Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Theophrastus (c. 371—c. 287 B.C.E.)

TheophrastusTheophrastus was a Greek philosopher of the Peripatetic school, and immediate successor of Aristotle in leadership of the Lyceum. He was a native of Eresus in Lesbos, and studied philosophy at Athens, first under Plato and afterwards under Aristotle. He became the favorite pupil of Aristotle, who named Theophrastus his successor, and bequeathed to him his library and manuscripts of his own writings. Theophrastus sustained the Aristotelian character of the Lyceum. He is said to have had 2,000 disciples, among them the comic poet Menander. He was esteemed by the kings Philippus, Cassander, and Ptolemy. He was tried for impiety, but acquitted by the Athenian jury. He died in 287 BCE, having presided over the Lyceum about thirty-five years. His age is sometimes put at 85, and 107 by others. He is said to have closed his life with the complaint about the short duration of human life, that it ended just when the insight into its problems was beginning.

Although Theophrastus generally followed Aristotle's lead in philosophy, he was no mere slavish imitator, and he continued important empirical and philosophical investigations of his own. Very little of his work survives, but he seems in general to have emphasized the empiricist side of Aristotle's thought and downplayed remaining Platonist elements, a trend that was further continued by Theophrastus' successor as head of the Lyceum, Strato. Theophrastus criticized some of Aristotle's arguments for the existence of a Prime Mover, and he expressed dissatisfaction with Aristotle's universal application of teleological (that is, goal-directed) explanations. Theophrastus also composed a large compendium of the doctrines of previous philosophers, which itself is lost, but which probably formed the basis for much of the later doxography which is our main source of information on the pre-Socratic philosophers.

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