about nature available at the time, a presentation of Bacon’s new method for investigating nature, a mapping of the blank spots in the corpus of available knowledge and numerous examples of how natural philosophy would progress when using Bacon’s new method. It was clear to Bacon that his work could only be the beginning of a new natural philosophy, to be pursued by later generations of natural philosophers, and that he would himself not be able to finish the project he started in the Instauratio. In fact, even the writing of the Instauratio proved a much too ambitious project for one man: Bacon only finished the second part, the Novum Organum, in which he presented his new method for the investigation of nature.
With respect to this new method, Bacon argued against the medieval tradition of building on the Aristotelian/Scholastic canon and other written sources as the sources of knowledge, proposing a view of knowledge gained from systematic empirical discovery instead. For Bacon, craftsmanship and technology played a threefold role in this context. First, knowledge was to be gained by means of observation and experimentation, so inquiry in natural philosophy heavily relied on the construction of instruments, devices and other works of craftsmanship to make empirical investigations possible. Second, as discussed above, natural philosophy should not be limited to the study of nature for knowledge’s sake but should also always inquire how newly gained knowledge could be used in practice to extend man’s power over nature to the benefit of society and its inhabitants (Kogan-Bernstein, 1959; Fischer, 1996: 284-287). And third, technological “works” served as the empirical foundations of knowledge about nature in that a successful “work” could count as an indication of the truth of the involved theories about the fundamental principles and causes in nature (see above).
While in many locations in his writings Bacon suggests that the “pure” investigation of nature and the construction of new “works” are of equal importance, he did prioritize technology. From the description that Bacon gives of how Salomon’s House is organized, for example, it is clear that the members of Salomon’s House also practice “pure” investigation of nature without much regard for its practical use. The “pure” investigation of nature seems to have its own place within the House and to be able to operate autonomously. Still, as a whole, the institution of Salomon’s House is decidedly practice-oriented, such that the relative freedom of inquiry in the end manifests itself within the confines of an environment in which practical applicability is what counts. Bacon draws the same picture in the Instauratio Magna, where he explicitly acknowledges the value of “pure” investigation while at the same time emphasizing that the true aims of natural philosophy (‘scientiae veros fines” – see towards the end of the Preface of the Instauratio Magna) concern its benefits and usefulness for human life.
Notwithstanding the fact that philosophers have been reflecting on technology-related matters ever since the beginning of Western philosophy, those pre-19th century philosophers who looked at aspects of technology did not do so with the aim of understanding technology as such. Rather, they examined technology in the context of more general philosophical projects aimed at clarifying traditional philosophical issues other than technology (Fischer, 1996: 309). It is probably safe to say that before the mid to late 19th century no philosopher considered himself as being a specialized philosopher of technology, or even as a general philosopher with an explicit concern for understanding the phenomenon of technology as such, and that no full-fledged philosophies of technology had yet been elaborated.
No doubt one reason for this is that before the mid to late 19th century technology had not yet become the tremendously powerful and ubiquitously manifest phenomenon that it would later become. The same holds with respect to science, for that matter: it is only after the investigation of nature stopped being thought of as a branch of philosophy – natural philosophy – and the contemporary notion of science emerged that philosophy of science as a field of investigation could emerge. (Note that the term “scientist”, as the name for a particular profession, was coined in the first half of the 19th century by the polymath and philosopher William Whewell – see Snyder, 2009.) Thus, by the end of the 19th century natural science in its present form had emerged from natural philosophy and technology had manifested itself as a phenomenon distinct from science. Accordingly, “until the twentieth century the phenomenon of technology remained a background phenomenon” (Ihde, 1991: 26) and the philosophy of technology “is primarily a twentieth-century development” (Ihde, 2009: 55).
While one reason for the emergence of the philosophy of technology in the 20th century is the rapid development of technology at the time, according to the German philosopher Martin Heidegger an important additional reason should be pointed out. According to Heidegger, not only did technology in the 20th century develop more rapidly than in previous times and by consequence became a more visible factor in everyday life, but also did the nature of technology itself at the same time undergo a profound change. The argument is found in a famous lecture that Heidegger gave in 1955, titled The Question of Technology (Heidegger, 1962), in which he inquired into the nature of technology. Note that although Heidegger actually talked about “Technik” (and his inquiry was into “das Wesen der Technik”; Heidegger, 1962: 5), the question he addressed is about technology. In German, “Technologie” (technology) is often used to denote modern “high-tech” technologies (such as biotechnology, nanotechnology, etc.), while “Technik” is both used to denote the older mechanical crafts and the modern established fields of engineering. (“Elektrotechnik”, for example, is electrical engineering.) As will be discussed in Section 2, philosophy of technology as an academic field arose in Germany in the form of philosophical reflection on “Technik”, not “Technologie”. While the difference between the two terms remains important in contemporary German philosophy of technology (see Section 4.a below), both “Technologie” and “Technik” are commonly translated as “technology” and what in German is called “Technikphilosophie” in English goes by the name of “philosophy of technology”.
On Heidegger’s view, one aspect of the nature of both older and contemporary technology is that technology is instrumental: technological objects (tools, windmills, machines, etc.) are means by which we can achieve particular ends. However, Heidegger argued, it is often overlooked that technology is more than just the devising of instruments for particular practical purposes. Technology, he argued, is also a way of knowing, a way of uncovering the hidden natures of things. In his often idiosyncratic terminology, he wrote that “Technology is a way of uncovering” (“Technik ist eine Weise des Entbergens”; Heidegger, 1962: 13), where “Entbergen” means “to uncover” in the sense of uncovering a hidden truth. (For example, Heidegger (1962: 11-12) connects his term “Entbergen” with the Greek term “aletheia”, the Latin “veritas” and the German “Wahrheit”.) Heidegger thus adopted a view of the nature of technology close to Aristotle’s position, who conceived of techne as one of five modes of knowing, as well as to Francis Bacon’s view, who considered technical works as indications of the truth or falsity of our theories about the fundamental principles and causes in nature.
The difference between older and contemporary technology, Heidegger went on to argue, consists in how this uncovering of truth takes place. According to Heidegger, older technology consisted in “Hervorbringen” (Heidegger, 1962: 11). Heidegger here plays with the dual meaning of the term: the German “Hervorbringen” means both “to make” (the making or production of things, material objects, sound effects, etc.) and “to bring to the fore”. Thus the German term can be used to characterize both the “making” aspect of technology and its aspect of being a way of knowing. While contemporary technology retains the “making” aspect of older technology, Heidegger argued that as a way of knowing it no longer can be understood as Hervorbringen (Heidegger, 1962: 14). In contrast to older technology, contemporary technology as a way of knowing consists in the challenging (“Herausfordern” in German) of both nature (by man) and man (by technology). The difference is that while older technologies had to submit to the standards set by nature (e.g., the work that an old windmill can do depends on how strongly the wind blows), contemporary technologies can themselves set the standards (for example, in modern river dams a steady supply of energy can be guaranteed by actively regulating the water flow). Contemporary technology can thus be used to challenge nature: “Heidegger understands technology as a particular manner of approaching reality, a dominating and controlling one in which reality can only appear as raw material to be manipulated” (Verbeek, 2005: 10). In addition, on Heidegger’s view contemporary technology challenges man to challenge nature in the sense that we are constantly being challenged to realize some of the hitherto unrealized potential offered by nature – that is, to devise new technologies that force nature in novel ways and in so doing uncover new truths about nature.
Thus, in the 20th century, according to Heidegger, technology as a way of knowing assumed a new nature. Older technology can be thought of as imitating nature, where the process of imitation is inseparably connected to the uncovering of the hidden nature of the natural entities that are being imitated. Contemporary technology, in contrast, places nature in the position of a supplier of resources and in this way places man in an epistemic position with respect to nature that differs from the epistemic relation of imitating nature. When we imitate nature, we examine entities and phenomena that already exist. But products of contemporary technology, such as the Hoover dam or a nuclear power plant, are not like already existing natural objects. On Heidegger’s view, they force nature to deliver energy (or another kind of resource) whenever we ask for it and therefore cannot be understood as objects made by man in a mode of imitating nature – nature, after all, cannot produce things that force herself to deliver resources in ways that man-made things can force her to do this. This means that there is a fundamental divide between older and contemporary technology, making the rise of philosophy of technology in the late 19th century and in the 20th century an event that occurred in parallel to a profound change in the nature of technology itself.
In accordance with the preceding historical sketch, the history of philosophy of technology – as the history of philosophical thinking about issues concerned with the making of things, the use of techne, the challenging of nature and so forth – can be (very) roughly divided into three major periods.
The first period runs from Greek antiquity through the Middle Ages. In this period techne was conceived of as one among several kinds of human knowledge, namely the craft-knowledge that features in the domain of man-made objects and phenomena. Accordingly, philosophical attention for technology was part of the philosophical examination of human knowledge more generally. The second period runs roughly from the Renaissance through the Industrial Revolution and is characterized by an elevated appreciation for technology as an increasingly manifest but not yet all-pervasive phenomenon. Here we see a general interest in technology not only as a domain of knowledge but also as a domain of construction, that is, of the making of artifacts with a view on the improvement of human life (for instance, in Francis Bacon’s vision of natural philosophy). However, there is no particular philosophical interest yet in technology per se other than the issues that earlier philosophers had also considered. The third period is the contemporary period (from the mid 19th century to the present) in which technology had become such a ubiquitous and important factor in human lives and societies that it began to manifest itself as a subject sui generis of philosophical reflection. Of course, this is only a very rough periodization and different ways of periodizing the history of philosophy of technology can be found in the literature – e.g., Wartofsky (1979), Feenberg (2003: 2-3) or Franssen and others (2009: Sec. 1). Moreover, this periodization applies only to Western philosophy. To be sure, there is much to be said about technology and thinking about technology in technologically advanced ancient civilizations in China, Persia, Egypt, etc., but this cannot be done within the confines of the present article. Still, the periodization proposed above is a useful first-order subdivision of the history of thinking about technology as it highlights important changes in how technology was and is understood.
The first monograph on philosophy of technology appeared in Germany in the second half of the 19th century in the form of Ernst Kapp’s book, Grundlinien einer Philosophie der Technik (“Foundations of a Philosophy of Engineering”) (Kapp, 1877). This book is commonly seen as the origin of the field (Rapp, 1981: 4; Ferré, 1988: 10; Fischer, 1996: 309; Zoglauer, 2002: 9; De Vries, 2005: 68; Ropohl, 2009: 13), because the term “philosophy of technology” (or rather, “philosophy of technics”) was first introduced there. Kapp used it to denote the philosophical inquiry into the effects of the use of technology on human society. (Mitcham (1994: 20), however, mentions the Scottish chemical engineer Andrew Ure as a precursor to Kapp in this context. Apparently in 1835 Ure coined the phrase “philosophy of manufactures” in a treatise on philosophical issues concerning technology.) For several decades after the publication of Kapp’s work not much philosophical work focusing on technology appeared in print and the field didn”t really get going until well into the 20th century. Again, the main publications appeared in Germany (for example, Dessauer, 1927; Jaspers, 1931; Diesel, 1939).
It should be noted that if philosophy of technology as an academic field indeed started here, the field’s origins lie outside professionalized philosophy. Jaspers was a philosopher, but neither Kapp nor most of the other early authors on the topic were professional philosophers. Kapp, for example, had earned a doctorate in classical philology and spent much of his life as a schoolteacher of geography and history and as an independent writer and untenured university lecturer (a German “Privatdozent”). Dessauer was an engineer (and an advocate of an unconditionally optimistic view of technology), Ure a chemical engineer and Diesel (son of the inventor of the Diesel engine, Rudolf Diesel) an independent writer.
In his book, Kapp argued that technological artifacts should be thought of as man-made imitations and improvements of human organs (see Brey, 2000; De Vries, 2005). The underlying idea is that human beings have limited capacities: we have limited visual powers, limited muscular strength, limited resources for storing information, etc. These limitations have led human beings to attempt to improve their natural capacities by means of artifacts such as cranes, lenses, etc. On Kapp’s view, such improvements should not so much be thought of as extensions or supplements of natural human organs, but rather as their replacements (Brey, 2000: 62). Because technological artifacts are supposed to serve as replacements of natural organs, they must on Kapp’s view be devised as imitations of these organs – after all, they are intended to perform the same function – or at least as being modeled on natural organs: ‘since the organ whose utility and power is to be increased is the standard, the appropriate form of a tool can only be derived from that organ” (Kapp, quoted and translated by Brey, 2000: 62). This way of understanding technology, which echoes the view of technology as the imitation of nature by men that was already found with Plato and Aristotle, was dominant throughout the Middle Ages and continued to be endorsed later.
The period after World War II saw a sharp increase in the amount of published reflections on technology that, for obvious reasons given the role of technology in both World Wars, often expressed a deeply critical and pessimistic view of the influence of technology on human societies, human values and the human life-world in general. Because of this increase in the amount of reflection on technology after World War II, some authors locate the emergence of the field in that period rather than in the late 19th century (for example Ihde, 1993: 14-15, 32-33; Dusek, 2006: 1-2; Kroes and others, 2008: 1). Ihde (1993: 32) points to an additional reason to locate the beginning of the field in the period following World War II: historians of technology rate World War II as the technologically most innovative period in human history until then, as during that war many new technologies were introduced that continued to drive technological innovation as well as the associated reflection on such innovation for several decades to follow. Thus, from this perspective it was World War II and the following period in which technology reached the level of prominence in the early 21st century and, accordingly, became a focal topic for philosophy. It became “a force too important to overlook”, as Ihde (1993: 32) writes.
A still different picture is obtained if one takes the existence of specialized professional societies, dedicated academic journals, topic-specific textbooks as well as a specific name identifying the field as typical signs that a particular field of investigation has become established as a branch of academia. (Note that in his influential The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, historian and philosopher of science Thomas Kuhns mentions these as signs of the establishment of a new paradigm, albeit not a new field or discipline – see Kuhn, 1970: 19.) By these indications, the process of establishing philosophy of technology as an academic field has only begun in the late 1970s and early 1980s – as Ihde (1993: 45) writes, “from the 1970s on, philosophy of technology began to take its place alongside the other “philosophies of …”” – and continued into the early 21st century.
As Mitcham (1994: 33) remarks, the term “philosophy of technology” was not widely used outside Germany until the 1980s (where the German term is “Technikphilosophie” or “Philosophie der Technik” rather than “philosophy of technology”). In 1976, the Society for the Philosophy of Technology was founded as the first professional society in the field. In the 1980s introductory textbooks on philosophy of technology began to appear. One of the very first (Ferré, 1988) appeared in the famous Prentice Hall Foundations of Philosophy series that included several hallmark introductory texts in philosophy (such as Carl Hempel’s Philosophy of Natural Science, David Hull’s Philosophy of Biological Science, William Frankena’s Ethics and Wesley Salmon’s Logic). In recent years numerous introductory texts have become available, including Ihde (1993), Mitcham (1994), Pitt (2000), Bucciarelli (2003), Fischer (2004), De Vries (2005), Dusek (2006), Irrgang (2008) and Nordmann (2008). Anthologies of classic texts in the field and encyclopedias of philosophy of technology have only very recently begun to appear (e.g., Scharff & Dusek, 2003; Kaplan, 2004; Meijers, 2009; Olsen, Pedersen & Hendricks, 2009; Olsen, Selinger, & Riis, 2009). However, there were few academic journals in the early 21st century dedicated specifically to philosophy of technology and covering the entire range of themes in the field.
”Philosophy of technology” denotes a considerable variety of philosophical endeavors. There is an ongoing discussion among philosophers of technology and scholars in related fields (e.g., science and technology studies, and engineering) on how philosophy of technology should be conceived of. One would expect to find a clear answer to this question in the available introductory texts, along with a general of agreement on the central themes and questions of the field, as well as on who are its most important authors and which the fundamental positions, theories, theses and approaches. In the case of philosophy of technology, however, comparing recent textbooks reveals a striking lack of consensus about what kind of endeavor philosophy of technology is. According to some authors, the sole commonality of the various endeavors called “philosophy of technology” is that they all in some way or other reflect on technology (cf. Rapp, 1981: 19-22; 1989: ix; Ihde, 1993: 97-98; Nordmann, 2008: 10).
For example, Nordmann characterized philosophy of technology as follows: “Not only is it a field of work without a tradition, it is foremost a field without its own guiding questions. In the end, philosophy of technology is the whole of philosophy done over again from the start – only this time with consideration for technology” (2008: 10; Reydon’s translation). Nordmann (2008: 14) added that the job of philosophy of technology is not to deal philosophically with a particular subject domain called “technology” (or “Technik” in German). Rather, its job is to deal with all the traditional questions of philosophy, relating them to technology. Such a characterization of the field, however, seems impracticably broad because it causes the name “philosophy of technology” to lose much of its meaning. On Nordmann’s broad characterization it seems meaningless to talk of “philosophy of technology”, as there is no clearly recognizable subfield of philosophy for the name to refer to. All of philosophy would be philosophy of technology, as long as some attention is paid to technology.
A similar, albeit apparently somewhat stricter, characterization of the field was given by Ferré (1988: ix, 9), who suggested that philosophy of technology is ‘simply philosophy dealing with a special area of interest”, namely technology. According to Ferré, the various “philosophies of” (of science, of biology, of physics, of language, of technology, etc.) should be conceived of as philosophy in the broad sense, with all its traditional questions and methods, but now “turned with a special interest toward discovering how those fundamental questions and methods relate to a particular segment of human concern” (Ferré, 1988: 9). The question arises what this “particular segment of human concern” called “technology” is. But first, the kinds of questions philosophers of technology ask with respect to technology must be explicated.
Philosopher of technology Don Ihde defines philosophy of technology as philosophy that examines the phenomenon of technology per se, rather than merely considering technology in the context of reflections aimed at philosophical issues other than technology. (Note the opposition to Nordmann’s view, mentioned above.) That is, philosophy of technology “must make technology a foreground phenomenon and be able to reflectively analyze it in such a way as to illuminate features of the phenomenon of technology itself” (Ihde, 1993: 38; original emphasis).
However, there are a number of different ways in which one can approach the project of illuminating characteristic features of the phenomenon of technology. While different authors have presented different views of what philosophy of technology is about, there is no generally agreed upon taxonomy of the various approaches to (or traditions in, or styles of doing) philosophy of technology. In this section, a number of approaches that have been distinguished in the recent literature are discussed with the aim of providing an overview of the various kinds of questions that philosophers ask with respect to technology.
In an early review of the state of the field, philosopher of science Marx W. Wartofsky distinguished four main approaches to philosophy of technology (Wartofsky, 1979: 177-178). First, there is the holistic approach that sees technology as one of the phenomena generally found in human societies (on a par with phenomena such as art, war, politics, etc.) and attempts to characterize the nature of this phenomenon. The philosophical question in focus here is: What is technology? Second, Wartofsky distinguished the particularistic approach that addresses specific philosophical questions that arise with respect to particular episodes in the history of technology. Relevant questions are: Why did a particular technology gain or lose prominence in a particular period? Why did the general attitude towards technology change at a particular time? And so forth. Third is the developmental approach that aims at explaining the general process of technological change and as such has a historical focus too. And fourth, there is the social-critical approach that conceives of technology as a social/cultural phenomenon, that is a product of social conventions, ideologies, etc. In this approach, technology is seen as a product of human actions that should be critically assessed (rather than characterized, as in the holistic approach). Besides critical reflection on technology, a central question here is how technology has come to be what it is today and which social factors have been important in shaping it. The four approaches as distinguished by Wartofsky clearly are not mutually exclusive: while different approaches address similar and related questions, the difference between them is a matter of emphasis.
A similar taxonomy of approaches is found with Friedrich Rapp, an early proponent of analytic philosophy of technology (see also below). For Rapp, the principal dichotomy is between holistic and particularistic approaches, that is, approaches that conceive of technology as a single phenomenon the nature of which philosophers should clarify vs. approaches that see “technology” as an umbrella term for a number of distinct historical and social phenomena that are related to one another in complex ways and accordingly should each be examined in relation to the other relevant phenomena (Rapp, 1989: xi-xii). Rapp’s own philosophy of technology stands in the latter line of work. Within this dichotomy, Rapp (1981: 4-19) distinguished four main approaches, each reflecting on a different aspect of technology: on the practice of invention and engineering, on technology as a cultural phenomenon, on the social impact of technology, and on the impact of technology on the physical/biological system of planet Earth. While it is not entirely clear how Rapp conceives of the relation between these four approaches and his holistic/particularistic dichotomy, it seems that holism and particularism can generally be understood as modes of doing philosophy that can be realized within each of the four approaches.
Gernot Böhme (2008: 23-32) also distinguished between four main paradigms of contemporary philosophy of technology: the ontological paradigm, the anthropological paradigm, the historical-philosophical paradigm and the epistemological paradigm. The ontological paradigm, according to Böhme, inquires into the nature of artifacts and other technical entities. It basically consists in a philosophy of technology that parallels philosophy of nature, but focuses on the Aristotelian domain of poiesis instead of the domain of physis (see Section 1.a. above). The anthropological paradigm asks one of the traditional questions of philosophy – What is man? – and approaches this question by way of an examination of technology as a product of human action. The historical-philosophical paradigm examines the various manifestations of technology throughout human history and aims to clarify what characterizes the nature of technology in different periods. In this respect, it is closely related to the anthropological paradigm and individual philosophers can work in both paradigms simultaneously. Böhme (2008: 26), for example, lists Ernst Kapp as a representative of both the anthropological and historical-philosophical paradigms. Finally, the epistemological paradigm inquires into technology as a form of knowledge in the sense in which Aristotle did (See Sec. 1.a. above). Böhme (2008: 23) observed that despite the factual existence of philosophy of technology as an academic field, as yet there is no paradigm that dominates the field.
Carl Mitcham (1994) made a fundamental distinction between two principal subdomains of philosophy of technology, which he called “engineering philosophy of technology” and “humanities philosophy of technology”. Engineering philosophy of technology is the philosophical project aimed at understanding the phenomenon of technology as instantiated in the practices of engineers and others working in technological professions. It analyzes “technology from within, and [is] oriented toward an understanding of the technological way of being-in-the-world” (Mitcham, 1994: 39). As representatives of engineering philosophy of technology Mitcham lists, among others, Ernst Kapp and Friedrich Dessauer. Humanities philosophy of technology, on the other hand, consists of more general philosophical projects in which technology per se is not principal subject of concern. Rather, technology is taken as a case study that might lead to new insights into a variety of philosophical questions by examining how technology affects human life.
The above discussion shows how different philosophers have quite different views of how the field of philosophy of technology is structured and what kinds of questions are in focus in the field. Still, on the basis of the preceding discussion a taxonomy can be constructed of three principal ways of conceiving of philosophy of technology:
(1) philosophy of technology as the systematic clarification of the nature of technology as an element and product of human culture (Wartofsky’s holistic and developmental approaches; Rapp’s cultural approach; Böhme’s ontological, anthropological and historical paradigms; and Mitcham’s engineering approach);
(2) philosophy of technology as the systematic reflection on the consequences of technology for human life (Wartofsky’s particularistic and social/critical approaches; Rapp’s social impact and physical impact approaches; and Mitcham’s humanities approach);
(3) philosophy of technology as the systematic investigation of the practices of engineering, invention, designing and making of things (Wartofsky’s particularistic approach; Rapp’s invention approach; Böhme’s epistemological paradigm; and Mitcham’s engineering approach).
All three approaches are represented in present-day thinking about technology and are illustrated below.
(1) The systematic clarification of the nature of technology. Perhaps most philosophy of technology has been done – and continues to be done – in the form of reflection on the nature of technology as a cultural phenomenon. As clarifying the nature of things is a traditional philosophical endeavor, many prominent representatives of this approach are philosophers who do not consider themselves philosophers of technology in the first place. Rather, they are general philosophers who look at technology as one among the many products of human culture, such as the German philosophers Karl Jaspers (e.g., his book Die geistige Situation der Zeit; Jaspers, 1931), Oswald Spengler (Der Mensch und die Technik; Spengler, 1931), Ernst Cassirer (e.g., his Symbol, Technik, Sprache; Cassirer, 1985), Martin Heidegger (Heidegger, 1962; discussed above), Jürgen Habermas (for example with his Technik und Wissenschaft als “Ideologie”; Habermas, 1968) and Bernhard Irrgang (2008). The Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset is also often counted among the prominent representatives of this line of work.
(2) Systematic reflection on the consequences of technology for human life. Related to the conception of technology as a human cultural product is the approach to philosophy of technology that reflects on and criticizes the social and environmental impact of technology. As an examination of how technology affects society, this approach lies at the intersection of philosophy and sociology, rather than lying squarely within philosophy itself. Prominent representatives thus include the German philosopher/sociologists of the Frankfurt School (Herbert Marcuse, Theodor W. Adorno and Max Horkheimer), Jürgen Habermas, the French sociologist Jacques Ellul (1954), or the American political theorist Langdon Winner (1977).
A central question in contemporary versions of this approach is whether technology controls us or we are able to control technology (Feenberg, 2003: 6; Dusek, 2006: 84-111; Nye, 2006: Chapter 2). Langdon Winner, for example, thought of technology as an autonomously developing phenomenon fundamentally out of human control. As Dusek (2006: 84) points out, this issue is in fact a constellation of two separate questions: Are the societies that we live in, and we ourselves in our everyday lives, determined by technology? And are we able to control or guide the development of technology and the application of technological inventions, or does technology have a life of its own? As it might be that while our lives are not determined by technology we still are not able to control the development and application of technology, these are separate, albeit intimately related issues. The challenge for philosophy of technology, then, is to assess the effects of technology on our societies and our lives, to explore possibilities for us to exert influence on the current applications and future development of technology, and to devise concepts and institutions that might enable democratic control over the role of technology in our lives and societies.
(3) The systematic investigation of the practices of engineering, invention, designing and making of things. The third principal approach to philosophy of technology examines concrete technological practices, such as invention, design and engineering. Early representatives of this approach include Ernst Kapp (1877), Friedrich Dessauer (1927; 1956) and Eugen Diesel (1939). The practical orientation of this approach, as well as its comparative distance from traditional issues in philosophy, is reflected in the fact that none of these three early philosophers of technology were professional philosophers (see Section 2).
A guiding idea in this approach to philosophy of technology is that the design process constitutes the core of technology (Franssen and others, 2009: Sec. 2.3), such that studying the design process is crucial to any project that attempts to understand technology. Thus, philosophers working in this approach often examine design practices, both in the strict context of engineering and in wider contexts such as architecture and industrial design (for example, Vermaas and others, 2008). In focus are epistemological and methodological questions, such as: What kinds of knowledge do engineers have? (for example, Vincenti, 1990; Pitt, 2000; Bucciarelli, 2003; Auyang, 2009; Houkes, 2009). Is there a kind of knowledge that is specific for engineering? What is the nature of the engineering process and the design process? (for example,, Vermaas and others, 2008). What is design? (for example, Houkes, 2008). Is there a specific design/engineering methodology? How do reasoning and decision processes in engineering function? How do engineers deal with uncertainty, failure and error margins? (for example, Bucciarelli, 2003: Chapter 3). Is there any such thing as a technological explanation? If so, what is the structure of technological explanations? (for example, Pitt, 2000: Chapter 4; Pitt, 2009). What is the relation between science and technology and in what way are design processes similar to and different from investigative processes in natural science? (for example, Bunge, 1966).
This approach to philosophy of technology is closely related to philosophy of science, where also much attention is given to methodology and epistemology. This can be seen from the fact that central questions from philosophy of science parallel some of the aforementioned questions: What is scientific knowledge? Is there a specific scientific method, or perhaps a clearly delimited set of such methods? How does scientific reasoning work? What is the structure of scientific explanations? Etc. However, there still seems to be comparatively little attention for such questions among philosophers of technology. Philosopher of technology Joseph Pitt, for example, observed that notwithstanding the parallel with respect to questions that can be asked about technology “there is a startling lack of symmetry with respect to the kinds of questions that have been asked about science and the kinds of questions that have been asked about technology” (2000: 26; emphasis added). According to Pitt, philosophers of technology have largely ignored epistemological and methodological questions about technology and have instead focused overly on issues related to technology and society. But, Pitt pointed out, social criticism “can come only after we have a deeper understanding of the epistemological dimension of technology (Pitt, 2000: 27) and “policy decisions require prior assessment of the knowledge claims, which require good theories of what knowledge is and how to assess it” (ibid.). Thus, philosophers of technology should orient themselves anew with respect to the questions they ask.
But there are more parallels between the philosophies of technology and science. An important endeavor in philosophy of science that is also seen as central in philosophy of technology is conceptual analysis. In the case of philosophy of technology, this involves both concepts related to technology and engineering in general (concepts such as “technology”, “technics”, “technique”, “machine”, “mechanism”, “artifact”, “artifact kind”, “information”, ‘system”, “efficiency”, “risk”, etc.; see also Wartofsky, 1979: 179) and concepts that are specific for the various engineering disciplines. In addition, in both philosophy of science and philosophy of technology a renewed interest in metaphysical issues can currently be seen. For example, while philosophers of science inquire into the nature of the natural kinds that the sciences study, philosophers of technology are developing a parallel interest into the metaphysics of artifacts and kinds of artifacts (e.g., Houkes & Vermaas, 2004; Margolis & Laurence, 2007; Franssen, 2008). And lastly, philosophers of technology and philosophers of particular special sciences are increasingly beginning to cooperate on questions that are of crucial interest to both fields; a recent example is Krohs & Kroes (2009) on the notion of function in biology and technology.
A difference between the states of affairs in philosophy of science and in philosophy of technology, however, lies in the relative dominance of continental and analytic approaches. While there is some continental philosophy of science (e.g., Gutting, 2005), it constitutes a small minority in the field in comparison to analytic philosophy of science. In contrast, continental-style philosophy of technology is a domain of considerable size, while analytic-style philosophy of technology is small in comparison. Analytic philosophy of technology has existed since the 1960s and only began the process of becoming the dominant form of philosophy of technology in the early 21st century (Franssen and others, 2009: Sec. 1.3.). Kroes and others (2008: 2) even speak of a “recent analytic turn in the philosophy of technology”. Overviews of analytic philosophy of technology can be found in Mitcham (1994: Part 2), Franssen (2009) and Franssen and others (2009: Sec. 2).
After having mapped out three principal ways in which one can conceive of philosophy of technology, two discussions from contemporary philosophy of technology will be presented to illustrate what philosophers of technology do. The first example will demonstrate philosophy of technology as the systematic clarification of the nature of technology. The second example shows philosophy of technology as systematic reflection on the consequences of technology for human life, and is concerned with biotechnology. (Illustrations of philosophy of technology as the systematic investigation of the practices of engineering, invention, designing and making of things will not be presented. Examples of this approach to philosophy of technology can be found in Vermaas and others (2008) or Franssen and others (2009).)
The question, What is technology? or What is the nature of technology?, is both a central question that philosophers of technology aim to answer and a question the answer to which determines the subject matter of philosophy of technology. One can think of philosophy of technology as the philosophical examination of technology, in the same way as the philosophy of science is the philosophical examination of science and the philosophy of biology the philosophical study of a particular subdomain of science. However, in this respect the philosophy of technology is in a similar situation as the philosophy of science finds itself in.
Central questions in the philosophy of science have long been what science is, what characterizes science and what distinguishes science from non-science (the demarcation problem). These questions have recently somewhat moved out of focus, however, due to the lack of acceptable answers. Philosophers of science have not been able to satisfactorily explicate the nature of science (for a recent suggestion, see Hoyningen-Huene, 2008) or to specify any clear-cut criterion by which science could be demarcated from non-science or pseudo-science. As philosopher of science Paul Hoyningen-Huene (2008: 168) wrote: “fact is that at the beginning of the 21st century there is no consensus among philosophers or historians or scientists about the nature of science.”
The nature of technology, however, is even less clear than the nature of science. As philosopher of science Marx Wartofsky put it, ““Technology” is unfortunately too vague a term to define a domain; or else, so broad in its scope that what it does define includes too much. For example, one may talk about technology as including all artifacts, that is, all things made by human beings. Since we “make” language, literature, art, social organizations, beliefs, laws and theories as well as tools and machines, and their products, such an approach covers too much” (Wartofsky, 1979: 176). More clarity on this issue can be achieved by looking at the history of the term (for example, Nye, 2006: Chapter 1; Misa, 2009; Mitcham & Schatzberg, 2009) as well as at recent suggestions to define it.
Jacob Bigelow, an early author on technology, conceived of it as a specific domain of knowledge: technology was “an account [...] of the principles, processes, and nomenclatures of the more conspicuous arts” (Bigelow, 1829, quoted in Misa, 2009: 9; Mitcham & Schatzberg, 2009: 37). In a similar manner, Günter Ropohl (1990: 112; 2009: 31) defined “technology” as the ‘science of technics” (“Wissenschaft von der Technik”, where “Technik” denotes the domain of crafts and other areas of manufacturing, making, etc.). The important aspect of Bigelow’s and Ropohl’s definitions is that “technology” does not denote a domain of human activity (such as making or designing) or a domain of objects (technological innovations, such as solar panels), but a domain of knowledge. In this respect, their usage of the term is continuous with the meaning of the Greek “techne” (Section 1.a).
A review of a number of definitions of “technology” (Li-Hua, 2009) shows that there is not much overlap between the various definitions that can be found in the literature. Many definitions conceive of technology in Bigelow’s and Ropohl’s sense as a particular body of knowledge (thus making the philosophy of technology a branch of epistemology), but do not agree on what kind of knowledge it is supposed to be. On some definitions it is seen as firm-specific knowledge about design and production processes, while others conceive of it as knowledge about natural phenomena and laws of nature that can be used to satisfy human needs and solve human problems (a view which closely resembles Francis Bacon’s).
Philosopher of science Mario Bunge presented a view of the nature of technology along the latter lines (Bunge, 1966). According to Bunge, technology should be understood as constituting a particular subdomain of the sciences, namely “applied science”, as he called it. Note that Bunge’s thesis is not that technology is applied science in the sense of the application of scientific theories, models, etc. for practical purposes. Although a view of technology as being “just the totality of means for applying science” (Scharff, 2009: 160) remains present among the general public, most engineers and philosophers of technology agree that technology cannot be conceived of as the application of science in this sense. Bunge’s view is that technology is the subdomain of science characterized by a particular aim, namely application. According to Bunge, natural science and applied science stand side by side as two distinct modes of doing science: while natural science is scientific investigation aimed at the production of reliable knowledge about the world, technology is scientific investigation aimed at application. Both are full-blown domains of science, in which investigations are carried out and knowledge is produced (knowledge about the world and how it can be applied to concrete problems, respectively). The difference between the two domains lies in the nature of the knowledge that is produced and the aims that are in focus. Bunge’s statement that “technology is applied science” should thus be read as “technology is science for the purpose of application” and not as “technology is the application of science.
Other definitions reflect still different conceptions of technology. In the definition accepted by the United Nations Conference on Trade and Development (UNCTAD), technology not only includes specific knowledge, but also machinery, production systems and skilled human labor force. Li-Hua (2009) follows the UNCTAD definition by proposing a four-element definition of “technology” as encompassing technique (that is, a specific technique for making a particular product), specific knowledge (required for making that product; he calls this technology in the strict sense), the organization of production and the end product itself. Friedrich Rapp, in contrast, defined “technology” even more broadly as a domain of human activity: “in simplest terms, technology is the reshaping of the physical world for human purposes” (Rapp, 1989: xxiii).
Thus, attempts to define “technology” in such a way that this definition would express the nature of technology, or only some of the principal characteristics of technology, have not led to any generally accepted view of what technology is. In this context, historian of science and technology Thomas J. Misa observed that historians of technology have so far resisted defining “technology” in the same way as “no scholarly historian of art would feel the least temptation to define “art”, as if that complex expression of human creativity could be pinned down by a few well-chosen words” (Misa, 2009: 8). The suggestion clearly is that technology is far too complex and too diverse a domain to define or to be able to talk about the nature of technology. Nordmann (2008: 14) went even further by arguing that not only can the term “technology” not be defined, but also it should not be defined. According to Nordmann, we should accept that technology is too diverse a domain to be caught in a compact definition. Accordingly, instead of conceiving of “technology” as the name of a particular fixed collection of phenomena that can be investigated, Nordmann held that “technology” is best understood as what Grunwald & Julliard (2005) called a “reflective concept”. According to the latter authors, “technology” (or rather, “Technik” – see Section 1.c) should simply be taken to mean whatever we mean when we use the term. While this clearly cannot be an adequate definition of the term, it still can serve as a basis for reflections on technology in that it gives us at least some sense of what it is that we are reflection on. Using “technology” in this extremely loose manner allows us to connect reflections on very different issues and phenomena as being about – in the broadest sense – the same thing. In this way, “technology” can serve as the core concept of the field of philosophy of technology.
Philosophy of technology faces the challenge of clarifying the nature of a particular domain of phenomena without being able to determine the boundaries of that domain. Perhaps the best way out of this situation is to approach the question on a case-by-case basis, where the various cases are connected by the fact that they all involve technology in the broadest possible sense of the term. Rather than asking what technology is, and how the nature of technology is to be characterized, it might be better to examine the natures of particular instances of technology and in so doing achieve more clarity about a number of local phenomena. In the end, the results from various case studies might to some extent converge – or they might not.
The question how to define “technology” is not merely an academic issue. Consider the case of biotechnology, the technological domain that features most prominently in systematic reflections on the consequences of technology for human life. When thinking about what the application of biotechnologies might mean for our lives, it is important to define what we mean by “biotechnology” such that the subject matter under consideration is delimited in a way that is useful for the discussion.
On one definition, given in 1984 by the United States Office of Technology Assessment, biotechnology comprises “[a]ny technique using organisms and their components to make products, modify plants and animals to carry desired traits, or develop micro-organisms for specific uses” (Office of Technology Assessment, 1984; Van den Beld, 2009: 1302). On such a conception of biotechnology, however, traditional farming, breeding and production of foodstuffs, as well as modern large-scale agriculture and industrialized food production would all count as biotechnology. The domain of biotechnology would thus encompass an extremely heterogeneous collection of practices and techniques of which many would not be particularly interesting subjects for philosophical or ethical reflection (although all of them affect human life: consider, for example, the enormous effect that the development of traditional farming had with respect to the rise of human societies). Accordingly, many definitions are much narrower and focus on “new” or “modern” biotechnologies, that is, technologies that involve the manipulation of genetic material. These are, after all, the technologies that are widely perceived by the general public as ethically problematic and thus as constituting the proper subject matter of philosophical reflection on biotechnology. Thus, the authors of a 2007 reported on the possible consequences, opportunities and challenges of biotechnology for Europe make a distinction between traditional and modern biotechnology, writing about modern biotechnology that it “can be defined as the use of cellular, molecular and genetic processes in production of goods and services. Its beginnings date back to the early 1970s when recombinant DNA technology was first developed” (quoted in Van den Beld, 2009: 1302).
Such narrow definitions, however, tend to cover too little. As Van den Beld (2009: 1306) pointed out in this context, “There are no definitions that are simply correct or incorrect, only definitions that are more or less pragmatically adequate in view of the aims one pursues.” When it comes to systematic reflection on how the use of technologies affects human life, the question thus is whether there is any particular area of technology that can be meaningfully singled out as constituting “biotechnology”. However, the spectrum of technological applications in the biological domain is simply too diverse.
In overviews of the technologies that are commonly discussed under the name of “biotechnology” a common distinction is between “white biotechnology” (biotechnology in industrial contexts), “green biotechnology” (biotechnology involving plants) and “red biotechnology” (biotechnology involving humans and non-human animals, in particular in medical and biomedical contexts). White biotechnology involves, among other things, the use of enzymes in detergents or the production of cheeses; the use of micro-organisms for the production of medicinal substances; the production of biofuels and bioplastics and so forth. Green biotechnology typically involves genetic technology and is also often called “green genetic technology”. It mainly encompasses the genetic modification of cultivated crops. Philosophical/ethical issues discussed under this label include the risk of outcrossing between genetically modified types of plants and the wild types; the use of genetically modified crops in the production of foodstuffs, either directly or indirectly as food for animals intended for human consumption (for example, soy beans, corn, potatoes and tomatoes); the labeling of foodstuffs produced on the basis of genetically modified organisms; issues related to the patenting of genetically modified crops and so forth.
Not surprisingly, red biotechnology is the most hotly discussed area of biotechnology as red biotechnologies directly involve human beings and non-human animals, both of which are categories that feature prominently throughout ethical discussions. Red biotechnology involves such things as the transplantation of human organs and tissues, and xenotransplantation (the transplantation of non-human animal organs and tissues to humans); the use of cloning techniques for reproductive and therapeutic purposes; the use of embryos for stem cell research; artificial reproduction, in vitro fertilization, the genetic testing of embryos and pre-implantation diagnostics and so forth. In addition, an increasingly discussed area of red biotechnology is constituted by human enhancement technologies. These encompass such diverse technologies as the use of psycho-pharmaceutical substances for the improvement of one’s mental capacities, the genetic modification of human embryos to prevent possible genetic diseases and so forth.
Other areas of biotechnology can include synthetic biology, which involves the creation of synthetic genetic systems, synthetic metabolic systems and attempts at creating living synthetic life forms from scratch. Synthetic biology does not fit into the distinction between white, green and red biotechnology and receives attention from philosophers not only because projects in synthetic biology may raise ethical questions (for example, Douglas & Savulescu, 2012) but also because of questions from epistemology and philosophy of science (for example, O”Malley, 2009; Van den Beld, 2009: 1314-1316).
Corresponding to this diversity of technologies covered by the label of “biotechnology”, philosophical reflection on biotechnology as such and on its possible consequences for human life will not be a very fruitful enterprise as there will not be much to say about biotechnology in general. Instead, philosophical reflection on biotechnology will need to be conducted locally rather than globally, taking the form of close examination of particular technologies in particular contexts. Philosophers concerned with biotechnology reflect on such specific issues as the genetic modification of plants for agricultural purposes, or the use of psycho-pharmaceutical substances for the improvement of the mental capacities of healthy subjects – not biotechnology as such. In the same way as “technology” can be thought of as a “reflective concept” (Grunwald & Julliard, 2005) that brings together a variety of phenomena under a common denominator for the purposes of enabling philosophical work, so “biotechnology” too can be understood as a “reflective concept” that is useful to locate particular considerations within the wide domain of philosophical reflection.
This is, however, not to say that on more general levels nothing can be said about biotechnology. Bioethicist Bernard Rollin, for example, considered genetic engineering in general and addressed the question whether genetic engineering could be considered intrinsically wrong – that is, wrong in any and all contexts and hence independently of the particular context of application that is under consideration (Rollin, 2006: 129-154). According to Rollin, the alleged intrinsic wrongness of genetic engineering constituted one out of three aspects of wrongness that members of the general public often associate with genetic engineering. These three aspects, which Rollin illustrated as three aspects of the Frankenstein myth (see Rollin, 2006: 135), are: the intrinsic wrongness of a particular practice, its possible dangerous consequences and the possibilities of causing harm to sentient beings. While the latter two aspects of wrongness might be avoided by means of appropriate measures, the intrinsic wrongness of a particular practice (in cases where it obtains) is unavoidable. Thus, if it could be argued that genetic engineering is intrinsically wrong – that is, something that we just ought not to do, irrespective of whatever positive or negative consequences are to be expected –, this would constitute a strong argument against large domains of white, green and red biotechnology. On the basis of an assessment of the motivations that people have to judge genetic engineering as being intrinsically wrong, Rollin, however, concluded that such an argument could not be made because in the various cases in which people concluded that genetic engineering was intrinsically wrong the premises of the argument were not well-founded.
But in this case, too, the need for local rather than global analyses can be seen. Assessing the tenability of the value judgment that genetic engineering is intrinsically wrong requires examining concrete arguments and motivations on a local level. This, I want to suggest by way of conclusion, is a general characteristic of the philosophy of technology: the relevant philosophical analyses will have to take place on the more local levels, examining particular technologies in particular contexts, rather than on more global levels, at which large domains of technology such as biotechnology or even the technological domain as a whole are in focus. Philosophy of technology, then, is a matter of piecemeal engineering, in much the same way as William Wimsatt has suggested that philosophy of science should be done (Wimsatt, 2007).
Thomas A.C. Reydon
Leibniz University of Hannover
Last updated: January 29, 2012 | Originally published: