The term “Tibet” refers to a geographic area around the Himalayan mountains and the culture which originated there. Tibetan thought is a living tradition of rigorous argumentation, psychological insights, and philosophically relevant ideas concerning metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and moral psychology. It has a rigorous and formal system of philosophical debate and a wealth of meditative traditions, both of which provide insights for the nature of reality, the self, and truth.
Though it is strongly influenced by earlier Indian Buddhist philosophy, it offers a range of perspectives on these issues and presents many insights and practices of its own. This article will provide an overview of topics that have been influential in Tibetan thought and attempt to emphasize topics that are indigenously Tibetan or have been significantly developed by Tibetan thinkers. It is important to keep in mind that Tibetan intellectual culture often treats innovation differently than that of the West. When a thinker comes up with a new distinction, argument, or practice it is likely to be attributed to an older, often Indian, source for various reasons including (but by no means limited to) modesty, authority, loyalty, or admiration.
Though this article avoids assuming a background knowledge of Buddhism, an understanding of the basic ideas and worldview of Buddhism, in particular Mahāyāna Buddhism, is essential for understanding Tibetan philosophy.
The italicized parenthetical terms are Tibetan unless otherwise noted and they are transliterated using the Wylie system. They are not meant to be essential for understanding the ideas of the article and are provided to avoid the confusion caused by different writers using different English glosses.
The term “Tibetan” refers to a cultural sphere that includes not only the present day Tibetan Autonomous Region, but also parts of Sichuan, Yunnan, Gansu, and Qinghai provinces of the People’s Republic of China as well as areas of Nepal, Bhutan, and northern India. Though the spoken language of Tibetan in these areas is quite diverse (and often mutually unintelligible), they share a common written heritage of literature, poetry, song, and philosophical texts. However, Tibetan philosophy is very much a living tradition with a variety of philosophical views and topical emphases.
Buddhism has had a profound influence on Tibetan thought and culture. Buddhism began to gain influence in Tibet after it became favored by king Songtsän Gampo around 641 CE. However, there is also an indigenous Tibetan religion known as Bön (bon). Despite a somewhat competitive history, Bön and Buddhism have influenced each other greatly, making it difficult to draw a clear distinction between the two.
Today there are four main sects of Tibetan Buddhism. The difference between sects is not always purely philosophical but often involves which practices, lineage masters, and texts they emphasize and also which translations they use. The four major sects are:
The Gelug, the sect of the Dalai Lamas, came to hold the majority of the political power from the seventeenth century onward. Since the late nineteenth century a non-sectarian movement (ris med) encouraged by the current Dalai Lama has become popular and fostered a more open approach between sects and a mixing of practices.
The texts of Tibetan Buddhist Canon are divided into two sections. The “Translated Words” or the Kangyur (bka’ ‘gyur), which are texts that are said to be the teaching of the Buddha and the “Translated Teachings” or the Tengyur (bstan ‘gyur), which are treatises and commentaries written by Indian and Tibetan authors.
Unlike Western Philosophy since the Enlightenment, there is no rigid separation between religion and philosophy in Tibetan thought. This does not mean that Tibetan philosophy is essentially non-rational or superstitious in nature and should not preclude philosophical interest; not anymore than references to Apollo in Plato or God in Descartes prevents philosophers from finding interesting philosophical theses in their works. However, this lack of separation between the religious and philosophical does mean that a modern reader must keep in mind that Tibetan thinkers are likely to have aims and motives outside those usually found in Western philosophy.
Being overwhelmingly Buddhist in nature, Tibetan philosophy has a soteriological aim; one engages in philosophical investigation not only to gain an understanding of the world, but so that such an understanding can aid in eliminating suffering. For Buddhists, all human suffering arises from misunderstanding the nature of the world; through study and philosophical reflection one can come to have a better grasp of the nature of reality —particularly of suffering and its causes. When one understands this, one can avoid much suffering by beginning to act and cultivate dispositions that are in accord with reality. Modern philosophical theorizing in the West is commonly thought to aim at discovering the nature of reality or of the best way to live. However, such theorizing does not often include the aim of integrating such a view of reality into everyday actions or cultivating one’s own dispositions so as to actually live in the best way possible. For Tibetans and the Buddhist tradition more generally, since the goal of philosophical investigation is to produce a practical result, one deals not only with questions like “What is the best way to act?” but also “How can I come to act that way?”
The distinctive form of Tibetan debate (rtsod pa) plays an important part of philosophical investigations in Tibetan intellectual communities. It is central in the Gelug sect, in particular those earning their kenpo (mkhan po) degrees, though it is also practiced in other sects to varying degrees. The practice involves a seated defender (dam bca’ ba) and a standing challenger (rigs lam pa). The roles are quite different; the defender must assert a thesis and attempts to defend its truth. The challenger, however, asks questions in an attempt to get the defender to accept statements that are contradictory (for example, both “all colors are white” and “there is a color that is red”) or absurd (for example, “the color of a white religious conch shell is red”). The challenger is not held responsible for the truth content of the questions; like someone raising an objection at a lecture, the challenger does not have to assert any thesis, but only aims to show that the defender is mistaken.
The debate begins with the challenger invoking Mañjuśrī, the bodhisattva of wisdom. This invocation is variously interpreted, but can be seen most generally as a reminder to the debaters that they are aiming at wisdom, at finding out the truth about the subject. The challenger then sets the topic of debate by asking a question to which the defender replies and reveals his thesis. The challenger may ask questions to clarify the defender’s thesis or establish common assumptions or simply begin the debate. During the debate, the challenger raises questions of a particular form; a complete question is one that contains a subject, predicate, and a reason. For example, the question “(Do you agree that) the subject, Socrates, is mortal because of being a man (?)” ascribes a predicate (being mortal) to the subject (Socrates) in virtue of a reason (being a man). When an element is omitted or ambiguous, the defender is allowed to clarify, but upon receiving a complete question, the defender has three possible replies:
If the defender thinks that the proposed relationship between the subject, predicate, and reason holds, then she responds with “I accept.” When the subject does not correspond to the reason, the defender asserts that the reason is not established. For example, “Socrates is mortal because of being an elephant” would warrant this reply because the reason, being an elephant, does not apply to the subject, Socrates. The denial of pervasion, a Tibetan innovation that is not found in earlier Indian Buddhist debate system of Dharmakīrti, claims that the reason does not entail the predicate. There are two kinds of failures of pervasion — one of uncertainty (ma nges pa) and one of contradiction or exclusion (’gal pa). “Socrates is a philosopher because of being a man” is uncertain because some but not all men are philosophers; the reason, being a man, does not entail the predicate, being a philosopher. “Socrates is a reptile because of being a man” is contradictory because the terms “men” and “reptile” are exclusive; there are no men that are reptiles.
Metaphysics and epistemology in Tibet are deeply rooted in Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist philosophy. A focal question concerns what, if anything, has an intrinsic, unchanging essence or nature (Sanskrit: svabhāva)? One may ask about a chair or one’s self if there is some intrinsic chair-ness or self-ness to be found. The two major schools that came to Tibet from Indian Mahāyāna Buddhism, Yogācāra (the “Mind Only” school) and Mādhyamaka (the “Middle Way” school) provide somewhat different answers to this.
The Yogācāra school, associated with Vasubandhu and his half-brother Asaṅga, replies that awareness or consciousness is the only thing with an intrinsic essence. The general idea is that while what we perceive as reality might not have an intrinsic nature, the awareness that we have of the flow of such perceptions does have such a nature. This school is sometimes compared with German Idealism in the West.
The Mādhyamaka school, founded by Nāgārjuna, denies that anything has an unchanging essence; this is known as the Doctrine of Emptiness (Sanskrit: śūnyatā). To say that all phenomena are empty is to say that they are empty of a stable and unconditioned essence — tables have no intrinsic table-ness and selves have no intrinsic self-ness. This may sound extreme, but Mādhyamaka sees itself as being a middle way between the extremes of positing an entity with an eternal essence and the nihilistic denial of any existence at all (to say a chair lacks an unchanging essence is not to say that it does not exist at all). Though the Mādhyamaka view, championed by the Gelug sect, is often seen in Tibet as the higher teaching, both Yogācāra and Mādhyamaka ideas are present.
Within the Mādhyamaka school there is a distinction over the proper method of discourse with non-Mādhyamaka philosophers, specifically whether or not it is appropriate to make positive assertions in debate. The Svātantrika view, associated with Bhāvaviveka, permits the use of assertions and independent syllogisms in debate. However, the Prāsaṅgika view, attributed to Chandrakīrti and Buddhapālita, permits only the use of logical consequences, a kind of negative method of reductio ad absurdum to establish the Mādhyamaka view in debate. Anything else, they contend, would give the impression that they accept the unconditioned essence of any of the topics under debate. This method has been compared with that of Wittgenstein (at least the Wittgenstein of the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus) and the Skeptics of ancient Greece.
It is important to note that this distinction is an indigenous Tibetan one; there is no evidence of either of the terms being used by Indian Mādhyamaka philosophers. The Sanskrit terms Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika are inventions of Western scholars to translate the Tibetan terms rang rgyud pa (the Autonomists or Svātantrika) and thal ’gyur pa (the Consequentialists or Prāsaṅgika). Through the influence of the immensely important Gelug thinker Tsongkhapa, the Prāsaṅgika became the more influential view in Tibet. A clear and accessible entry point to these issues can be found in Jamgön Mipham’s Introduction to the Middle Way.
A seminal concept in Mādhyamaka thought, and in Mahāyāna Buddhism generally, is the idea that there are two truths: a conventional or nominal truth (Sanskrit: saṃvṛti-satya) and an ultimate truth (Sanskrit: paramārtha-satya). The idea is similar to Berkeley’s dictum that we think with the learned, but speak with the vulgar; we can accept certain conventions without thinking them to be ultimately real. The notion can be understood epistemically or metaphysically; the term rendered here as “truth” (Sanskrit: satya, Tibetan: bden pa) can mean “true” in the sense of a true proposition but also “real” in the sense of something actually existing in the way that it appears. Suppose one were to stumble upon a friend watching a Felix the Cat cartoon ask him what is happening. The friend is likely to reply with something like, “Felix just got hit on the head with a hammer and he’s mad.” The reply is conventionally true; the question was asked from within a system of conventions — one that assumes there are entities called characters that can perform actions and feel emotions — and the reply is true within those conventions. When pressed, both may well admit that the ultimate truth is quite different; in fact there is no Felix, simply a series of lines organized in a certain way so as to create drawings that bear a resemblance to a cat, which, when shown in rapid succession create the visual illusion of actions, events, and emotions. This is the ultimate truth about what is really happening, but to reply in this way would be both impolite and pragmatically unhelpful. The view has some affinities with fictionalism in Western philosophy in that both acknowledge some value in claims that are metaphysically ungrounded.
For the Mādhyamaka philosopher, talk of physical objects, persons, causes, and all other phenomena is true only in the conventional sense. One issue of debate in Tibet has been the relationship between the Two Truths. A radical view advocated in the fourteenth century by Dolpopa claims that the Two Truths are completely separate, advocating a doctrine called Emptiness of Other (gzhan stong) — the ideal that emptiness itself has a stable and unchanging nature. The prevailing view, advocated by Tsongkhapa and the Gelug tradition, proposes a deep unity between the two truths. This view holds the distinction between the conventional and ultimate reality to be itself merely conventional, a doctrine called Emptiness of Self (rang stong). On this view, the property of lacking an essential nature is nothing more than a conventional designation (for more on this see Kapstein 2001 pp.221ff). The idea that emptiness itself is not an ultimately real property — the emptiness of emptiness — is taken to be paradoxical to varying degrees (see Garfield 1995 pp. 319-321 and Hayes 1994) and it is said to be one of the most difficult and subtle points in Mādhyamaka philosophy.
The Two Truths are especially important when one keeps in mind the soteriological aim of Buddhist philosophy; it allows a place for teachings that are not strictly speaking true, but benefit the student. The language used in Tibetan to translate “conventional truth” reflects this; the most common terms, both translated into English as “conventional” are tanyé (tha snyad) and kundzob (kun rdzob). The former means simply a mental label for something, a conventional sign for communications, while the latter, kundzob, means something that obscures, hides, or fakes. The distinction suggests two sorts of conventional truth; those that obscure the ultimate truth and those that do not. This finds support in common sense as some false speech is used to obscure reality, as in that of political spinsters, while other false speech is used to illuminate a truth about reality, such as telling a fictional story to teach a truth about human psychology. This distinction is explained in greater detail at Garfield (2002) pp.60ff, where he notes that emptiness itself is conventional in the illuminating tanyé sense, but not in the concealing kundzob sense.
There are also more meditative practices that allow the meditator to experience the emptiness of phenomena in a more direct way. One tradition, associated with the Kagyu sect and known in Sanskrit as Mahāmudrā (Tibetan: phyag rgya chen po) meaning “The Great Seal”). Another tradition known as Dzogchen (rdzogs chen) or “The Great Perfection” has its roots in the Bön and Nyingma traditions. These practices tend to emphasize first-hand experience and the relationship with a qualified teacher.
The core of these practices involves close observation of the mind at rest and during the arising and passing of thoughts and emotions. Through this kind of meditation one comes to see one’s own true nature (ngo rang) and directly experience emptiness. These mediations are often described with language suggesting spontaneity, immediacy, and ineffability — a non-conceptual and non-dualistic awareness of reality, which is taken to be in some sense perfect as it is. To many, these features evoke affinities with mysticism that put it outside the purview of modern Analytic philosophy, though epistemological issues like introspection, phenomenology, and the limits of language are relevant.
The ethics of Tibetan philosophy is inextricably linked to Buddhist ethics, in particular the ideas of Mahāyāna Buddhism. The Mahāyāna Buddhist tradition is far too varied and vast to be adequately covered here, so what follows is a small sampling of some of the issues that have received a good deal of attention in Tibetan thought and some of the indigenous Tibetan innovations.
A concept central to the distinction between Mahāyāna (“The Greater Vehicle”) and the earlier Therevāda (“The School of the Elders”) Buddhism is that of the Bodhisattva. The term “bodhisattva” (literally “enlightenment-being”) in the older Pāli literature is used to describe the Buddha before he became enlightened. There is a collection of stories of the Buddha’s previous lives, known as the Jātaka Tales, which describe how the Buddha of our time behaved in his previous lives as an animal, human, or other creature. The tales teach a moral by describing the selfless and virtuous actions of the Buddha-to-be and in these tales he is called a bodhisattva. The ideal, however, in Therevāda Buddhism is one who is awakened and escaped suffering — a Buddha.
In Mahāyāna Buddhism the Bodhisattva began to take on a more central role as a spiritual and ethical ideal. Bodhisattvas, rather than becoming enlightened and escaping the sufferings of this world, choose to forgo their own enlightenment and remain in this world in order to relieve the suffering of others. The idea is rooted in earlier Indian thought, such as the classic, Way of the Bodhisattva (Sanskrit: Bodhicaryāvatāra) by Śāntideva, the emphasis on the Bodhisattva figure and the ideal of selfless compassion are central to ethics in Tibet as well. Scores of texts composed in Tibetan praise the Bodhisattva and their motives (Sanskrit: bodhicitta) from Thogmé Zangpo’s Thirty-Seven Practices of Bodhisattvas (Tibetan: rgyal sras lag len so bdun ma) to the more recent Vast as the Heavens, Deep as the Sky (Tibetan: byang chub sems kyi bstod pa rin chen sgron ma) by Khunu Rinpoche.
Modern scholars disagree about the most accurate way to view Buddhist ethics in terms of the standard Western ethical categories. Buddhist ethics seems to have affinities with all of the major ethical theories in the West. Its emphasis on the elimination of suffering is similar to Utilitarian theories like that of Jeremy Bentham, its emphasis on a universal outlook is similar to the Kantian claims about the categorical imperative, and its Bodhisattva seems similar to the sort of ideal agents imagined in Virtue Ethics.
Naturally, there are problems with each interpretation. It is not clear that the Utilitarian framework can account for the intrinsic value given to certain motivations and the intrinsic value given to skillful actions; for example, one might think that skillful actions (Sanskrit: kuśala) lead to the elimination of suffering because they are right, not vice versa. It is also not clear that a Kantian framework can accommodate the central role of compassion and sympathy and given the importance of the consequences of actions given in Buddhist ethics, the Kantian framework seems ill-fitting.
The view championed by Damien Keown is a characterization of Buddhist ethics in terms of Aristotelian virtue ethics. For Aristotle, one develops certain character traits so that one may achieve flourishing (Greek: eudaimonia). Similarly, argues Keown, the bodhisattva develops certain traits with the goal of achieving freedom from suffering (Sanskrit: nirvana). The argument claims that flourishing and freedom both function as a goal for which the development of good traits is cultivated. But many scholars, famously Peter Harvey, claim that Buddhist ethics cannot be placed entirely in any single Western category. Instead, they see Buddhist ethics as being best understood as having similarities with each, though not exclusively falling into any particular one.
A popular genre of ethical advice in Tibet is that of Legshé (legs bshad) or “Elegant Sayings.” These are related to the Indian subhāṣita format and are unusually secular in content for Tibetan literature. They are in verse form, usually with four line stanzas with seven syllables per line. Commonly studied in schools and memorized, these are very popular among Tibetans and often familiar to non-scholars.
The most popular of these texts, The Elegant Sayings of Sakya Paṇḍita (sa skya legs bshad) was composed by Sakya Paṇḍita, an important figure in the Sakya sect around the Thirteenth century. The content often concerns the traits and conduct of wise (mkhas pa), noble (ya rabs) and foolish (blun po) people along with other advice regarding common human problems and tendencies. The advice is often juxtaposed with a metaphor or similar case from everyday life. For example, regarding determining who is wise, Sakya Paṇḍita writes:
Without questioning a wise person,
One cannot measure their depth.
Without striking a drum with a stick,
One cannot distinguish it from other drums.
Important topics include the best attitude towards achievement and failure, praise and blame, wealth, anger, and work (among others). Sakya Paṇḍita’s text inspired many similar texts, popularly Virtuous Good Advice (dge ldan legs bshad) by Panchan Sonam Drakpa, which is quite similar to Sakya Paṇḍita’s text and A Treatise on Water and Wood (chu shing bstan bcos) by Gung Thang Tenpé Dronmé, which uses only forest and water imagery. A more detailed introduction to Legshé literature and a translation of Sakya Paṇḍita’s text can be found in John Davenport’s Ordinary Wisdom.
A conceptual frame that became important in Tibet is the idea of stages on the path to enlightenment (lam rim). Its roots are in the Indian Buddhist idea of Bodhisattva Stages (Sanskrit: bodhisattva-bhumi) though the notion took hold through the Bengali monk Atiśa, who was invited to Tibet to clarify the teachings early in the eleventh century. In his Lamp for the Path to Enlightenment (byang chub lam gyi sgron ma), Atiśa distinguishes three kinds of persons/abilities (skyes bu gsum):
Those of Small Ability can seek only worldly pleasures and are concerned with their own happiness and their future well-being. Those of Intermediate Ability are able to reject worldly pleasures, but seek to end only their own suffering. Those of Great Ability take on suffering in order to end the suffering of others. This division can be understood as applying to the particular situation in Tibet in which mass monasticism and more esoteric forms of Buddhism could both be found. The teaching of the three kinds of abilities can be understood as a schema for determining whether or not a monk is ready for certain higher teachings and practices. The threefold division can also be understood in a wider sense, applying to people in general and how to gauge their abilities.
Aside from the obvious emphasis on altruism, the doctrine exemplifies what Harvey (2000 p.51) terms gradualism. For many ethical systems in the West, normative prescriptions apply to everyone (or perhaps everyone who can grasp them regardless of ethical development). In many forms of Buddhist ethics, though some prescriptions like refraining from taking life apply to everyone, others only apply to those with a certain depth of moral or spiritual understanding. Harvey notes that while lay practitioners usually follow five precepts, an ordained monk is subject to two hundred or more. Similarly, different teachings, practices, and requirements are suitable for the three kinds of abilities. Those of Small Ability might benefit most from reflecting on the impermanence of worldly pleasures and the inevitability of death, while the kind of altruism and patience that those of higher stages develop is out of their reach and could prove detrimental to demand of them. Atiśa notes that just as birds with undeveloped wings cannot fly, people with undeveloped understanding cannot help others in certain ways. The implication seems to be that just as we cannot demand of baby birds that they fly, we can encourage them to act in ways that nurtures the development of their wings.
An area developed extensively in Tibet is that of Lojong (blo sbyong) or Mind Training. Recall that because of the soteriological aspect of Tibetan ethics, the aim is not solely to give an account for what the right actions and attitudes are, but to come to manifest those attitudes and actually act in that way. Lojong is a type of meditative practice that aims at helping the practitioner to generate compassion and lessen attachment to external factors like praise and popular opinion.
One kind of Lojong, often associated with Śāntideva, is the practice of Exchanging Self and Other (bdag gzhan mnyam brje). In this practice the meditator imagines himself to be another person; often a sequence of people who are beneath, equal to, and then superior to the practitioner in some respect. By doing this, the practitioner can come to realize that the other person is the same as them in that they wish to be happy and avoid suffering. After some practice, it becomes easier to overcome obstacles (both petty and serious) to treating others in a compassionate way.
Another kind of Lojong practice, often attributed to Atiśa but popularized by Chekawa Yeshe Dorje, is that of Giving and Taking (gtong len). In this practice one imagines oneself taking in the suffering of others, and gives to them happiness in return. This often takes the form of visualizing that with each breath, one inhales the suffering of others as thick black smoke and exhales happiness to them in the form of white light.
A general feature of Lojong is the development of an ability to take negative circumstances, like being surrounded by suffering or anger, and transform it into positive attitudes and actions. Two foundational texts in this regard are Eight Verses for Training the Mind (blo sbyong tshig brgyad ma) by Geshé Langri Tangpa and The Seven-Point Mind Training (blo sbyong don bdun ma) by Chekawa Yeshé Dorjé.
Last updated: April 30, 2010 | Originally published: