Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Thales of Miletus (c. 620 BCE – c. 546 BCE)

thalesThe ancient Greek philosopher Thales was born in Miletus in Greek Ionia. Aristotle, the major source for Thales’s philosophy and science, identified Thales as the first person to investigate the basic principles, the question of the originating substances of matter and, therefore, as the founder of the school of natural philosophy. Thales was interested in almost everything, investigating almost all areas of knowledge, philosophy, history, science, mathematics, engineering, geography, and politics. He proposed theories to explain many of the events of nature, the primary substance, the support of the earth, and the cause of change. Thales was much involved in the problems of astronomy and provided a number of explanations of cosmological events which traditionally involved supernatural entities. His questioning approach to the understanding of heavenly phenomena was the beginning of Greek astronomy. Thales’ hypotheses were new and bold, and in freeing phenomena from godly intervention, he paved the way towards scientific endeavor. He founded the Milesian school of natural philosophy, developed the scientific method, and initiated the first western enlightenment. A number of anecdotes is closely connected to Thales’ investigations of the cosmos. When considered in association with his hypotheses they take on added meaning and are most enlightening. Thales was highly esteemed in ancient times, and a letter cited by Diogenes Laertius, and purporting to be from Anaximenes to Pythagoras, advised that all our discourse should begin with a reference to Thales (D.L. II.4).

Table of Contents

  1. The Writings of Thales
  2. Possible Sources for Aristotle
  3. Thales says Water is the Primary Principle
  4. Thales and Mythology
  5. Thales’s Primary Principle
  6. New Ideas about the Earth
    1. The Earth Floats on Water
    2. Thales’s Spherical Earth
    3. Earthquake Theory
  7. All Things are Full of God
  8. Thales’s Astronomy
    1. The Eclipse of Thales
    2. Setting the Solstices
    3. Thales’s Discovery of the Seasons
    4. Thales’s Determination of the Diameters of the Sun and the Moon
    5. Ursa Minor
    6. Falling into a Well
  9. Mathematics
    1. The Theorems Attributed to Thales
  10. Crossing the Halys
  11. The Possible Travels of Thales
  12. The Milesian School
  13. The Seven Sages of Ancient Greece
  14. Corner in Oil
  15. The Heritage of Thales
  16. References and Further Reading
  17. Abbreviations

1. The Writings of Thales

Doubts have always existed about whether Thales wrote anything, but a number of ancient reports credit him with writings. Simplicius (Diels, Dox. p. 475) specifically attributed to Thales authorship of the so-called Nautical Star-guide. Diogenes Laertius raised doubts about authenticity, but wrote that ‘according to others [Thales] wrote nothing but two treatises, one On the Solstice and one On the Equinox‘ (D.L. I.23). Lobon of Argus asserted that the writings of Thales amounted to two hundred lines (D.L. I.34), and Plutarch associated Thales with opinions and accounts expressed in verse (Plutarch, De Pyth. or. 18. 402 E). Hesychius, recorded that ‘[Thales] wrote on celestial matters in epic verse, on the equinox, and much else’ (DK, 11A2). Callimachus credited Thales with the sage advice that navigators should navigate by Ursa Minor (D.L. I.23), advice which may have been in writing.

Diogenes mentions a poet, Choerilus, who declared that ‘[Thales] was the first to maintain the immortality of the soul’ (D.L. I.24), and in De Anima, Aristotle’s words ‘from what is recorded about [Thales]‘, indicate that Aristotle was working from a written source. Diogenes recorded that ‘[Thales] seems by some accounts to have been the first to study astronomy, the first to predict eclipses of the sun and to fix the solstices; so Eudemus in his History of Astronomy. It was this which gained for him the admiration of Xenophanes and Herodotus and the notice of Heraclitus and Democritus’ (D.L. I.23). Eudemus who wrote a History of Astronomy, and also on geometry and theology, must be considered as a possible source for the hypotheses of Thales. The information provided by Diogenes is the sort of material which he would have included in his History of Astronomy, and it is possible that the titles On the Solstice, and On the Equinox were available to Eudemus. Xenophanes, Herodotus, Heraclitus and Democritus were familiar with the work of Thales, and may have had a work by Thales available to them.

Proclus recorded that Thales was followed by a great wealth of geometers, most of whom remain as honoured names. They commence with Mamercus, who was a pupil of Thales, and include Hippias of Elis, Pythagoras, Anaxagoras, Eudoxus of Cnidus, Philippus of Mende, Euclid, and Eudemus, a friend of Aristotle, who wrote histories of arithmetic, of astronomy, and of geometry, and many lesser known names. It is possible that writings of Thales were available to some of these men.

Any records which Thales may have kept would have been an advantage in his own work. This is especially true of mathematics, of the dates and times determined when fixing the solstices, the positions of stars, and in financial transactions. It is difficult to believe that Thales would not have written down the information he had gathered in his travels, particularly the geometry he investigated in Egypt and his measuring of the height of the pyramid, his hypotheses about nature, and the cause of change.

Proclus acknowledged Thales as the discoverer of a number of specific theorems (A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid’s Elements 65. 8-9; 250. 16-17). This suggests that Eudemus, Proclus’s source had before him the written records of Thales’s discoveries. How did Thales ‘prove’ his theorems if not in written words and sketches? The works On the Solstice, On the Equinox, which were attributed to Thales (D.L. I.23), and the ‘Nautical Star-guide, to which Simplicius referred, may have been sources for the History of Astronomy of Eudemus (D.L. I.23).

2. Possible Sources for Aristotle

There is no direct evidence that any written material of Thales was available to Plato and Aristotle, but there is a surprisingly long list of early writers who could have known Thales, or had access to his works, and these must be considered as possible sources for Plato, Aristotle, and the philosophers and commentators who followed them. Aristotle’s wording, ‘Thales says’, is assertive wording which suggests a reliable source, perhaps writings of Thales himself. Anaximander and Anaximenes were associates of Thales, and would have been familiar with his ideas. Both produced written work. Anaximander wrote in a poetical style (Theophr. ap. Simpl. Phys. fr. 2), and the writing of Anaximenes was simple and unaffected (D.L. II.3). Other philosophers who were credited with written works, who worked on topics similar to those of Thales, and who may have provided material for later writers, are Heraclitus of Ephesus, Anaxagoras of Clazomenae, Alcmaeon, Hippo of Samos, and Hippias of Elis.

3. Thales says Water is the Primary Principle

Aristotle defined wisdom as knowledge of certain principles and causes (Metaph. 982 a2-3). He commenced his investigation of the wisdom of the philosophers who preceded him, with Thales, the first philosopher, and described Thales as the founder of natural philosophy (Metaph. 983 b21-22). He recorded: ‘Thales says that it is water’. ‘it’ is the nature, the archê, the originating principle. For Thales, this nature was a single material substance, water. Despite the more advanced terminology which Aristotle and Plato had created, Aristotle recorded the doctrines of Thales in terms which were available to Thales in the sixth century BCE, Aristotle made a definite statement, and presented it with confidence. It was only when Aristotle attempted to provide the reasons for the opinions that Thales held, and for the theories that he proposed, that he sometimes displayed caution.

4. Thales and Mythology

Those who believe that Thales inherited his views from Greek or Near-Eastern sources are wrong. Thales was esteemed in his times as an original thinker, and one who broke with tradition and not as one who conveyed existing mythologies. Aristotle unequivocally recorded Thales’s hypothesis on the nature of matter, and proffered a number of conjectures based on observation in favour of Thales’s declaration (Metaph. 983 b20-28). His report provided the testimony that Thales supplanted myth in his explanations of the behaviour of natural phenomena. Thales did not derive his thesis from either Greek or non-Greek mythological traditions.

Thales would have been familiar with Homer’s acknowledgements of divine progenitors but he never attributed organization or control of the cosmos to the gods. Aristotle recognized the similarity between Thales’s doctrine about water and the ancient legend which associates water with Oceanus and Tethys, but he reported that Thales declared water to be the nature of all things. Aristotle pointed to a similarity to traditional beliefs, not a dependency upon them. Aristotle did not call Thales a theologian in the sense in which he designated ‘the old poets’ (Metaph. 1091 b4) and others, such as Pherecydes, as ‘mixed theologians’ who did not use ‘mythical language throughout’ (Metaph. 1091 b9). To Aristotle, the theories of Thales were so obviously different from all that had gone before that they stood out from earlier explanations. Thales’s views were not ancient and primitive. They were new and exciting, and the genesis of scientific conjecture about natural phenomena. It was the view for which Aristotle acknowledged Thales as the founder of natural philosophy.

5. Thales’s Primary Principle

The problem of the nature of matter, and its transformation into the myriad things of which the universe is made, engaged the natural philosophers, commencing with Thales. For his hypothesis to be credible, it was essential that he could explain how all things could come into being from water, and return ultimately to the originating material. It is inherent in Thales’s hypotheses that water had the potentiality to change to the myriad things of which the universe is made, the botanical, physiological, meteorological and geological states. In Timaeus, 49B-C, Plato had Timaeus relate a cyclic process. The passage commences with ‘that which we now call “water” ‘, and describes a theory which was possibly that of Thales. Thales would have recognized evaporation, and have been familiar with traditional views, such as the nutritive capacity of mist and ancient theories about spontaneous generation, phenomena which he may have ‘observed’, just as Aristotle believed he, himself had (Hist. An. 569 b1; Gen. An. 762 a9-763 a34), and about which Diodorus Siculus (I.7.3-5; 1.10.6), Epicurus (ap. Censorinus, D.N. IV.9), Lucretius (De Rerum Natura , V.783-808) and Ovid (Met. I.416-437) wrote.

When Aristotle reported Thales’s pronouncement that the primary principle is water, he made a precise statement: ‘Thales says that it [the nature of things] is water’ (Metaph. 983 b20), but he became tentative when he proposed reasons which might have justified Thales’s decision: ‘[Thales's] supposition may have arisen from observation . . . ‘ (Metaph. 983 b22). It was Aristotle’s opinion that Thales may have observed, ‘that the nurture of all creatures is moist, and that warmth itself is generated from moisture and lives by it; and that from which all things come to be is their first principle’ (Metaph. 983 b23-25). Then, in the lines 983 b26-27, Aristotle’s tone changed towards greater confidence. He declared: ‘Besides this, another reason for the supposition would be that the semina of all things have a moist nature . . . ‘ (Metaph. 983 b26-27). In continuing the criticism of Thales, Aristotle wrote: ‘That from which all things come to be is their first principle’ (Metaph. 983 b25).

Simple metallurgy had been practised long before Thales presented his hypotheses, so Thales knew that heat could return metals to a liquid state. Water exhibits sensible changes more obviously than any of the other so-called elements, and can readily be observed in the three states of liquid, vapour and ice. The understanding that water could generate into earth is basic to Thales’s watery thesis. At Miletus it could readily be observed that water had the capacity to thicken into earth. Miletus stood on the Gulf of Lade through which the Maeander river emptied its waters. Within living memory, older Milesians had witnessed the island of Lade increasing in size within the Gulf, and the river banks encroaching into the river to such an extent that at Priene, across the gulf from Miletus the warehouses had to be rebuilt closer to the water’s edge. The ruins of the once prosperous city-port of Miletus are now ten kilometres distant from the coast and the Island of Lade now forms part of a rich agricultural plain. There would have been opportunity to observe other areas where earth generated from water, for example, the deltas of the Halys, the Ister, about which Hesiod wrote (Theogony, 341), now called the Danube, the Tigris-Euphrates, and almost certainly the Nile. This coming-into-being of land would have provided substantiation of Thales’s doctrine. To Thales water held the potentialities for the nourishment and generation of the entire cosmos. Aëtius attributed to Thales the concept that ‘even the very fire of the sun and the stars, and indeed the cosmos itself is nourished by evaporation of the waters’ (Aëtius, Placita, I.3).

It is not known how Thales explained his watery thesis, but Aristotle believed that the reasons he proposed were probably the persuasive factors in Thales’s considerations. Thales gave no role to the Olympian gods. Belief in generation of earth from water was not proven to be wrong until A.D. 1769 following experiments of Antoine Lavoisier, and spontaneous generation was not disproved until the nineteenth century as a result of the work of Louis Pasteur.

6. New Ideas about the Earth

Thales proposed answers to a number of questions about the earth: the question of its support; its shape; its size; and the cause of earthquakes; the dates of the solstices; the size of the sun and moon.

a. The Earth Floats on Water

In De Caelo Aristotle wrote: ‘This [opinion that the earth rests on water] is the most ancient explanation which has come down to us, and is attributed to Thales of Miletus (Cael. 294 a28-30). He explained his theory by adding the analogy that the earth is at rest because it is of the nature of wood and similar substances which have the capacity to float on water, although not on air (Cael. 294 a30-b1). In Metaphysics (983 b21) Aristotle stated, quite unequivocally: ‘Thales . . . declared that the earth rests on water’. This concept does appear to be at odds with natural expectations, and Aristotle expressed his difficulty with Thales’s theory (Cael. 294 a33-294 b6).

Perhaps Thales anticipated problems with acceptance because he explained that it floated because of a particular quality, a quality of buoyancy similar to that of wood. At the busy city-port of Miletus, Thales had unlimited opportunities to observe the arrival and departure of ships with their heavier-than-water cargoes, and recognized an analogy to floating logs. Thales may have envisaged some quality, common to ships and earth, a quality of ‘floatiness’, or buoyancy. It seems that Thales’s hypothesis was substantiated by sound observation and reasoned considerations. Indeed, Seneca reported that Thales had land supported by water and carried along like a boat (Sen. QNat. III.14). Aristotle’s lines in Metaphysics indicate his understanding that Thales believed that, because water was the permanent entity, the earth floats on water.

Thales may have reasoned that as a modification of water, earth must be the lighter substance, and floating islands do exist. Herodotus (The Histories, II.156) was impressed when he saw Chemmis, a floating island, about thirty-eight kilometres north-east of Naucratis, the Egyptian trading concession which Thales probably visited. Seneca described floating islands in Lydia: ‘There are many light, pumice-like stones of which islands are composed, namely those which float in Lydia’ (Sen. QNat., III.25. 7-10). Pliny described several floating islands, the most relevant being the Reed Islands, in Lydia (HN, II.XCVII), and Pliny (the Younger) (Ep. VIII.XX) described a circular floating island, its buoyancy, and the way it moved. Thales could have visited the near-by Reed Islands. He might have considered such readily visible examples to be models of his theory, and he could well have claimed that the observation that certain islands had the capacity to float substantiated his hypothesis that water has the capacity to support earth.

Again it is understood that Thales did not mention any of the gods who were traditionally associated with the simple bodies; we do not hear of Oceanus or Gaia: we read of water and earth. The idea that Thales would have resurrected the gods is quite contrary to the bold, new, non-mythical theories which Thales proposed.

b. Thales’s Spherical Earth

Modern commentators assume that Thales regarded the earth as flat, thin, and circular, but there is no ancient testimony to support that opinion. On the contrary, Aristotle may have attributed knowledge of the sphericity of the earth to Thales, an opinion which was later reported by Aëtius (Aët. III. 9-10) and followed by Ps.-Plutarch (Epit. III.10). Aristotle wrote that some think it spherical, others flat and shaped like a drum (Arist. Cael. 293 b33-294 a1), and then attributed belief in a flat earth to Anaximenes, Anaxagoras, and Democritus (Arist. Cael. 294 b14-15). If following chronological order, Aristotle’s words, ‘some think it spherical’, referred to the theory of Thales. Aristotle then followed with the theory of Thales’s immediate Milesian successor, Anaximander, and then reported the flat earth view of Anaximenes, the third of the Milesian natural philosophers.

There are several good reasons to accept that Thales envisaged the earth as spherical. Aristotle used these arguments to support his own view (Arist. Cael. 297 b25-298 a8). First is the fact that during a solar eclipse, the shadow caused by the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon is always convex; therefore the earth must be spherical. In other words, if the earth were a flat disk, the shadow cast during an eclipse would be elliptical. Second, Thales, who is acknowledged as an observer of the heavens, would have observed that stars which are visible in a certain locality may not be visible further to the north or south, a phenomena which could be explained within the understanding of a spherical earth. Third, from mere observation the earth has the appearance of being curved. From observation, it appears that the earth is covered by a dome. When observed from an elevated site, the sky seems to surround the earth, like a dome, to meet the apparently curved horizon. If observed over the seasons, the dome would appear to revolve, with many of the heavenly bodies changing their position in varying degrees, but returning annually to a similar place in the heavens. Through his work in astronomy Thales would almost certainly have become familiar with the night sky and the motion of the heavenly bodies. There is evidence that he gave advice to navigate by Ursa Minor, and was so involved in observation of the stars that he fell into a well. As a result of observations made over a long period of time, Thales could have realized that the motions of the fixed stars could not be explained within the idea of the observable hemispherical dome. During the determination of the size of the rising sun, and again while watching its risings and settings during his work on fixing the solstices, Thales may have realized that much natural phenomena could be explained only within the understanding of the earth as a sphere.

From the shore, a ship can be seen to be descending, gradually, below the horizon, with the hull disappearing from view first, to be followed by masts and sails. If one had a companion observing from a higher point, the companion would see the ship for a long period before it disappeared from view.

Aëtius recorded the different opinions of the shape of the earth that were held by Thales, Anaximander and Anaximenes (III.9-10; III.10; and III.10). Cicero attributed to Thales the earliest construction of a solid celestial globe (Rep. I.XIII.22). Thales’s immediate successors proposed theories about the shape of the earth which were quite different from each other, but that is no reason to reject the view that Thales hypothesized a spherical earth. It is not the only occasion on which Anaximander and Anaximenes failed to follow the theories of Thales. That they did not do so is the main argument in favour of accepting that the scientific method commenced in the Milesian School. There is testimony that Thales knew the earth to be spherical, but no evidence to suggest that he proposed any other shape.

c. Earthquake Theory

Thales’s theory about the cause of earthquakes is consistent with his hypothesis that earth floats upon water. It seems that he applied his floating on water simile to the natural phenomena of earthquakes. Aëtius recorded that Thales and Democritus found in water the cause of earthquakes (Aët. III.15), and Seneca attributed to Thales a theory that on the occasions when the earth is said to quake it is fluctuating because of the roughness of oceans (QNat. III.14; 6.6). Although the theory is wrong, Thales’s hypothesis is rational because it provides an explanation which does not invoke hidden entities. It is an advance upon the traditional Homeric view that they resulted from an angry supernatural god, Poseidon, shaking the earth through his rapid striding.

7. All Things are Full of God

The question of whether Thales endowed the gods with a role in his theories is fundamental to his hypotheses. The relevant text from Aristotle reads: ‘Thales, too, to judge from what is recorded of his views, seems to suppose that the soul is in a sense the cause of movement, since he says that a stone [magnet, or lodestone] has a soul because it causes movement to iron’ (De An. 405 a20-22); ‘Some think that the soul pervades the whole universe, whence perhaps came Thales’s view that everything is full of gods’ (De An. 411 a7-8). In reference to the clause in the first passage ‘to judge from what is recorded of his views’, Snell convincingly argued that Aristotle had before him the actual sentence recording Thales’s views about the lodestone (Snell, 1944, 170). In the second passage the ‘some’ to whom Aristotle refers are Leucippus, Democritus, Diogenes of Apollonia, Heraclitus, and Alcmaeon, philosophers who were later than Thales. They adopted and adapted the earlier view of Thales that soul was the cause of motion, permeating and enlivening the entire cosmos. The order in which Aristotle discussed Thales’s hypothesis obscures the issue.

The source for Aristotle’s report that Thales held all things to be full of gods is unknown, but some presume that it was Plato. Thales is not mentioned in the relevant lines in Plato, but there is a popular misconception that they refer to the belief of Thales. This is wrong. Thales had rejected the old gods. In a passage in Apology(26 C) Socrates identified the heavenly bodies as gods, and pointed out that that was the general understanding. In Cratylus(399 D-E) Plato had Socrates explain a relationship between soul as a life-giving force, the capacity to breathe, and the reviving force. In Timaeus 34B) Plato had Timaeus relate a theory which described soul as pervading the whole universe. Then, in Laws Plato has the Athenian Stranger say: ‘Everyone . . . who has not reached the utmost verge of folly is bound to regard the soul as a god. Concerning all the stars and the moon, and concerning the years and months and all seasons, what other account shall we give than this very same, – namely, that, inasmuch as it has been shown that they are all caused by one or more souls . . . we shall declare these souls to be gods . . .? Is there any man that agrees with this view who will stand hearing it denied that ‘all things are full of gods’? The response is: ‘No man is so wrong-headed as that’ (Laws, 899 A-B). Plato had the Athenian Stranger extend his ideas into a theological theory. He used a sleight of hand method to express his own ideas about divine spiritual beings. With the exception of gods in the scheme of things, these passages reflect the beliefs which formed the Thalean hypothesis, but Plato did not have the Athenian Stranger attribute the crucial clause ‘all things are full of gods’ to Thales. Thales is not mentioned.

Aristotle’s text not the earliest extant testimony. Diogenes preserved a report from Hippias: ‘Aristotle and Hippias affirm that, arguing from the magnet and from amber, [Thales] attributed a soul or life even to inanimate objects’ (D.L. I.24). This early report does not mention godly entities. The later commentators, Cicero (Nat. D. I.X.25), and Stobaeus (Ecl. I.1.11) included gods in Thales’s theory. However, their views post-date Stoicism and are distorted by theistic doctrines.

Plato converted the idea of soul into a theory that ‘all things are full of gods’, and this may have been Aristotle’s source, but the idea of gods is contrary to Thales’s materialism. When Thales defined reality, he chose an element, not a god. The motive force was not a supernatural being. It was a force within the universe itself. Thales never invoked a power that was not present in nature itself, because he believed that he had recognized a force which underpinned the events of nature.

8. Thales’s Astronomy

a. The Eclipse of Thales

Thales is acclaimed for having predicted an eclipse of the sun which occurred on 28 May 585 BCE The earliest extant account of the eclipse is from Herodotus: ‘On one occasion [the Medes and the Lydians] had an unexpected battle in the dark, an event which occurred after five years of indecisive warfare: the two armies had already engaged and the fight was in progress, when day was suddenly turned into night. This change from daylight to darkness had been foretold to the Ionians by Thales of Miletus, who fixed the date for it within the limits of the year in which it did, in fact, take place’ (Hdt. I.74). The vital points are: Thales foretold a solar eclipse; it did occur within the period he specified. How Thales foretold the eclipse is not known but there is strong opinion that he was able to perform this remarkable feat through knowledge of a cycle known as the Saros, with some attributing his success to use of the Exeligmos cycle. It is not known how Thales was able to predict the Eclipse, if indeed he did, but he could not have predicted the Eclipse by using the Saros or the Exeligmos cycles.

In addition to Herodotus, the successful prediction of the eclipse was accepted by Eudemus in his History of Astronomy and acknowledged by a number of other writers of ancient times (Cicero, Pliny, Dercyllides, Clement, Eusebius). This is how Diogenes Laertius recorded the event: ‘[Thales] seems by some accounts to have been the first to study astronomy, the first to predict eclipses of the sun, and to fix the solstices; so Eudemus in his History of Astronomy. It was this which gained for him the admiration of Xenophanes and Herodotus and the notice of Heraclitus and Democritus’ (D.L. I.23). Diogenes asserted that Herodotus knew of Thales’s work, and in naming Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Democritus, he nominated three of the great pre-Socratics, eminent philosophers who were familiar with the work of Thales.

Modern astronomy confirms that the eclipse did occur, and was total. According to Herodotus’s report, the umbra of the eclipse of Thales must have passed over the battle field. The “un-naturalness” of a solar eclipse is eerie and chilling. All becomes hushed and there is a strong uncanny sensation of impending disaster, of being within the control of some awful power. In ancient times, the awesome phenomenon must have aroused great fear, anxiety and wonder. The combatants saw the eclipse as disapproval of their warfare, and as a warning. They ceased fighting and a peace agreement was reached between the two kings.

It is not known why Thales turned away from the traditional beliefs which attributed all natural events and man’s fortunes and misfortunes to the great family of Olympian gods, but Miletus was the most prosperous of the Ionian cities, and it cannot be doubted that the flourishing merchants believed that their prosperity resulted from their own initiative and endeavours. Thales’s great philosophical pronouncement that water is the basic principle shows that Thales gave no acknowledgement to the gods as instigators and controllers of phenomena. Thales’s hypotheses indicate that he envisaged phenomena as natural events with natural causes and possible of explanation. From his new perspective of observation and reasoning, Thales studied the heavens and sought explanations of heavenly phenomena.

It is widely accepted that Thales acquired information from Near-Eastern sources and gained access to the extensive records which dated from the time of Nabonassar (747 BCE) and which were later used by Ptolemy (Alm. III.7. H 254). Some commentators have suggested that Thales predicted the solar eclipse of 585 BCE through knowledge of the Saros period, a cycle of 223 lunar months (18 years, 10-11 days plus 0.321124 of a day) after which eclipses both of the sun and moon repeat themselves with very little change, or through knowledge of the Exeligmos cycle which is exactly three times the length of the Saros (Ptolemy, Alm. IV.2. H270). The ancients could not have predicted solar eclipses on the basis of those periodic cycles because eclipses of the sun do not repeat themselves with very little change. The extra 0.321124 of a day means that each recurring solar eclipse will be visible to the west, just under one-third of the circumference of the earth, being a period of time of almost 7.7 hours. This regression to the west could not have been known to the ancient astrologers, a fact which seems not to have been taken into account by the philosophers who attribute Thales’s success to application of one of those two cycles.

The following important fact should be noted. Some commentators and philosophers believe that Thales may have witnessed the solar eclipse of 18th May 603 BCE or have had heard of it. They accepted that he had predicted the solar eclipse of 28 May 585 BCE and reasoned from the astronomical fact of the Saros cycles and the fact that the two solar eclipses had been separated by the period of 18 years, 10 days, and 7.7 hours, and concluded that Thales had been able to predict a solar eclipse based upon the knowledge of that cycle. Two facts discount rebut those claims. First, recent research shows that the solar eclipse of 18th May 603 BCE would not have been visible in Egypt, nor in the Babylonian observation cities where the astronomers watched the heavens for expected and unusual heavenly events. The eclipse of 603 passed over the Persian Gulf, too far to the south for observation (Stephenson, personal communication, March 1999; and Stephenson, “Long-term Fluctuations”, 165-202). Even if the eclipse of 603 had been visible to the Near-Eastern astronomers, it is not possible to recognize a pattern from witnessing one event, or indeed, from witnessing two events. One may suggest a pattern after witnessing three events that are separated by equal periods of time, but the eclipse which preceded that of 603, and which occurred on 6th May 621, was not visible in Near-Eastern regions. Consequently, it could not have been recorded by the astrologer/priests who watched for unusual heavenly phenomena, and could not have been seen as forming a pattern.

It is quite wrong to say that eclipses repeat themselves with very little change, because each solar eclipse in a particular Saros occurs about 7.7 hours later than in the previous eclipse in the same Saros, and that is about 1/3 of the circumference of the earth’s circumference. Adding to the difficulty of recognizing a particular cycle is the fact that about forty-two periodic cycles are in progress continuously, and overlapping at any time. Every series in a periodic cycle lasts about 1,300 years and comprises 73 eclipses. Eclipses which occur in one periodic cycle are unrelated to eclipses in other periodic cycles.

The ancient letters prove that the Babylonians and Assyrians knew that lunar eclipses can occur only at full moon, and solar eclipses only at new moon, and also that eclipses occur at intervals of five or six months. However, while lunar eclipses are visible over about half the globe, solar eclipses are visible from only small areas of the earth’s surface. Recent opinion is that, as early as 650 BCE the Assyrian astronomers seem to have recognized the six months-five months period by which they could isolate eclipse possibilities (Steele, “Eclipse Prediction”, 429).

In other recent research Britton has analysed a text known as Text S, which provides considerable detail and fine analysis of lunar phenomena dating from Nabonassar in 747 BCE The text points to knowledge of the six-month five month periods. Britton believes that the Saros cycle was known before 525 BCE (Britton, “Scientific Astronomy”, 62) but, although the text identifies a particular Saros cycle, and graphically depicts the number of eclipse possibilities, the ancient commentary of Text S does not attest to an actual observation (Britton, “An Early Function”, 32).

There is no evidence that the Saros could have been used for the prediction of solar eclipses in the sixth century BCE, but it remains possible that forthcoming research, and the transliteration of more of the vast stock of ancient tablets will prove that the Babylonians and Assyrians had a greater knowledge of eclipse phenomena than is now known.

The Babylonian and Assyrian astronomers knew of the Saros period in relation to lunar eclipses, and had some success in predicting lunar eclipses but, in the sixth century BCE when Thales lived and worked, neither the Saros nor the Exeligmos cycles could be used to predict solar eclipses.

It is testified that Thales knew that the sun is eclipsed when the moon passes in front of it, the day of eclipse – called the thirtieth by some, new moon by others (The Oxyrhynchus Papyri, 3710). Aëtius (II.28) recorded: [Thales] says that eclipses of the sun take place when the moon passes across it in a direct line, since the moon is earthy in character; and it seems to the eye to be laid on the disc of the sun’.

There is a possibility that, through analysis of ancient eclipse records, Thales identified another cycle, the lunar eclipse-solar eclipse cycle of 23 1/2 months, the fact that a solar eclipse is a possibility 23 1/2 months after a lunar eclipse. However, lunar eclipses are not always followed by solar eclipses. Although the possibility is about 57% it is important to note that the total solar eclipse of 28th May, 585, occurred 23 1/2months after the total lunar eclipse of 4th July, 587. The wording of the report of the eclipse by Herodotus: ‘Thales . . . fixed the date for the eclipse within the limits of the year’ is precise, and suggests that Thales’s prediction was based upon a definite eclipse theory.

b. Setting the Solstices

A report from Theon of Smyrna ap. Dercyllides states that: ‘Eudemus relates in the Astronomy that Thales was the first to discover the eclipse of the sun and that its period with respect to the solstices is not always constant’ (DK, 11 A 17). Diogenes Laertius (I.24) recorded that [Thales] was the first to determine the sun’s course from solstice to solstice, and also acknowledged the Astronomy of Eudemus as his source.

Solstices are natural phenomena which occur on June 21 or 22, and December 21 or 22, but the determination of the precise date on which they occur is difficult. This is because the sun seems to ‘stand still’ for several days because there is no discernible difference in its position in the sky. It is the reason why the precise determination of the solstices was so difficult. It was a problem which engaged the early astronomers, and more than seven centuries later, Ptolemy acknowledged the difficulty (Alm. III.1. H203).

It is not known how Thales proceeded with his determination, but the testimony of Flavius Philostratus is that: ‘[Thales] observed the heavenly bodies . . . from [Mount] Mycale which was close by his home’ (Philostratus, Life of Apollonius , II.V). This suggests that Thales observed the rising and setting of the sun for many days at mid-summer and mid-winter (and, necessarily, over many years). Mount Mycale, being the highest point in the locality of Miletus, would provide the perfect vantage point from which to make observations. Another method which Thales could have employed was to measure the length of the noon-day sun around mid-summer and mid-winter. Again this would require observations to be made, and records kept over many days near the solstice period, and over many years.

c. Thales’s Discovery of the Seasons

From Diogenes Laertius we have the report: ‘[Thales] is said to have discovered the seasons of the year and divided it into 365 days’ (D.L. I.27). Because Thales had determined the solstices, he would have known of the number of days between say, summer solstices, and therefore have known the length of a solar year. It is consistent with his determination of the solstices that he should be credited with discovering that 365 days comprise a year. It is also a fact that had long been known to the Egyptians who set their year by the more reliable indicator of the annual rising of the star Sirius in July. Thales may have first gained the knowledge of the length of the year from the Egyptians, and perhaps have attempted to clarify the matter by using a different procedure. Thales certainly did not ‘discover’ the seasons, but he may have identified the relationship between the solstices, the changing position during the year of the sun in the sky, and associated this with seasonal climatic changes.

d. Thales’s Determination of the Diameters of the Sun and the Moon

Apuleius wrote that ‘Thales in his declining years devised a marvellous calculation about the sun, showing how often the sun measures by its own size the circle which it describes’. (Apul. Florida, 18). Following soon after Apuleius, Cleomedes explained that the calculation could be made by running a water-clock, from which the result was obtained: the diameter of the sun is found to be one seven-hundred-and-fiftieth of its own orbit (Cleomedes, De Motu circulari corporum caelestium, II.75). The third report is from Diogenes: ‘According to some [Thales was] the first to declare the size of the sun to be one seven hundred and twentieth part of the solar circle, and the size of the moon to be the same fraction of the lunar circle’ (D.L. I.24). Little credence can be given to the water-clock method for reaching this determination, because there is an inbuilt likelihood of repeated errors over the 24 hour period. Even Ptolemy, who flourished in the second century A.D., rejected all measurements which were made by means of water-clocks, because of the impossibility of attaining accuracy by such means (Alm. V.14. H416).

In his work in geometry, Thales was engaged in circles and angles, and their characteristics, and he could have arrived at his solution to the problem by applying the geometrical knowledge he had acquired. There is no evidence to support a suggestion that Thales was familiar with measurements by degrees but he could have learnt, from the Babylonians, that a circle is divided into 3600. The figure of 720, which was given by Diogenes for Thales, is double 360, and this is related to the Babylonian sexagesimal system. To establish the dates of the solstices, Thales probably made repeated observations of the risings and settings of the sun. From such experiments he could have observed that the angle which was subtended by the elevation of the rising sun is 1/20 and with 3600 in a circle, the ratio of 1:720 is determined.

Of the report from Diogenes Laertius (D.L. I.24) that Thales also determined the orbit of the moon in relation to the size of its diameter, Thales would repeat the method to calculate the orbit of the moon.

e. Ursa Minor

Callimachus (D.L. I.22) reported that Thales ‘discovered’ Ursa Minor. This means only that he recognized the advantages of navigating by Ursa Minor, rather than by Ursa Major, as was the preferred method of the Greeks. Ursa Minor, a constellation of six stars, has a smaller orbit than does the Great Bear, which means that, as it circles the North Pole, Ursa Minor changes its position in the sky to a lesser degree than does the Great Bear. Thales offered this sage advice to the mariners of Miletus, to whom it should have been of special value because Miletus had developed a maritime trade of economic importance.

f. Falling into a Well

In Theaetetus (174 A) Plato had Socrates relate a story that Thales was so intent upon watching the stars that he failed to watch where he was walking, and fell into a well. The story is also related by Hippolytus (Diels, Dox. 555), and by Diogenes Laertius (D.L. II.4-5). Irony and jest abound in Plato’s writing and he loved to make fun of the pre-Socratics, but he is not likely to have invented the episode, especially as he had Socrates relate the event. Aristotle wrote that viewing the heavens through a tube ‘enables one to see further’ (Gen. An. 780 b19-21), and Pliny (HN, II.XI) wrote that: ‘The sun’s radiance makes the fixed stars invisible in daytime, although they are shining as much as in the night, which becomes manifest at a solar eclipse and also when the star is reflected in a very deep well’. Thales was renowned and admired for his astronomical studies, and he was credited with the ‘discovery’ of Ursa Minor (D.L. I.23). If Thales had heard that stars could be viewed to greater advantage from wells, either during day or night, he would surely have made an opportunity to test the theory, and to take advantage of a method that could assist him in his observations. The possibility that the story was based on fact should not be overlooked. Plato had information which associated Thales with stars, a well, and an accident. Whether Thales fell into a well, or tripped when he was getting in or out of a well, the story grew up around a mishap.

9. Mathematics

The practical skill of land measurement was invented in Egypt because of the necessity frequently to remeasure plots of land after destructive inundations. The phenomena is well described by Herodotus (II.93-109). Egypt was believed to be the source of much wisdom and reports tell us that many Greeks, including Thales, Pythagoras, Solon, Herodotus, Plato, Democritus, and Euclid, visited that ancient land to see the wonders for themselves.

The Egyptians had little to offer in the way of abstract thought. The surveyors were able to measure and to calculate and they had outstanding practical skills. In Egypt Thales would have observed the land surveyors, those who used a knotted cord to make their measurements, and were known as rope-stretchers. Egyptian mathematics had already reached its heights when The Rhind Mathematical Papyrus was written in about 1800 BCE More than a thousand years later, Thales would have watched the surveyors as they went about their work in the same manner, measuring the land with the aid of a knotted rope which they stretched to measure lengths and to form angles.

The development of geometry is preserved in a work of Proclus, A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid’s Elements (64.12-65.13). Proclus provided a remarkable amount of intriguing information, the vital points of which are the following: Geometry originated in Egypt where it developed out of necessity; it was adopted by Thales who had visited Egypt, and was introduced into Greece by him

The Commentary of Proclus indicates that he had access to the work of Euclid and also to The History of Geometry which was written by Eudemus of Rhodes, a pupil of Aristotle, but which is no longer extant. His wording makes it clear that he was familiar with the views of those writers who had earlier written about the origin of geometry. He affirmed the earlier views that the rudiments of geometry developed in Egypt because of the need to re-define the boundaries, just as Herodotus stated.

a. The Theorems Attributed to Thales

Five Euclidean theorems have been explicitly attributed to Thales, and the testimony is that Thales successfully applied two theorems to the solution of practical problems.

Thales did not formulate proofs in the formal sense. What Thales did was to put forward certain propositions which, it seems, he could have ‘proven’ by induction: he observed the similar results of his calculations: he showed by repeated experiment that his propositions and theorems were correct, and if none of his calculations resulted in contrary outcomes, he probably felt justified in accepting his results as proof. Thalean ‘proof’ was often really inductive demonstration. The process Thales used was the method of exhaustion. This seems to be the evidence from Proclus who declared that Thales ‘attacked some problems in a general way and others more empirically’.

DEFINITION I.17: A diameter of the circle is a straight line drawn through the centre and terminated in both directions by the circumference of the circle; and such a straight line also bisects the circle (Proclus, 124). >

PROPOSITION I.5: In isosceles triangles the angles at the base are equal; and if the equal straight lines are produced further, the angles under the base will be equal (Proclus, 244). It seems that Thales discovered only the first part of this theorem for Proclus reported: We are indebted to old Thales for the discovery of this and many other theorems. For he, it is said, was the first to notice and assert that in every isosceles the angles at the base are equal, though in somewhat archaic fashion he called the equal angles similar (Proclus, 250.18-251.2).

PROPOSITION I.15: ‘If two straight lines cut one another, they make the vertical angles equal to one another’ (Proclus, 298.12-13). This theorem is positively attributed to Thales. Proof of the theorem dates from the Elements of Euclid (Proclus, 299.2-5).

PROPOSITION I.26: ‘If two triangles have the two angles equal to two angles respectively, and one side equal to one side, namely, either the side adjoining the equal angles, or that subtending one of the equal angles, they will also have the remaining sides equal to the remaining sides and the remaining angle equal to the remaining angle’ (Proclus, 347.13-16). ‘Eudemus in his history of geometry attributes the theorem itself to Thales, saying that the method by which he is reported to have determined the distance of ships at sea shows that he must have used it’ (Proclus, 352.12-15). Thales applied this theorem to determine the height of a pyramid. The great pyramid was already over two thousand years old when Thales visited Gizeh, but its height was not known. Diogenes recorded that ‘Hieronymus informs us that [Thales] measured the height of the pyramids by the shadow they cast, taking the observation at the hour when our shadow is of the same length as ourselves’ (D.L. I.27). Pliny (HN, XXXVI.XVII.82) and Plutarch (Conv. sept. sap. 147) also recorded versions of the event. Thales was alerted by the similarity of the two triangles, the ‘quality of proportionality’. He introduced the concept of ratio, and recognized its application as a general principle. Thales’s accomplishment of measuring the height of the pyramid is a beautiful piece of mathematics. It is considered that the general principle in Euclid I.26 was applied to the ship at sea problem, would have general application to other distant objects or land features which posed difficulties in the calculation of their distances.

PROPOSITION III.31: ‘The angle in a semicircle is a right angle’. Diogenes Laertius (I.27) recorded: ‘Pamphila states that, having learnt geometry from the Egyptians, [Thales] was the first to inscribe a right-angled triangle in a circle, whereupon he sacrificed an ox’. Aristotle was intrigued by the fact that the angle in a semi-circle is always right. In two works, he asked the question: ‘Why is the angle in a semicircle always a right angle?’ (An. Post. 94 a27-33; Metaph. 1051 a28). Aristotle described the conditions which are necessary if the conclusion is to hold, but did not add anything that assists with this problem.

It is testified that it was from Egypt that Thales acquired the rudiments of geometry. However, the evidence is that the Egyptian skills were in orientation, measurement, and calculation. Thales’s unique ability was with the characteristics of lines, angles and circles. He recognized, noticed and apprehended certain principles which he probably ‘proved’ through repeated demonstration.

10. Crossing the Halys

Herodotus recorded ‘the general belief of the Greeks’ that Thales assisted Croesus in transporting his troops across the Halys river (Hdt. I.75) on his advance into Capadoccia to engage the great Persian conqueror, Cyrus who threatened from the east. Herodotus provided a detailed description of the reported crossing which many of the Greeks supposed had been accomplished through Thales’s engineering skills and ingenuity (Hdt. I.75). Herodotus had been told that Thales advised Croesus to divide the river into two parts. The story is that Thales directed the digging so that the river was diverted into two smaller streams, each of which could then be forded. The story from Herodotus describes a formation similar to an oxbow lake. The work could have been undertaken by the men of Croesus’s army, and directed by Thales. With both channels then being fordable, Croesus could lead his army across the Halys. This description complies with ‘the general belief of the Greeks’ which Herodotus related.

However, Herodotus did not accept that story, because he believed that bridges crossed the river at that time (I.74). Herodotus’s misgivings were well founded. There is considerable support for the argument that Croesus and his army crossed the Halys by the bridge which already existed and travelled by the Royal Road which provided the main access to the East. Herodotus explained that at the Halys there were gates which had to be passed before one crossed the river, which formed the border, with the post being strongly guarded (Hdt. V.52).

The town of Cesnir Kopru, or Tcheshnir Keupreu, is a feasible site for a crossing. Before the industrialization of the area, a mediaeval bridge was observed, underneath which, when the river was low, could be seen not only the remains of its Roman predecessor but the roughly hewn blocks of a much earlier bridge (Garstang, 1959, 2). Any clues that may have helped to provide an answer to the question of whether there were bridges in the time of Croesus are now submerged by the hydroelectric plants which have been built in the area. Herodotus recorded the details that he had obtained, but used his own different understanding of the situation to discount the report.

11. The Possible Travels of Thales

Establishing whether or not Thales travelled and what countries he visited is important because we may be able to establish what information he could have acquired from other sources. In Epinomis 987 E) Plato made the point that the Greeks took from foreigners what was of value and developed their notions into better ideas.

Eudemus, who was one of Aristotle’s students, believed that Thales had travelled to Egypt (Eudemus ap. Proclus, 65.7). A number of ancient sources support that opinion, including Pamphila who held that he spent time with the Egyptian priests (D.L. I.24), Hieronymus from whose report we learn that Thales measured the height of the pyramids by the shadow they cast (D.L. I.27), and Plutarch (De Is. et Os. 131). Thales gave an explanation for the inundation (D.L. I.37). He may have devised this explanation after witnessing the phenomena, which Herodotus later described (Hdt. II.97).

By 620 BCE, and perhaps earlier, Miletus held a trading concession at Naucratis (Hdt. II.178, Strab. 17.1.18) on the Canopic mouth of the Nile, and it is possible that Thales visited Egypt on a trading mission. Travel to Egypt would not have been difficult. Homer had Ulysses sailing from Crete to the Nile in five days, and Ernle Bradford recently made a similar journey, proving the trip to be feasible (Bradford, Ulysses Found, 26, and passim). The wealth of Miletus was the result of its success as a trading centre, and there would have been no difficulty in arranging passage on one of the many vessels which traded through of Miletus.

Josephus (Contra Apionem I.2) wrote that Thales was a disciple of the Egyptians and the Chaldeans which suggests that he visited the Near-East. It is thought that Thales visited the Babylonians and Chaldeans and had access to the astrological records which enabled him to predict the solar eclipse of 585 BCE

Miletus had founded many colonies around the Mediterranean and especially along the coasts of the Black Sea. Pliny (HN, V.31.112) gives the number as ninety. The Milesians traded their goods for raw materials, especially iron and timber, and tunny fish. Strabo made mention of ‘a sheep-industry’, and the yield of ‘soft wool’ (Strabo, 12.3.13), and Aristophanes mentioned the fine and luxurious Milesian wool (Lysistrata, 729; Frogs, 543). The Milesian traders had access to the hinterland. The land around the mouth of the Halys was fertile, ‘productive of everything . . . and planted with olive trees’ (Strabo, 12.3.12-13). Thales was associated with a commercial venture in the production of olive oil in Miletus and Chios, but his interests may have extended beyond those two places. Olive oil was a basic item in the Mediterranean diet, and was probably a trading commodity of some importance to Milesian commerce.

It is likely that Thales was one of the ‘great teachers’ who, according to Herodotus, visited Croesus in the Lydian capital, Sardis (Hdt. I.30). From Sardis, he could have joined a caravan to make the three-month journey along the well used Royal Road (Hdt. V.53), to visit the observatories in Babylonia, and seek the astronomical knowledge which they had accumulated over centuries of observation of heavenly phenomena. In about 547 BCE late in his life, Thales travelled into Cappadocia with Croesus, and, according to some belief, devised a scheme by which the army of Croesus was able to cross the River Halys. Milesian merchantmen continually plied the Black Sea, and gaining a passage could have been easily arranged. From any number of ports Thales could have sought information, and from Sinope he may have ventured on the long journey to Babylonia, perhaps travelling along the valley of the Tigris, as Xenophon did in 401-399 BCE

In a letter purported to be from Thales to Pherecydes, Thales stated that he and Solon had both visited Crete, and Egypt to confer with the priests and astronomers, and all over Hellas and Asia (D.L. I.43-44). All that should be gleaned from such reports, is that travel was not exceptional, with many reports affirming the visits of mainly notable people to foreign lands. Alcaeus visited Egypt’ (Strabo, 1.2.30), and his brother, Antimenidas, served in Judaea in the army of the Babylonian monarch, King Nebuchadrezzar. Sappho went into exile in Sicily, her brother,Charaxus, spent some time in Egypt, and a number of friends of Sappho visited Sardis where they lived in Lydian society. There must have been any number of people who visited foreign lands, about whom we know nothing.

Very little about the travels of Thales may be stated with certainty, but it seems probable that he would have sought information from any sources of knowledge and wisdom, particularly the centres of learning in the Near-East. It is accepted that there was ample opportunity for travel.

12. Milesian School

Thales was the founder of a new school of philosophy (Arist. Metaph. 983 b20). His two fellow Milesians who also engaged in the new questioning approach to the understanding of the universe, were Anaximander, his disciple (D.L. I.13), and Anaximenes, who was the disciple of Anaximander (D.L. II.2). Anaximander was about ten years younger than Thales, but survived him by only a year, dying in about 545. Anaximenes was born in 585 and died in about 528. Their lives all overlapped. Through their association they comprised the Milesian School: They all worked on similar problems, the nature of matter and the nature of change, but they each proposed a different material as the primary principle, which indicates that there was no necessity to follow the master’s teachings or attribute their discoveries to him. Each proposed a different support for the earth. Thales was held in high regard for his wisdom, being acclaimed as the most eminent of the Wise Men of Ancient Greece, but he was not regarded as a god, as Pythagoras was. Anaximander and Anaximenes were free to pursue their own ideas and to express them in writing. This surely suggests that they engaged in critical discussion of the theories of each other. The Greeks are a sociable people, and their willingness to converse brought rewards in knowledge gained, as Plato remarked (Epinomis, 987E). Critical discussion implies more than familiarity with other views, and more than mere disagreement with other theories. It is the adoption, or in this case, the development, of a new style of discussion. It is a procedure which encourages questioning, debate, explanation, justification and criticism. There was a unique relationship between the three Milesians and it is highly probable that the critical method developed in the Milesian School under the leadership of Thales.

13. The Seven Sages of Ancient Greece

The earliest reference to the Seven Sages of Ancient Greece is in Plato’s Protagoras in which he listed seven names: ‘A man’s ability to utter such remarks [notable, short and compressed] is to be ascribed to his perfect education. Such men were Thales of Miletus, Pittacus of Mitylene, Bias of Priene, Solon of our city [Athens], Cleobulus of Lindus, Myson of Chen, and, last of the traditional seven, Chilon of Sparta. . . . and you can recognize that character in their wisdom by the short memorable sayings that fell from each of them’ (Protagoras, 342 E-343 A).

Diogenes recorded that ‘Thales was the first to receive the name of Sage in the archonship of Damasias at Athens, when the term was applied to all the Seven Sages, as Demetrius of Phalerum [born. ca. 350 B.C] mentions in his List of Archons (D.L. I.22). Demetrius cannot have been the source for Plato, who died when Demetrius was only three years old. Perhaps there was a source common to both Plato and Demetrius, but it is unknown.

Damasias was archon in 582/1. It may be significant that at this time the Pythian Games were re-organized. More events were added and, for the first time, they were to be held at intervals of four years, in the third year of the Olympiad, instead of the previous eight-yearly intervals. Whether there is an association between the re-organization of the Pythian Games and the inauguration of the Seven Sages in not known but, as Pausanias indicates, the Seven were selected from all around Greece: ‘These [the sages] were: from Ionia, Thales of Miletus and Bias of Priene; of the Aeolians in Lesbos, Pittacus of Mitylene; of the Dorians in Asia, Cleobulus of Lindus; Solon of Athens and Chilon of Sparta; the seventh sage, according to the list of Plato, the son of Ariston is not Periander, the son of Cypselus, but Myson of Chenae, a village on Mount Oeta’ (Paus. 14.1). The purpose of Damasias may have been aimed at establishing unity between the city-states.

It is difficult to believe that the Seven all assembled at Delphi, although the dates just allow it. Plato wrote that their notable maxims were featured at Delphi: ‘They [the Sages], assembled together and dedicated these [short memorable sayings] as the first-fruits of their lore to Apollo in his Delphic temple, inscribing there those maxims which are on every tongue – “Know thyself’ and “Nothing overmuch” ‘ (Pl. Prt. 343 A-B).

Plato regarded wise maxims as the most essential of the criteria for a sage, and associated them with wisdom and with good education, but he has Socrates say: ‘Think again of all the ingenious devices in arts or other achievements, such as you might expect in one of practical ability; you might remember Thales of Miletus and Anacharsis the Scythian’ (Respublica , 600 A). Practical ability was clearly important.

Several other lists were compiled: Hippobotus (D.L. I.42); Pittacus (D.L. I.42); and Diogenes (D.L. I.13. They omitted some names and adding others. In his work On the Sages, Hermippus reckons seventeen, which included most of the names listed by other compilers.

Many commentators state that Thales was named as Sage because of the practical advice he gave to Miletus in particular, and to Ionia in general. The earlier advice was to his fellow Milesians. In 560, the thirty-five year old Croesus (Hdt. I.25) succeeded his father Alyattes and continued the efforts begun by his father to subdue the Milesians, but without success. Diogenes tells us that ‘when Croesus sent to Miletus offering terms of alliance, [Thales] frustrated the plan’ (D.L. I.25). The second occasion was at an even later date, when the power of Cyrus loomed as a threat from the east. Thales’s advice to the Ionian states was to unite in a political alliance, so that their unified strength could be a defence against the might of Cyrus. This can hardly have been prior to 550 BCE which is thirty years later than the promulgation of the Seven Sages. Thales was not named as a Sage because of any political advice which is extant.

One of the few dates in Thales’s life which can be known with certainty is the date of the Eclipse of 585 BCE It brought to a halt the battle being fought between Alyattes and the Mede, Cyaxares and, in addition, brought peace to the region after ‘five years of indecisive warfare’ (Hdt. I.74). The Greeks believed that Thales had predicted the Eclipse, and perhaps even regarded him as being influential in causing the phenomenon to occur. This was reason enough to declare Thales to be a man of great wisdom and to designate him as the first of the Seven Sages of Ancient Greece.

14. Corner in Oil

Thales’s reputation for wisdom is further enhanced in a story which was related by Aristotle. (Politics, 1259 a 6-23). Somehow, through observation of the heavenly bodies, Thales concluded that there would be a bumper crop of olives. He raised the money to put a deposit on the olive presses of Miletus and Chios, so that when the harvest was ready, he was able to let them out at a rate which brought him considerable profit. In this way, Thales answered those who reproached him for his poverty. As Aristotle points out, the scheme has universal application, being nothing more than a monopoly. There need not have been a bumper harvest for the scheme to have been successful. It is quite likely that Thales was involved in commercial ventures, possibly the export of olive oil, and Plutarch reported that Thales was said to have engaged in trade (Plut. Vit. Sol. II.4).

15. The Heritage of Thales

Thales is the first person about whom we know to propose explanations of natural phenomena which were materialistic rather than mythological or theological. His theories were new, bold, exciting, comprehensible, and possible of explanation. He did not speak in riddles as did Heraclitus, and had no need to invent an undefined non-substance, as Anaximander did. Because he gave no role to mythical beings, Thales’s theories could be refuted. Arguments could be put forward in attempts to discredit them. Thales’s hypotheses were rational and scientific. Aristotle acknowledged Thales as the first philosopher, and criticized his hypotheses in a scientific manner.

The most outstanding aspects of Thales’s heritage are: The search for knowledge for its own sake; the development of the scientific method; the adoption of practical methods and their development into general principles; his curiosity and conjectural approach to the questions of natural phenomena – In the sixth century BCE Thales asked the question, ‘What is the basic material of the cosmos?’ The answer is yet to be discovered.

16. References and Further Readin

  • Ernle Bradford. Ulysses Found. London: Hodder and Stoughton, 1964.
  • Britton, John P. “An Early Function for Eclipse Magnitudes in Babylonian Astronomy.” Centaurus, 32 (1989): 32.
  • Britton, John P. “Scientific Astronomy in Pre-Seleucid Babylon.” Chapter in H.D. Galter, Die Rolle der Astronomy in den Kulteren Mesopotamiens. Graz: 1993.
  • Garstang, John and O.R. Gurney. The Geography of the Hittite Empire. Occasional Publications of The British Institute of Archaeology in Ankara, no. 5. London: The British Institute of Archaeology at Ankara, 1959.
  • Proclus. A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid’s Elements. Translated with an Introduction and Notes by Glenn R Morrow. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1970.
  • Ptolemy. Ptolemy’snAlmagest. Translated and Annotated by G.J. Toomer. London: Duckworth, 1984.
  • Snell, Bruno. “Die Nachrichten über die Lehren des Thales und die Anfänge der griechischen Philosophie – und Literaturgeschichte.” [The News about the Teachings of Thales and the Beginnings of the Greek History of Philosophy and Literature], Philologus 96 (1944): 170-182.
  • Steele, John M.”Eclipse Prediction in Mesopotamia.” Archive for History of Exact Science 54 (5) (2000):421-454.
  • Stephenson, F. Richard, and L.V. Morrison. “Long-term fluctuations in the Earth’s rotation: 700 BC to AD 1990.” Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society of London351 (1995): 165-202.

17. Abbreviations

  • Aristotle, An. Post., Analytica Posteriora; Cael., De Caelo; De An., De Anima; Gen An., De Generatione Animalium; Hist. An., Historia Animalium; Metaph., Metaphysics; Pol., Politics; Hist. An.; Historia Animalium
  • Cicero, Rep., De Republica; Nat. D., De Natura Deorum
  • D.L., Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers
  • Diels,Dox., H. Diels, Doxographi Graeci
  • DK, Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz.Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zurich: Weidmann, 1985.
  • Epicurus, ap.Censorinus, D.N.; Censorinus, De die natali
  • Ovid,Met., Metamorphoses
  • Plutarch,Plut. De Is. et Os., De Iside et Osiride; De Pyth. or., De Pythiae oraculis; Conv. sept. sap., Convivium septem sapientium, [The Dinner of the Seven Wise Men];; Vit. Sol., Vitae Parallelae, Solon
  • Pliny (the Elder), HN: Naturalis Historia
  • Pliny (the Younger), Ep: Epistulae
  • Ps.-Plutarch, Epit;Pseudo-Plutarch, Epitome
  • Seneca, QNat., Quaestiones Naturales
  • Stobaeus, Ecl., jEklogaiv ['Selections']
  • Theophr. ap. Simpl. Phys., Theophrastus, ap. Simplicius, in Physics

Author Information

Patricia O’Grady
Email: Patricia.OGrady@flinders.edu.au
The Flinders University of South Australia
Australia




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