Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Natural Theology

Natural theology is a program of inquiry into the existence and attributes of God without referring or appealing to any divine revelation. In natural theology, one asks what the word “God” means, whether and how names can be applied to God, whether God exists, whether God knows the future free choices of creatures, and so forth. The aim is to answer those questions without using any claims drawn from any sacred texts or divine revelation, even though one may hold such claims.

For purposes of studying natural theology, Jews, Christians, Muslims, and others will bracket and set aside for the moment their commitment to the sacred writings or traditions they believe to be God’s word. Doing so enables them to proceed together to engage in the perennial questions about God using the sources of evidence that they share by virtue of their common humanity, for example, sensation, reason, science, and history. Agnostics and atheists, too, can engage in natural theology. For them, it is simply that they have no revelation-based views to bracket and set aside in the first place.

This received view of natural theology was a long time in the making. Natural theology was born among the ancient Greeks, and its meeting with ancient Judeo-Christian-Muslim thought constituted a complex cultural event. From that meeting there developed throughout the Middle Ages for Christians a sophisticated distinction between theology in the Christian sense and natural theology in the ancient Greek sense. Although many thinkers in the Middle Ages tried to unite theology and natural theology into a unity of thought, the project frequently met with objections, as we shall see below. The modern era was partly defined by a widespread rejection of natural theology for both philosophical and theological reasons. Such rejection persisted, and persists, although there has been a significant revival of natural theology in recent years.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Beginnings of Theology and Philosophy
  2. Ancient Philosophy and the First Principle
  3. Ancient Jewish and Early Christian Theology
  4. Distinction between Revealed Theology and Natural Theology
  5. Thomas Aquinas
  6. Modern Philosophy and Natural Theology
  7. Natural Theology Today
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Ancient Mediaeval Theology
      2. Mediaeval Natural Theology
      3. Modern Natural Theology
      4. Contemporary Natural Theology
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Historical Beginnings of Theology and Philosophy

The story of natural theology begins where theology begins. For the Greeks the term theology originally referred to inquiry into the lives and activities of the gods or divinities. In the Greek world, theology and mythology were the same concept. The theologians were the poets whose task it was to present accounts of the gods in poetic form. In the same age when the gods dominated popular thinking, however, another movement was growing: philosophy. The first philosophers, the pre-Socratics, undertook a quest to find the first principle of things. “First principle” here means the ultimate source or origin of all things. The pre-Socratic quest is often described as “purely rational” in the sense that it proceeded without making reference or appeal to the authority of poets or stories of the gods. The pre-Socratic philosophers entertained various candidates as to the first principle, for example, water, fire, conflicting dualities, number, or simply “being.” Both the mythology of the gods (already defined by the name of theology) and the purely rational quest for the first principle (later defined by the name of philosophy) constituted the cultural heritage of Plato and Aristotle – the two thinkers who would most greatly influence the development of natural theology. Plato and Aristotle each recognized the distinction between the two ways of inquiring into ultimate truth: the poetic-mythological-theological way and the purely rational way.

2. Ancient Philosophy and the First Principle

Plato (427 – 347 B.C.E.) in his well-known “Allegory of the Cave” in Book VII of The Republic, provides an image of what education consists in. True education consists in being led from the bondage of sensory appearances into the light of knowledge afforded by the form of the Good. The form of the Good is the cause of all being and all knowledge (the first principle). Knowledge of the form of the Good is arrived at through the struggle of dialectical argumentation. The dialectical arguments of philosophy do not prove the existence of the form of the Good, but contribute to inducing a non-inferential perception of it. Although Plato himself does not identify the form of the Good as God, later thinkers surely did.

Aristotle (384 – 322 B.C.E.) offers arguments for the existence of God (a God beyond the gods so to speak). Aristotle’s arguments start from the observable fact of motion or change in things around us. On the basis of his theory of motion, change, and causality presented in Physics, Aristotle proceeds to offer a demonstration that there exists a first mover of all other movers which is not itself moved in any respect. The first, unmoved mover is a postulate intended to account for the perpetuity of motion and change around us. The “argument from motion” is not meant to be a dialectical exercise that induces non-inferential perception of God, but a demonstration or proof according to the canons of proof that Aristotle presents in the Posterior Analytics. In the later books of Metaphysics, Aristotle goes further and identifies the unmoved mover as separated from matter and as nous or Mind. It is thought thinking itself. On Aristotle’s view, even though the world is everlasting, all things everlastingly proceed in accord with separated Reason: the first principle of all. Both Plato and Aristotle have one view in common. They hold that through a form of rational argumentation (whether it be demonstrative or dialectical), one can – without appeal to the authority of sacred writings – arrive at some knowledge or awareness of a first principle that is separated from matter.

We have now come to call the development of this non-poetic or non-mythological form of thought from the pre-Socratics through Plato and Aristotle by the name of “philosophy.” Aristotle’s arguments for the existence of God, because they argued from some feature of nature, came to be called “natural theology.” Natural theology was part of philosophy, as opposed to being part of the mytho-poetic theology.

3. Ancient Jewish and Early Christian Theology

As philosophy was developing from the Pre-Socratics through to Plato and Aristotle, another development was taking place among the Israelites or the ancient Jews. What was developing was their understanding of their corporate identity as the chosen people of God (YHWH). They conceived of themselves as a people established in a covenant with him, and bound to serve him according to the law and ritual prescriptions they had received from him. Texts received as sacred and as the word of God were an essential basis for their life, practice and thought.

It was among Jews and as a Jew that Jesus of Nazareth was born, lived his life, and gathered his first adherents. Christianity shared with Judaism a method for approaching God that essentially involved texts and faith in them as God’s word (although Christianity would eventually involve more texts than ancient Judaism). As Christianity spread, so did its faith-based and text-based method for approaching an understanding of God. As a minority practice within a predominantly Roman-Hellenistic culture, Christianity soon faced two new questions. First, do Christians have a “theology?”Second, what should a Christian make of “philosophy?” So long as Christianity remained a minority practice, Christians themselves remained conflicted on how to answer the two questions posed by the predominant culture.

The first question – do Christians have a theology? – was difficult for Christians to answer due to the poetic-mythological sense of the term “theology” still prevalent in the predominant Roman-Hellenistic milieu. All Christians rejected the views of the mythological-poets (the theologians). So long as the word “theology” meant the pagan mythological poetry and worship of the gods as practiced in the prevailing culture, Christians rejected the word “theology” as well. But once Christianity became culturally predominant, the word “theology” could and did become disassociated from the belief in and worship of the gods and was applied instead to the specifically Christian task of thinking and speaking about God as revealed in the Christian Scriptures. Under the new conditions, Christians found themselves more widely capable of saying that they had a theology.

The second question – what should Christians make of philosophy? – was difficult for Christians to answer because in the name of “philosophy” Christianity met with strong resistance to its central claims, for example, that Jesus is the Word made flesh. Some Christians considered philosophy essentially incompatible with Christianity; other Christians considered the possibility of a sort of intellectual alliance between philosophy and Christianity. On the one hand, Tertullian (160 – 220) famously quipped “What has Athens to do with Jerusalem?” (Prescription Against the Heretics, ch. VII). He is often quoted to show (perhaps unfairly) that he and Christians of his age rejected philosophical or “purely rational” methods for approaching knowledge of God. On the other hand, some Christians who were roughly his contemporaries happily availed themselves of contemporary philosophical vocabulary, concepts, and reasoning to expound Christian teaching. For example, Justin the Martyr (100-165), a convert to Christianity from Platonism, developed an account of the activity of Christ in terms of a medley of Platonist and Stoic ideas. Clement of Alexandria developed an account of Christian knowledge (gnosis) based on a variety of ideas drawn from prevalent philosophies. Greek speaking eastern Christians (more quickly than Latin speaking ones) began a process of borrowing, altering, and then using prevalent philosophical categories to corroborate and clarify their faith-based views of God. Their writings are filled with discussions of God’s existence and attributes in terms that are recognizable to philosophers. But is philosophical thought that has been used to clarify and corroborate faith-based and text-based beliefs still philosophical thought? Philosophy, after all, proceeds without appeal to the authority of sacred texts, and Christian theology proceeded by way of appeal to Christian sacred texts. There was now need for a new degree of precision regarding the ways to arrive at knowledge of God.

4. Distinction between Revealed Theology and Natural Theology

The distinction between revealed theology and natural theology eventually grew out of the distinction between what is held by faith and what is held by understanding or reason. St. Augustine, in describing how he was taught as a catechumen in the Church, writes:

“From this time on, however, I gave my preference to the Catholic faith. I thought it more modest and not in the least misleading to be told by the Church to believe what could not be demonstrated – whether that was because a demonstration existed but could not be understood by all or whether the matter was not one open to rational proof…You [God] persuaded me that the defect lay not with those who believed your books, which you have established with such great authority amongst almost all nations, but with those who did not believe them.” Confessions Bk. VI, v (7). (Chadwick, 1992)

Here Augustine describes being asked to believe certain things, that is, take them on authority, even though they could not be demonstrated. The distinction between what one takes on authority (particularly the authority of Scripture) and what one accepts on the basis of demonstration runs throughout the corpus of Augustine’s writings. These two ways of holding claims about God correspond roughly with things one accepts by faith and things that proceed from understanding or reason. Each of the two ways will produce a type of theology. The program for inquiring into God on the basis of faith/text-commitments will be called “revealed theology” many centuries later. Also, the program for inquiring about God strictly on the basis of understanding or reason will be called “natural theology” many centuries later. The distinction between holding something by faith and holding it by reason, as well as the distinction between the two types of theology that each way produces, can be traced through some major figures of the Middle Ages. Two examples follow.

First, Anicius Manlius Severinus Boethius (480 – 524) presented an elaborate account of God’s existence, attributes, and providence. Although a Christian, Boethius brings together in his Consolation of Philosophy the best of various ancient philosophical currents about God. Without any appeal to the authority of Christian Scripture, Boethius elaborated his account of God as eternal, provident, good, and so forth.

Second, Pseudo-Dionysius (late 5th century) also raised the distinction between knowing things from the authority of Scripture and knowing them from rational arguments:

“Theological tradition has a dual aspect, the ineffable and mysterious on the one hand, the open and more evident on the other. The one resorts to symbolism and involves initiation. The other is philosophic and employs the method of demonstration.” Epistola IX (Luibheid, 1987)

Here we have the distinction between the two ways of approaching God explicitly identified as two aspects of theology. Augustine, Boethius, and Pseudo-Dionysius (to name but a few) thus make possible a more refined distinction between two types of aspects to theology. On the one hand, there is a program of inquiry that aims to understand what one accepts in faith as divine revelation from above. On the other hand, there is a program of inquiry that proceeds without appeal to revelation and aims to obtain some knowledge of God from below.

The eighth to the twelfth centuries are often considered the years of monastic theology. During this time, Aristotle’s writings in physics and metaphysics were lost to the West, and the knowledge of Platonism possessed by earlier Christians waned. The speculative ambitions of earlier Christian theologians (for example, Origen, Augustine, the Cappadocians, and so forth) were succeeded by the tendency of the monks to meditate upon, but not to speculate beyond, the Scriptures and the theological tradition received from earlier Christians. The monk aimed primarily at experiencing what the texts revealed about God rather than to understanding what the texts revealed about God in terms afforded by reason and philosophy (see LeClerq, 1982). This began to change with Anselm of Canterbury (1033 – 1109).

Anselm is best known in contemporary philosophical circles for his ontological argument for the existence of God. As the argument is commonly understood, Anselm aimed to show that God exists without making appeal to any sacred texts and also without basing his argument upon any empirical or observable truth. The argument consists entirely of an analysis of the idea of God, and a tracing of the implications of that idea given the laws of logic, for example, the principle of non-contradiction. Anselm, however, is known among medieval specialists for much more. Although a monk himself, he is known as the first to go beyond the purely meditative and experiential aims of monastic theology, and to pursue a serious speculative ambition. He wished to find the necessary reasons for why God acted as he has in history (as revealed by the Bible). Although Anselm’s program was still a matter of Christian faith seeking to understand God as revealed by the Bible and grasped by faith, Anselm helped legitimize once again the use of reason for speculating upon matters held by faith. Once the writings of Aristotle in Physics and Metaphysics were recovered in the West, the question inevitably arose as to what to make of Aristotelian theses vis-à-vis views held on Christian faith. There arose a need for a new degree of precision on the relationship between philosophy and theology, faith and understanding. One classic account to provide that precision came from Thomas Aquinas who had at his disposal many centuries of preliminary reflection on the issues.

5. Thomas Aquinas

In the work of Thomas Aquinas (1225 – 1276), one finds two distinctions that serve to clarify the nature and status of natural theology. Aquinas distinguishes between two sorts of truths and between two ways of knowing them.

For Aquinas, there are two sorts of truths about God:

“There is a twofold mode of truth in what we profess about God. Some truths about God exceed all the ability of human reason. Such is the truth that God is triune. But there are some truths which the natural reason also is able to reach. Such are the truth that God exists, that he is one, and the like. In fact, such truths about God have been proved demonstratively by the philosophers, guided by the light of natural reason.” (SCG I, ch.3, n.2)

On the one hand, there are truths beyond the capacity of the human intellect to discover or verify and, on the other hand, there are truths falling within the capacity of human intellect to discover and verify. Let us call the first sort truths beyond reason and the latter sort truths of natural reason. There are different ways of knowing or obtaining access to each sort of truth.

The truths of natural reason are discovered or obtained by using the natural light of reason. The natural light of reason is the capacity for intelligent thought that all human beings have just by virtue of being human. By exercising their native intelligence, human beings can discover, verify, and organize many truths of natural reason. Aquinas thinks that human beings have discovered many such truths and he expects human beings to discover many more. Although there is progress amidst the human race in understanding truths of natural reason, Aquinas thinks there are truths that are totally beyond the intelligence of the entire human race.

The truths beyond reason are outside the aptitude of the natural light of reason to discover or verify. The cognitive power of all humanity combined, all humanity of the past, present, and future, does not suffice to discover or verify one of the truths beyond reason. How then does an individual or humanity arrive at such truths? Humanity does not arrive at them. Rather, the truths arrive at humanity from a higher intellect – God. They come by way of divine revelation, that is, by God testifying to them. God testifies to them in a three-step process.

First, God elevates the cognitive powers of certain human beings so that their cognitive powers operate at a level of aptitude beyond what they are capable of by nature. Thanks to the divinely enhanced cognition, such people see more deeply into things than is possible for humans whose cognition has not been so enhanced. The heightened cognition is compared to light, and is often said to be a higher light than the light of natural reason. It is called the light of prophecy or the light of revelation. The recipients of the light of prophecy see certain things that God sees but that the rest of humanity does not. Having seen higher truths in a higher light, the recipients of the higher light are ready for the second step.

Second, God sends those who see things in the higher light to bear witness and to testify to what they see in the higher light. By so testifying, the witnesses (the prophets and Apostles of old) served as instruments or a mouthpiece through which God made accessible to humanity some of those truths that God sees but that humanity does not see. Furthermore, such truths were then consigned to Scripture (by the cognitively enhanced or “inspired” authors of the books of the Bible), and the Bible was composed. The Bible makes for the third step.

Third, in the present God uses the Bible as a current, active instrument for teaching the same truths to humanity. By accepting in faith God speaking through the Bible, people today have a second-hand knowledge of certain truths that God alone sees first-hand. Just as God illuminated the prophets and apostles in the light of prophecy to see what God alone sees, God also illuminates people today to have faith in God speaking through the Bible. This illumination is called the light of faith.

Just as one sees certain claims of natural reason by the light of natural reason, so the Christian faith hold certain claims beyond reason by the God-given light of faith. In the thought of Thomas Aquinas, the traditional distinction between two domains of truths and the distinctive way of knowing truth in each domain, reaches a point of clarity. This distinction is at the basis of the distinction between theology and natural theology.

Theology (in the Thomistic sense), as it later came to be called, is the program for inquiring by the light of faith into what one believes by faith to be truths beyond reason that are revealed by God. Natural theology, as it later came to be called, is the program for inquiring by the light of natural reason alone into whatever truths of natural reason human beings might be able to find about God. Theology and natural theology differ in what they inquire into, and in what manner they inquire. What theology inquires into is what God has revealed himself to be. What natural theology inquires into is what human intelligence can figure out about God without using any of the truths beyond reason, that is, the truths divinely revealed. Theology proceeds by taking God’s revelation as a given and using one divinely revealed truth to account for another divinely revealed truth (or to give a higher account of truths of natural reason). Natural theology proceeds by bracketing and setting aside God’s revelation and seeking to discover, verify, and organize truths of natural reason about God. Aquinas’s distinctions remain the historical source of how many contemporary theologians and philosophers characterize the differences of their respective disciplines.

To see how theology and natural theology differ for Aquinas, it may help to look into faith and theology in more detail. One seems blind in accepting on faith the truths of revelation found in the Bible. They seem blind because faith is a way of knowing something second-hand. A faithful person is in the position of believing what another intellect (the divine intellect) sees. Now although one does not see for oneself the truths accepted in faith, one desires to see them for oneself. Faith tends to prompt intellectual questioning, inquiry, and seeking into the meaning and intelligibility of the mystery held in faith. Why did God create the world? Why does God allow so much suffering? Why did God become Incarnate? Why did he have to die on a cross to save humanity? Many more questions come up. One asks questions of the truths of divine revelation without doubting those truths. On the contrary, one raises such questions because in faith one is confident that one truth of divine revelation can explain another truth of divine revelation. The truth of the Trinity’s purposes in creating us, for example, can explain the Incarnation. Thus, one questions the faith in faith. The project of questioning the faith in faith, finding answers, organizing them, justifying them, debating them, seeking to understanding “the why” and so forth is called theology.

Natural theology, on the other hand, does not presuppose faith as theology does. Natural theology does not attempt to explain truths beyond reason such as the Incarnation or the Trinity, and it certainly does not attempt to base anything on claims made in the Bible. Rather, natural theology uses other sources of evidence. Natural theology appeals to empirical data and the deliverances of reason to search out, verify, justify, and organize as much truth about God as can be figured out when one limits oneself to just these sources of evidence.

Aquinas practiced both theology and natural theology. Furthermore, he blended the two rather freely, and blended them into a unified architectonic wisdom. His architectonic contains both theology and natural theology (sometimes they are difficult to sort out).

Aquinas is primarily a theologian and his best-known work is his Summa Theologica. Aquinas saw himself as using truths of natural reason to help understand truths of divine revelation. Consequently, as part of his theology, Aquinas presents and refines many philosophical arguments (truths of natural reason) that he had inherited from multiple streams of his culture: Aristotle, Augustine, Boethius, Pseudo-Dionysius, Muslim philosophers and commentators on Aristotle, and the Jewish Rabbi Moses Maimonides. Aquinas saw himself as taking all the truth they had discovered and using it all to penetrate the meaning and intelligibility of what God is speaking through the bible.

In his Summa Contra Gentiles, Aquinas presents in lengthy detail a series of philosophical demonstrations of the existence of God, philosophical demonstrations of a variety of divine attributes, a philosophical theory of naming God, as well as multiple philosophical points concerning divine providence, for example, the problem of evil. For the first two volumes of the Summa Contra Gentiles, Aquinas proceeds without substantial appeal to the authority of Scripture (although Aquinas does repeatedly point to the agreement between what he arrived at philosophically and what Christians hold by faith in their Scriptures). He seems to intend his arguments to presuppose as little of the Christian faith as possible. The Summa Contra Gentiles, traditionally, was pointed out as one of the principal locations of Aquinas natural theology. One old interpretation of the Summa Contra Gentiles says that its purpose was to train Christian missionaries who would be required to engage Muslims in discussion and debate about God. Since Christians and Muslims held no common sacred texts, they would need to dispute in terms afforded by their common humanity, that is, the truths of natural reason. Another interpretation makes it out to be Aquinas’s own preparation for his SummaTtheologice (Hibbs, 1995).

Thomas Aquinas’s distinction of the two sorts of truths about God and the two ways of knowing the truth about God soon faced outbreaks of skepticism. That skepticism, ironically, led to several developments in natural theology.

6. Modern Philosophy and Natural Theology

Not long after Aquinas, certain philosophers began to doubt that knowledge of God could be obtained apart from divine revelation and faith. William of Ockham (1280 – 1348) rejected central theses of Aristotelian philosophy that Aquinas relied upon in arguing for the existence of God, divine attributes, divine providence, and so forth. Ockham rejected the Aristotelian theory of form. He believed that a world construed in terms of Aristotelian essences was incompatible with God and creation as revealed in Scripture. To Ockham, Aquinas’s God seemed subject to the natures of things rather than being their author in any significant sense. Nonetheless, Ockham was a Christian. Having rejected the Aristotelian theory of form and essence, natural theology as practiced by Aquinas was not possible. Of the two ways available for obtaining some knowledge of God – faith in revelation and reason without revelation – Ockham rejected the latter. Consequently, the only way remaining to know something of God was by faith in divine revelation.

After Ockham, the modern period abounded in various views towards natural theology. On the one hand, there were many who continued to hold that nature affords some knowledge of God and that human nature has some way of approaching God even apart from revelation. The scholastic thinker Francisco Suarez (1548-1617), for example, presented arguments for the existence of God, divine attributes, and divine providence. On the other hand, the rise of general anti-Aristotelianism (for example, Bacon), the rise of a mechanistic conception of the universe (for example, Hobbes, and the methodological decision to ignore final causality (for example, Descartes), all made traditional theological arguments for the existence of God from nature harder to sustain. Modern philosophy and modern science was perceived by many to threaten the traditional claims and conclusions of natural theology, for example, that the existence and attributes of God can be known apart from revelation and faith.

Many Christian thinkers responded to the new situation posed by modern philosophy and modern science. These responses shared with modern philosophy and modern science a non-Aristotelian, and perhaps even anti-Aristotelian, line of thought. Consequently, these responses constitute a thoroughly non-Aristotelian form of natural theology, that is, a natural theology that does not presuppose any of Aristotle’s views on nature, motion, causality, and so forth.

Descartes himself, for example, is commonly thought to have offered a new version of the ontological argument (Anselm’s argument) for the existence of God. Descartes advanced his argument in such a way that not only did he intend to avoid any Aristotelian presuppositions about the external world, he apparently intended to avoid any presuppositions at all about the external world – even the presupposition of its existence. Descartes’ rationalist and a priori method characterized much of the natural theology on the continent of Europe. In Great Britain, there grew up another form of natural theology tending to use empirical starting points and consciously probabilistic forms of argument. Two examples are noteworthy in this regard. Samuel Clark’s (1675 – 1729) work A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God and Joseph Butler’s (1692 – 1752) Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed. The former latter work begins from the fact, presumably accessible empirically, that something or other has always existed. It proceeds to argue for the existence of God and various attributes, for example, God’s infinity and omnipresence. The latter work offers a probabilistic argument in favor of the existence of God and certain attributes based on analogies between what is found in nature and what is found in revelation.

David Hume (1711 – 1761) offered perhaps the most poignant criticisms of the post-Aristotelian forms of natural theology. His Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding contained a chapter criticizing the justification for belief in miracles as well as a chapter leveled against arguments from design. The latter criticism against design arguments, as well as additional criticisms of various divine attributes, was offered in much more extensive detail in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. The latter work was more extensive in that it applied some of the central tenets of Hume’s epistemology to natural theology in general, and thus served as a sort of critique of natural theology as a whole. Inspired by Hume’s thought, the empiricist critique of natural theology would later take on even more expanded and sophisticated forms.

David Hume’s agnostic and atheistic conclusions, however, did not find much popular appeal in his own day. Hence, even after Hume’s death, William Paley (1743 – 1805) was able to advance a natural theology that became standard reading in universities for the first half of the nineteenth century. Paley’s Natural Theology or Evidences of the Existence and Attributes of the Deity formulated a version of the design argument that even convinced the early Charles Darwin. Although Hume did not dissuade his contemporaries such as Paley from doing natural theology, Hume still had a significant impact on natural theology through his influence on Immanuel Kant.

Immanuel Kant (1724 – 1804) found himself faced on the one side with a rationalism that made quite ambitious metaphysical claims and on the other side with an empiricism that allowed humans to know little beyond what was immediately sensible. The rationalists claimed to offer in modo geometrico, a series of demonstrations of many truths about God proceeding from a set of axioms self-evident to reason and needing no empirical verification. Later, their approach would be called a priori. The empiricists followed a different course, and stressed the human incapacity to know substantive necessary truths, or at least Hume seems to have stressed this or Hume as Kant understood him. Kant became skeptical of the rationalist’s metaphysical ambitions, yet was eager to overcome the Humean skepticism that threatened not only metaphysics but the new science as well. In his work, Kant is widely thought to have posed perhaps the most significant argumentative challenge to theology, natural theology, and metaphysics in general.

For Kant, arguments for the existence of God cannot prove their point due to the limits of the human cognitive capacity. The apparent cogency of such arguments is due to transcendental illusion; confusing the constitution of things and the constitution of one’s thought or experience of things. For example, causal principles such as “every event has a cause” are nothing but requirements for the rational organization of our perceptions. Demonstrations of God’s existence, divine attributes, and divine providence, to the extent that they use such principles as premises concerning the constitution of things in themselves, are illusory. Henceforth, any attempt to do classical theology, natural theology, or metaphysics had to answer the Kantian challenge.

Natural theology after Kant took two various routes. In Protestant and Anglican circles, the influence of Paley and others suffered a blow from Charles Darwin’s (1809 – 1882) theory of evolution and the subsequent evolutionary theories that have been developed. Given Darwin, the proposition that all life developed by chance alone is widely perceived to have a degree of plausibility that it was not perceived to have in Paley’s day. Whether and to what extent Darwinian principles eliminate the necessity for positing a divine designer is one of the most hotly contested issues in natural theology today. But there was more to post-Kantian natural theology.

In Catholic circles, natural theology went in two directions. On the one hand, there were some who intended to use modern philosophy for theological purposes just as the mediaevals had done. Antonio Rosmini (1797 – 1855), for example, developed a theology and a natural theology using elements from Augustine, Bonaventure, Pascal, and Malebranche. On the other hand, there were some who revived the thought of Thomas Aquinas. At first, there were but a handful of neo-Thomists. But in time Thomism was not only revived, but disseminated through a vast system of Catholic education. Thomists disagreed amongst each other on how to relate to strands of contemporary thought such as science and Kant. So neo-Thomism grew in many directions: Transcendental Thomism, Aristotelian Thomism, Existential Thomism, and so forth. At any rate, neo-Thomists tended to develop their own counter-reading of modern philosophy – especially Kant – and to use Thomistic natural theology as an apparatus for higher education and apologetics.

7. Natural Theology Today

Outside neo-Thomistic circles, natural theology was generally out of favor throughout the twentieth century. Due to neo-Kantian criticisms of metaphysics, an extreme confidence in contemporary science, a revival and elaboration of Humean empiricism in the form of logical positivism, as well as existentialism among Continental thinkers, metaphysics was thought to be forever eliminated as a way of knowing or understanding truth about God (or anything at all for that matter). Natural theology was thought to have suffered the same fate as being part of metaphysics. It is fair to say that in many places metaphysics and natural theology were even held in contempt. Towards the second half of the twentieth century, however, the tide began to turn – first in favor of the possibility of metaphysics and soon afterwards to a revival of natural theology.

Natural theology today is practiced with a degree of diversity and confidence unprecedented since the late Middle Ages. Natural theologians have revived and extended arguments like Anselm’s (the so-called “perfect being theology”). They have also re-cast arguments from nature in several forms – from neo-Thomistic presentations of Aquinas’s five ways to new teleological arguments drawing upon the results of contemporary cosmology. Arguments from the reality of an objective moral order to the existence of God are circulated and taken seriously. Ethical theories that define goodness in terms of divine command are considered live options among an array of ethical theories. Discussions of divine attributes abound in books and journals devoted exclusively to purely philosophical treatments of God, for example, the journal Faith and Philosophy. Debates rage over divine causality, the extent of God’s providence, and the reality of human free choice. The problem of evil has also been taken up anew for fresh discussions – both by those who see it as arguing against the existence of God and by those who wish to defend theism against the reality of evil. It is English speaking “analytic” philosophers who have taken the lead in discussing and debating these topics.

For people of faith who wish to think through their faith, to see whether reason alone apart from revelation offers anything to corroborate, clarify, or justify what is held by faith, there is no shortage of materials to research or study or criticize. Rather, vast quantities of books, articles, debates, discussions, conferences, and gatherings are available. For those who have no faith, but wish to inquire into God without faith, the same books, articles, debates, discussion, conferences, and gatherings are available. Natural theology is alive and well to assist anyone interested grappling with the perennial questions about God.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. Ancient Mediaeval Theology

  • Plato, Republic, particularly Bk. VII.
    • The so-called “Allegory of the Cave” in the opening pages of Bk. VII was an influential text upon later conceptions of God and the Good.
  • Aristotle, Physics, particularly Bk. VII & VIII.
    • The locus classicus for the argument from motion for the existence of a first, unmoved mover.
  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, particularly Bk. XII
    • This passage takes the argument of the Physics Bks. VII & VIII a step further by arguing that the first mover moves things as an end or goal and is intelligent.

ii. Mediaeval Natural Theology

  • Augustine, Confessions, trans. Chadwick, Henry. Oxford, 1992.
    • A classic autobiographical account of a thinking man’s journey to faith in the Christian God. In Bk.VI, Augustine draws a distinction between things demonstrable and things to be taken on authority.
  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, trans. Williams, Thomas. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1993.
    • Out of the many works of St. Augustine, Bks. II & III in this work come as close as possible to presenting an argument for the existence of God. Augustine considers eternal truths, the order of the world, and the nature of reason, and proceeds to discuss the relationship between these things and the wisdom the pre-existed that world. Many students find this dialogue satisfying to read.
  • Boethius, The Consolation of Philosophy. trans. Green, Richard. New York: Macmillan Publishing Company, 1962.
    • A shorter work, cast in semi-dialogue form, that synthesizes and presents a great deal of late Hellenistic natural theology. It is fair to call this work one of the principal sources of mediaeval humanism and philosophy. Many students find this work satisfying to read.
  • Plotinus, Enneads. trans. MacKenna, Stephen. New York: Larson Publications, 1992.
    • A lengthy work of neo-Platonic cosmology and natural theology. Being the work of a non-Christian, it shows (like Aristotle’s works) that someone without Christian faith commitments can engage in natural theology. However, Plotinus’ sympathies lie more with Plato’s notion of a dialectically induced vision of the Good than with a demonstrative approach to proving the existence of God. Consequently, there are many passages of a more mystical and meditative quality intended for those who have had the prerequisite perceptions of the One.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius, “Letter Nine” in The Complete Works. trans. Luibheid, Colm. New Jersey: Paulist Press, 1987.
    • Presents the distinction between natural and mystical theology and the two ways of knowing that are proper to each.
  • Anselm, “Monologion” & “Proslogion” both in The Major Works. Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • The Proslogion contains the so-called “ontological argument” for the existence of God. The Monologion, in its first two dozen chapters, presents a natural theology by way of unpacking what is involved in the notion of a supreme nature.
  • Aquinas, SummaTtheologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. New York: Benziger Bros, 1948 .
    • The classic theological work by Thomas Aquinas. In part I, q. 2 – 27, Aquinas presents numerous philosophical arguments for the existence of God, divine attributes, divine providence, and so forth. Often called the “Treatise on God,” it is a classic locus of natural theology.
  • Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles, esp. trans. Pegis, Anton. University of Notre Dame Press, 1975.
    • In Bks. I & II, Aquinas presents what he considers to be demonstrations for the existence of God, several divine attributes, and an account of divine providence. For these two books, a great deal of the thinking is commonly thought to proceed in the light of natural reason alone.
  • Bonaventure, The Journey of the Mind to God. trans. Boehner, Philotheus. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1993.
    • A short work of mediaeval natural theology. A contemporary of Aquinas, Bonaventure takes the reader on a journey from creatures to the Creator. This book shows what an alternative to Aquinas’s Aristotelian natural theology looks like.

iii. Modern Natural Theology

  • Butler, Joseph. The Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, to the Constitution and Course of Nature. Ann Arbor, MI: Scholarly Publishing Office, University of Michigan Library, 2005.
    • A classic of English natural theology with an extended treatment of the immortality of the soul. The author ventures a probabilistic argument in confirmation of certain revealed truths.
  • Clark, Samuel. A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God: And Other Writings. Ed. Vailato, Ezio. Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • This treatise of English natural theology was originally a set of sermons preached against the writings of Hobbes and Spinoza and their followers. Those sermons were revised into an extended and rigorous argument.
  • Descartes, Rene. “Meditations” in Selected Philosophical Writings. trans. Cottingham, John., Stoothoff, Robert., Murdoch, Dougald. Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • In the “Third Meditation,” Descartes advances an argument for the existence of God that some have called an “ontological argument” because he infers from his idea of God to the existence of God.
  • Locke, John. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Oxford University Press, 1975.
    • In Bk. IV, ch. 10 John Locke advances what he considers to be a demonstration of the existence of an eternal and necessary being. The chapter is an example of how arguments for the existence of God continued to be advanced well into early modernity by post-Aristotelian thinkers.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1977.
    • A brief classical essay in empiricist philosophy. The principles presented in this book served first to motivate Kant to mount his criticisms of metaphysics and natural theology and continue to motivate many of today’s criticisms of arguments for the existence of God, divine attributes, and so forth.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion: The Posthumous Essays of the Immortality of the Soul and of Suicide. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Co., 1998.
    • This dialogue is an extended application of Hume’s epistemology, and in effect a critique of natural theology as an enterprise.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Pure Reason. trans. Smith, Norman Kemp. NY: St. Martin’s Press. 1929.
    • This classical work stands as a permanent challenge to anyone aiming at arriving at some knowledge or understanding of God by the light of natural reason alone. The work is no easy read – not even for specialists. However, in Part II, Second Division, Chapter II, Kant presents his famous “antinomies of pure reason.” The antinomies are arguments, laid out in synopsis form, both for and against certain theses. Of all the criticism of metaphysics that can be found in this book, the antinomies in particular have persuaded many thinkers to hold that any attempt by reason alone to arrive at some knowledge of God is bound to end in hopeless self-contradiction. See especially the Fourth Antinomy.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics. trans. Ellington, James W. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1977.
    • This shorter work summarizes and presents in simpler form much of the thought found in the longer and more elaborate Critique of Pure Reason.
  • Newman, John Henry Cardinal. An Essay in Aid of a Grammar of Assent. University of Notre Dame Press, 1979.
    • A classic work of nineteenth century British apologetics. Among many other things, Newman presents an account of how conscience moves one to believe in the existence of God.

iv. Contemporary Natural Theology

  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, ed. The Evidential Argument from Evil. Indiana University Press, 1996.
    • An excellent anthology of essays, all treating of the problem of evil, by contemporary philosophers. The collection contains some essays arguing against the existence of God on the basis of evil and other essays defending the existence of God against such arguments.
  • Kenny, Anthony. The Five Ways: St. Thomas Aquinas’ proofs of the existence of God. London: Routledge & K. Paul, 1969.
    • A short work that goes through Aquinas’s arguments for the existence of God and treats them in terms of contemporary formal logic. Kenny concludes that all the arguments fail.
  • Mackie, J.L., The Miracle of Theism: Arguments for and against the existence of God. Oxford University Press, 1982.
    • A widely read work that presents a wide variety of arguments for the existence of God, criticizes them, and ultimately rejects them all. It also contains important discussions of who has the burden of proof in natural theology and arguments against the existence of God based on the reality of evil.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. God and Other Minds. Cornell University Press, 1967.
    • Another work that presents several standard proofs for the existence of God and criticizes them. The author, however, is a theist. After dismissing the standard proofs for the existence of God as inconclusive or indecisive, Plantinga goes on to give an argument that belief in the existence of God can be rational even without such proofs. He argues that believing in God is analogous to believing in other minds. Just as one is rational in believing in other minds without decisive or conclusive proof that other minds exist, so one is rational in believing in God without decisive or conclusive proof that God exists.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. God, Freedom, & Evil. William B. Eerdmans Publishing Co., 1977.
    • This widely hailed work purports to refute the thesis that it is impossible for both God and evil to exist. Using the modal logic that he helped to pioneer, Plantinga shows how it is possible for both God and evil to exist. Even atheist philosophers find Plantinga’s point to be compelling, and the terms of the debate on the problem of evil have changed since, and because of, the book’s publication. For the current state of the debate, see Howard-Snyder’s work referenced above.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
     Swinburne, Richard. The Existence of God. 2nd Edition. Oxford University Press, 2004.
    Swinburne, Richard. Providence and the Problem of Evil. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.

    • These three books by Richard Swinburne jointly constitute a powerful argument for, and defense of, the existence of God. In The Coherence of Theism, Swinburne answers common arguments advanced against the possibility of the existence of God or arguing for the existence of God. In The Existence of God, Swinburne presents his “cumulative case” inductive argument for the existence of God. In Providence and the Problem of Evil, Swinburne aims to account for the existence of evil given the existence of a provident God.
  • Varghese, Roy Abraham. The Wonder of the World: A Journey from Modern Science to the Mind of God. Arizona: Tyr Publishing, 2004.
    • This work brings together under one cover many of the scientifically received facts that tend to confirm the existence of God. One can find laid out here many of the physical, biological, and cosmological facts that have persuaded many contemporary scientists of the existence of an intelligent God behind it all. The work also raises pertinent philosophical considerations in favor of the same conclusion. Written in semi-dialogue form, without using significant technical jargon, this award-winning book is accessible to a wide audience.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Craig, William Lane. The Cosmological Argument from Plato to Leibniz. NY: Barnes & Noble Books, 1980.
    • The book does what the title says; it gives a history of the various cosmological arguments from ancient times until modernity.
  • Congar, Yves. A History of Theology. NY: Doubleday, 1968.
    • A good one-volume summary of the history of theology. This book served as the basic reference for section 3 above in the discussion of ancient Greek theology, and the development of theology among early Christians.
  • Davies, Brian. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. Oxford University Press, 1982.
    • This widely used textbook presents most of the main topics in the philosophy of religion today – including arguments in natural theology.
  • Hibbs, Thomas. Dialectic and Narrative in Aquinas: An Interpretation of the Summa Contra Gentiles. University of Notre Dame Press, 1995.
    • This book was referenced above as presenting an alternative interpretation to the Summa Contra Gentiles.
  • LeClerq, Jean. The Love of Learning and the Desire for God. trans. Misrah, Catharine. Fordham University Press, 1982.
    • This book was referenced in the fourth section above as regards the state of theology in mediaeval monasteries.
  • Stump, Eleonore. “Aquinas on the Sufferings of Job” in The Evidential Argument from Evil. ed. Howard-Snyder, Daniel. Indiana University Press, 1996.
    • An unusually clear elucidation of Aquinas’ understanding of the relationship between God and evil as Aquinas presents it in his commentary on Job.
  • Stump, Eleonore, ed. Philosophy of Religion. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 1999.
    • An anthology of classic texts on many topics in the philosophy of religion. Many of the texts referenced in this list are found within this anthology.

Author Information

James Brent
Saint Louis University
U. S. A.

Last updated: October 22, 2008 | Originally published: