Time Supplement

This supplement answers a series of questions designed to reveal more about what science requires of physical time, and to provide background information about other topics discussed in the Time article.

Table of Contents

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Spacetime Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Partly Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno's Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean for a Clock to be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What is a Field?

1. What Are Instants and Durations?

A duration is a measure of elapsed time. It is a number with temporal units such as years or seconds. The duration of Earth's existence is about five billion years; the duration of a flash of lightning is about 0.0002 seconds. The second is the agreed upon standard unit for the measurement of duration [in the S.I. system (the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d'Unités)]. In informal conversation, an instant is a very short duration. In physics, however, an instant is even shorter. It is instantaneous; it has zero duration.

There is another sense of the word "instant" which means, not duration, but a time, as when we say it happened at that instant. Midnight could be such an instant.

It is assumed in physics that a real event is always a linear continuum of the instants or times that compose the event, but it is an interesting philosophical question to ask how physicists know it is a continuum. Nobody has ever measured any time that finely.

A brief comment on the terms: "segment," "interval," and "period." We correctly speak of a segment of a line, but of an interval of numbers, and not a segment of numbers. Regarding time, there is no standard terminology about whether to say interval of time or period of time, although the latter is more popular. The measure of a period of time is called a "duration."

2. What Is an Event?

In ordinary discourse, an event is a happening lasting a finite duration during which some object changes its properties. For example, this morning’s event of buttering the toast is the toast’s changing from having the property of being unbuttered to having the property of being buttered.

The philosopher Jaegwon Kim suggested that an event should be defined as an object’s having a property at a time. So, two events are the same if they are both events of the same object having the same property at the same time. This suggestion makes it difficult to make sense of the remark, “The vacation could have started an hour earlier.” On Kim’s analysis, the vacation event could not have started earlier because, if it did, it would be a different event. A possible-worlds analysis of events might be the way to solve this problem of change, but that solution will not be explored here.

Physicists adopt the idealization that a basic event is a so-called point event (or point-event): a single property (value of a variable such as the value of the electron field) at a point in time and at a point in space. The point in space is specified relative to a reference frame. The significance of the physicists' idealization is that in ordinary discourse and in most philosophical discussions, an event must involve a change in some property; the physicist’s event does not have this requirement about change. A physicist's event might be that an electron is there at that point in space at that point in time. Multiple basic events might occur at a single location, such as the values not only of the electron field but also the quark field. A vacation is, in principle, analyzable as a collection of a great many point events.

A mathematical space is a collection of points, and the points might represent anything, for example, dollars. But the points of a real space, that is, a physical space, can only be locations, that is, places. For example, the place called “New York City” at one time is composed of the actual point locations which occur within the city’s boundary at that time. The method for dealing with vague boundaries will not be discussed here.

The physicists’ notion of point event is metaphysically unacceptable to many philosophers, in part because it deviates so much from the way “event” is used in ordinary language. In 1936, in order to avoid point events, Bertrand Russell and A. N. Whitehead developed a theory of time based on the assumption that all events in spacetime have a finite, non-zero duration. Unfortunately, they had to assume that any finite part of an event is an event, and this assumption is no closer to common sense than the physicist’s assumption that all events are composed of point events. The encyclopedia article on Zeno’s Paradoxes mentions that Michael Dummett and Frank Arntzenius have continued in the 21st century to develop Russell’s and Whitehead’s idea that any event must have a non-zero duration.

McTaggart argued early in the twentieth century that events change. For example, he said the event of Queen Anne’s death is changing because it is receding ever farther into the past as time goes on. Many other philosophers (those of the so-called B-camp) believe it is improper to consider an event to be something that can change, and that the error is in not using the word "change" properly. This is still an open question in philosophy, but physicists generally use the term "event" as something that does no change.

For a more detailed discussion of what an event is, see the article on Events.

3. What Is a Reference Frame?

A reference frame for a space [whether it is a physical space, a space-time, or a twelve-dimensional abstract mathematical space] is a standard point of view or a perspective that is usually intended to be usable for making quantitative measurements and judgments about places in the space and the phenomena that take place there. To be suited for these purposes, a reference frame needs to be specified by (or augmented by [since even the experts are ambiguous on this point] choosing a coordinate system and specifying its origin and orientation in the space.  Depending on the space, the objects might be physical objects or spacetime events or something else.

You are not in all reference frames. You are not in the reference frame of the two-dimensional abstract space that maps the price of rice in China against the years in the 19th century. Let's focus now on reference frames for space and spacetime. The frame for the physical space in which you have zero velocity is called your "proper frame." There are an infinite number of legitimate choices for the reference frame, but choosing a good reference frame can make a situation much easier to describe. For example, if you are trying to describe the motion of a car down a fairly straight highway, you would not want to choose a reference frame that is fixed to a spinning carousel that is beside the highway. Instead, choose a reference frame fixed to the highway or else fixed to the car. The reference frame attached to the carousel would not be incorrect, just very inconvenient.

A coordinate system is a continuous labeling of the point-parts of objects with numbers, usually with real numbers. For our three-dimensional space, often the simplest coordinate system is to specify that there are three mutually perpendicular space axes x, y, and z intersecting at a certain place, called the origin, and that all the axes have a certain orientation relative to some direction or physical object. For example, we might orient the z axis by saying it points up, while the x axis points forward along the highway, and the y axis is perpendicular to the other two axes and points across the highway.

If we are dealing with spacetime rather than merely space, then we would add a t axis, and say t=0 when a certain famous event occurs such as the firing of a starter pistol, and we would orient the t axis by saying the value of t along the axis is measured by our civilization's standard clock. There are two important constraints on the choice of coordinate system for a reference frame involving time. We want to ensure that simultaneous events are assigned the same time coordinate, and we want to ensure that nearby events are assigned nearby time coordinates. Treating time as a special space-like coordinate is called "spatializing time," and doing this is what makes time precisely describable in a way that treating time as "becoming" does not.

A reference frame for space is often specified by selecting a solid object that does not normally change its size and by saying that the reference frame is fixed to the object—which is equivalent to saying the object is stationary. We might select a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar, and say the rock is at the origin where the axes cross each other at <0,0,0,0>. Another object is said to be at rest in this reference frame if it remains at a constant distance in a fixed direction from the Rock of Gibraltar. When we say the Sun rose this morning, we are implicitly choosing a reference frame fixed to the Earth’s surface. The Sun is not at rest in this reference frame, but the Earth is.

The reference frame will specify locations, and this is normally done by choosing a coordinate system that spans the space (equivalently, is global because it assigns coordinate numbers to all points of the space). If we are applying the reference frame only to a region of space, then we can be happy with assigning coordinate numbers only to all points in the region.

In a three-dimensional space, the analyst will specify four distinct points, one for the origin, and the other three for defining three independent, perpendicular axes, which in the familiar Cartesian coordinate system will be the x, y and z axes. Two point-objects in this system are at the same place if they have the same x-value, the same y-value and the same z-value. To keep track of 4-d events rather than simply 3-d objects, you the analyst will need to add a time axis, so you will expand your three-dimensional mathematical space to a four-dimensional mathematical space. There, two point events are identical if they occur at the same place and also at the same time. We won't discuss polar or hyperspherical or other coordinate systems.

The coordinates could be finite strings of letters of the alphabet instead of real numbers, but real numbers are usually the best choice if we want to use coordinates for measurement, not just for naming points. An arbitrary name such as "bmaaarirc" for a specific point would contain no information about where one point is located in relation to another, nor how far away one point is from another. A better naming operation can provide this information. Regardless of the number of dimensions, if we want to do measurement, then we should require of our reference frame that nearby points be named with nearby triples of numbers, one number for each of the dimensions, and that any continuous change along a path between two points be reflected in a continuous change of the coordinates of those points. That is why we require that the names of points be real numbers—more specifically an ordered n-tuple of real numbers for a space of n dimensions. Often we prefer rectilinear coordinates to curvilinear coordinates, and we prefer that the coordinate lines along one dimension be straight and at right angles to coordinate lines along all other dimensions so that we can make use of the Pythagorean Theorem in computations of distances; thus we prefer the familiar Euclidean coordinate system.

Both classical theory, such as Newton's mechanics, and relativity theory assume the set of all events forms a four dimensional manifold, which means that events can be specified with four independent, real numbers (rather than, say, integers) and that infinitesimally small regions of events can be covered by a four-dimensional Cartesian coordinate system. A real space obeying general relativity will be curved, and so cannot have a Cartesian coordinate system except infinitesimally. If you detect somewhere that your triangles are odd because the sum of their interior angles is not exactly 180 degrees, then you know your space curves there.

But we can use a curved coordinate system on curved spacetime. The sphere's surface is a two-dimensional space that requires us to select a curvilinear coordinate system in which the axes curve [as viewed from a higher dimensional space]. To cover all of curved spacetime, we must make do with covering different regions of spacetime with different coordinate patches (called charts) that are “knitted together” where one patch meets another. Any curved spacetime (that does not have two disconnected parts) can be covered with a single, global coordinate system in which every point is uniquely identified with a set of four numbers in a continuous way.

Informally when you want to find out how many dimensions your space has, you choose the maximum number of sticks that you can make be mutually perpendicular. As noted above, a dimension of a space is a kind of path in a certain direction in that space, and a coordinate for that dimension is a number that serves as a location along that path. In creating reference frames for spaces, the usual assumption is that in order to specify a location we should supply n independent numbers in an n-dimensional space, where n is a positive integer. This is usual but not required; instead we could exploit the idea that there are space-filling curves which permit a single continuous curve to completely fill, and thus coordinatize, a region of dimension higher than one. For this reason (namely, that each point in n-dimensional space does not always need n numbers to uniquely name the point), the contemporary definition of “dimension” is rather exotic and will not be introduced here. Using a space-filling curve as a coordinate axis is a bad choice because nearby points won't usually have nearby coordinates.

Given an event, it may have one time coordinate in one coordinate system, but a different time coordinate in a different coordinate system. If there exist equations telling us how points change their coordinates between the two different frames, then we say there exist "transformation equations" for the two frames. So, if you were to die, you would die in all reference frames, but at different times.

Physicists distinguish the past from the absolute past. Being in the absolute past is a frame-independent notion, but merely being in the past is not. Event x is in the past of event y if and only if (abbreviated "iff") x happens before y. Event x is in the absolute past of event y iff, in all frames of reference, x happens before y. Event x is in the absolute past of y iff x could have causally influenced y iff an unhindered light beam from x could have reached y. If in some frame two different events x and y are simultaneous, then there is another frame in which they are not simultaneous.

Section 20 offers more discussion of reference frames.

Inertial frames are very special reference frames; see Section 4.

4. What Is an Inertial Frame?

An inertial frame can be characterized in different ways. One is that it is the intended frame of Einstein's special theory of relativity. Another is that it is a reference frame without fictitious forces. All reference frames agree on the real forces, but they disagree on the so-called fictitious forces, such as the centrifugal force and Coriolis force. These fictitious forces will be different in different reference frames, but will go to zero in an inertial frame. Only non-inertial reference frames need fictitious forces. Inertial frames can account for gravitational forces so long as there is no curvature of spacetime involved.

Another way to characterize an inertial frame is by saying it is any reference frame in which Newton's first law of motion holds. Newton’s first law requires that a moving object which is unaffected by any unbalanced, outside forces will coast forever. That is, it will move unimpeded with a constant speed and constant direction forever. An object will not behave this way in actual physical space, which is a sign that reference frames for physical space will not inertial frames, except as an approximation. An object that "moves inertially" is one that moves uniformly in a straight line, and so is represented by a straight line in a Minkowski diagram, which is a diagram that does not allow space to curve, and does not allow an unimpeded object to move in a curved path, but in real space with matter and energy, the unimpeded objects move on geodesics that would be considered to be curved lines if they were seen from a higher dimensional Euclidean space.

Suppose you have pre-selected your frame. How do you tell whether it is an inertial frame? There are various ways. (i) Check that there are no fictitious forces. (ii) Check that Newton's laws of motion hold. (iii) Check that physical objects travel equal distances in equal amounts of time, that moving objects without unbalanced external forces always coast in straight lines, and so forth. (iv) Because any reference frame moving at a constant velocity with respect to an inertial frame is also an inertial frame, you can check whether you are in an inertial frame by checking whether two objects coasting in parallel to each other will continue to do so and will continue to be the same distance apart. Two objects will not behave this way in actual physical space, which is a sign that reference frames in physical space are not inertial frames. Instead, coasting objects will follow the path of a so-called geodesic, as described by the general theory of relativity.

Frames can be better or worse approximations to inertial frames. A frame fixed on the distant stars and describing phenomena far from any planets and stars is very nearly an inertial frame in this region. Any spacetime obeying the general theory of relativity will be locally Minkowskian in the sense that any infinitesimal region of spacetime has an inertial frame obeying the principles of special relativity.

5. What Is Spacetime?

Spacetime is where events are located. The dimensions of real spacetime include the time dimension of happens-after and three space dimensions.

Hermann Minkowski, in 1908, was the first person to say that spacetime is fundamental and that space and time are just aspects of spacetime because different reference frames will divide spacetime into different times and spaces.

Spacetime is believed to be a continuum in which we can define points and straight lines. However, these points and lines do not satisfy the principles of Euclidean geometry when gravity is present. Einstein showed that the presence of gravity affects geometry by warping both space and time. The gravitational field is actually manifested as the curvature of spacetime. This curvature implies that Euclidean geometry cannot be the correct geometry of spacetime. Black holes are a sign of especially radical curvature. The Earth's presence causes only a very slight curvature. Nevertheless, the curvature is significant enough that it must be accounted for in clocks of the Global Positioning Satellites (GPS) along with the other time dilation effect that is caused by speed. The GPS satellites are launched with their clocks adjusted so that when they reach orbit they mark time the same as Earth-based clocks do. Every GPS satellite carries four atomic clocks that need to be re-synchronized twice a day with a more trustworthy clock on Earth.

There have been serious attempts to construct theories of physics in which spacetime is a product of more basic entities. The primary aim of these new theories is to unify relativity with quantum theory. So far these theories have not stood up to any empirical observations or experiments that could show them to be superior to the presently accepted theories. So, for the present, the concept of spacetime remains fundamental.

The metaphysical question of whether spacetime is a substantial object or a relationship among events, or neither, is considered in the discussion of the relational theory of time. For other philosophical questions about what spacetime is, see What is a Field?

6. What Is a Minkowski Spacetime Diagram?

A spacetime diagram is a graphical representation of the point-events in spacetime. A Minkowski spacetime diagram is a representation of a spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity, but not necessarily general relativity. In a Minkowski spacetime diagram, normally a rectangular coordinate system is used, the time axis is shown vertically, one or two of the spatial axes are suppressed (that is, not included). Here is an example with only one space dimension:

This Minkowski diagram shows a point-sized Einstein standing still midway between the two places at which there is a flash of light. The directed arrows represent the path of light rays from the flash. In a Minkowski diagram, a physical (point) object is not represented as occupying a point but as occupying a line containing all the spacetime points at which it exists. That line, which usually is not straight, is called the worldline of the object.

In the above diagram, Einstein's worldline is a vertical straight line because no total external force is acting on him. The history or path of an object’s inertial motion (its coasting) is a series of events that are represented by a straight line. If it is not straight, the object is not coasting (with zero external force acting on it) but is accelerating. If an object's worldline intersects or meets another object's worldline, then the two objects collide at the point of intersection.

The units along the vertical time axis are customarily chosen to be the product of time and the speed of light  so that worldlines of light rays make a forty-five degree angle with each axis. This way, if a centimeter in the up or time direction is one second, then a centimeter to the right or space direction is one light-second, a very long distance.

In order to distinguish the time axis from an ordinary space axis in the MInkowski diagram, the times are also multiples of the square root of minus one. This makes time imaginary, but only in the sense of being a complex number, not in the sense of being like Santa Claus. When the general theory of relativity was developed, Einstein adopted a non-Euclidean Riemannian geometry that does not require  using imaginary numbers for the time dimension.

The set of all possible photon histories or light-speed worldlines going through an event defines the two light cones of that event: the past light cone and the future light cone. The future cone is called a "cone" because, if we were to add another space dimension to our diagram, so it has two space dimensions and a single time dimension, then light emitted from the flash spreads out in the two dimensions of space in a circle of growing diameter, producing a cone shape. In a diagram for three-dimensional space, the light wavefront is an expanding sphere and not an expanding cone, but sometimes physicists will informally still speak of the "cone."

The future light cone of the single flash event is defined to be all the space-time events reached by the light emitted from the flash. A pair of events inside the cone are events such that in principle the earlier one could have affected the later one; the events are causally-connectible, and the relation between the event and any other event is said to be time-like. This means that a body could travel between the two events without ever exceeding the speed of light. If you were once located in spacetime at, say <x,y,z,t>, then for the rest of your life you cannot affect or participate in any event that occurs outside of the light cone whose apex is at <x,y,z,t>. Light cones are a helpful tool because different observers or different frames of reference will agree on the light cone of any event, even if the event does not actually radiate any light.

Inertial motion produces a straight worldline, and accelerated motion produces a curved worldline in Minkowski diagrams. If at some time Einstein were to jump on a train moving by at constant speed, then his worldline would, from that time onward, tilt away from the vertical and form some angle less than 45 degrees with the time axis. In order to force a 45 degree angle to be the path of a light ray, the units on the time axis are not seconds but seconds times the speed of light. Any line tilted from than 45 degrees from the vertical is the worldline of an object moving faster than the speed of light in a vacuum. Events on the same horizontal line of the Minkowski diagram are simultaneous in that reference frame. Special relativity does not allow a worldline to be circular, or a closed curve, since the traveler would have to approach infinite speed at the top of the circle and at the bottom. A moving observer is added to the above diagram to produce the diagram below in section 12 in the discussion about the relativity of simultaneity.

If an observer's worldline tips over and goes back to the past, say because the worldline has the shape of an inverted cup, then there's a point where the line becomes horizontal. But a horizontal line is an indication that the observer is moving at infinite speed. This speed violates the special theory of relativity, and so does not exist, provided we accept special relativity. Or, if time travel to the past can occur, then it do so only in a spacetime that is not Minkowskian and so does not satisfy special relativity.

Does an observer move along their worldline? According to J.J.C. Smart, "Within the Minkowski representation we must not talk of our four-dimensional entities changing or not changing." ("Spatialising Time," Mind, 64: 239-241.)

Not all spacetimes can be given Minkowski diagrams, but any spacetime satisfying Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity can. Einstein's Special Theory falsely presupposes that physical processes, such as gravitational processes, have no effect on the structure of spacetime. When attention needs to be given to the real effect of these processes on the structure of spacetime, that is, when general relativity needs to be used, then Minkowski diagrams become inappropriate for spacetime. General relativity assumes that the geometry of spacetime is locally Minkowskian but not globally. That is, spacetime is locally flat in the sense that in any very small region one always finds spacetime to be 4-D Minkowskian (but not 4-D Euclidean). Special relativity holds in any infinitesimally small region of spacetime that satisfies general relativity, and so any such region can be fitted with an inertial reference frame. When we say spacetime is "really curved" and not flat, we mean it really deviates from 4-D Minkowskian geometry.

To repeat a point made earlier, when we speak of a point in these diagrams being a spacetime event, that is a non-standard use of the word "event." A point event in a Minkowski diagram is merely a location in spacetime where an event might or might not happen. The point exists even if no object is actually there.

A Minkowski spacetime with three spatial dimensions and one time dimension does its best to treat time like a dimension of space, but Minkowski spacetime is radically different than a Euclidean space with four dimensions. This difference shows up in the fact that its metric (and the topology based on the metric) is very unlike that of the metric of a Euclidean four-space because its timelike dimension is in many ways very unspacelike, as we see in the next section.

7. What Are the Metric and the Interval?

A space is simply a collection of points.  For any pair of points, to have a clear sense of how "distant" one point is from the other, we need the space to be a metric space.

To have a metric space, we need there to be a metric on the space, which is a function specifying the interval between any two points or at least specifying that the interval obeys certain precisely specified conditions. We may not know in advance the distances between every two points; for example, we will leave it as an empirical matter what the interval is between San Francisco and New York City, but whatever the interval is measured to be, it will satisfy certain conditions on any metric, and this will require that the San Francisco to New York City interval have certain relationships to other intervals, such as the interval from San Francisco to Chicago and the interval from Chicago to New York City.

In Euclidean space, the interval between two points is the length of the straight line connecting them. The metric of a space determines its geometry, and this metric and geometry are intrinsic in the sense that they do not change as we change the reference frame on the space.

As we change reference frames on a space, the distance between a pair of points may change, but the interval does not. In spacetime, the interval between any two events is intrinsic to the spacetime and does not vary with the reference frame, unlike a distance or a duration between the two events. Two observers using reference frames that move relative to each other will correctly calculate different distances and different durations between two point events, but the interval between the two events is the same in the two frames. If we agree with physicists that what is objective about spacetime is what does not change with a change in the reference frame we use, then the interval is objective, but velocities, distances, and durations are not. However, that feature of spacetime does not make durations be subjective in the sense of mind-dependent.

Philosophers are interested in the issue of whether the choice of a metric for a space is natural (that is, objective) or whether it is always a matter of convention.

How about the metric for time? The introduction of the metric for time allows the scientist to define the duration—the measure of the time interval—between any two events. The time interval is not usually the same thing as the spacetime interval.

The customary metric for any two points in a timeline, or more specifically a one-dimensional Euclidean space of times or instants, is the absolute value of the numerical difference between the time coordinates of the two points. For example, the duration between an event with the coordinate 5:00 and an event with the coordinate 7:00 is exactly two hours (assuming the events occur on the same day and we do not have an A.M. vs. P.M. ambiguity, nor an ambiguity due to change of time zone).

If we select a standard clock and the standard way of calculating durations between clock readings, then that clock implicitly defines the metric of time because, by definition, it yields the correct answer for the duration between any two point events in an inertial reference frame in which it is stationary. Here we assume the period between any two successive clock ticks is congruent (the same) while the clock is stationary in the coordinate system where the clock readings are taken. When we define the unit of time (the second) to be so many successive ticks of the standard clock, what we are doing is implicitly specifying the metric, provided we implicitly agree that the clock readings are correct and agree to adopt the customary procedure for how to read the duration between two point events. For example, to speak simplistically, if you want to know how much time has passed between the death of Muhammad and the death of Abraham Lincoln, then the customary procedure is to find the dates of the two events and subtract the first from the second; this procedure is equivalent to noting the tick on the standard clock that is simultaneous with the death of Muhammad and then counting how many ticks occurred until the tick that is simultaneous with the death of Abraham Lincoln, then converting tick numbers to, say, years. If we try to measure events that occur at a great distance from each other, then the measurement can be much more complicated because relativistic effects come in.

Let's add more detail to this discussion. A point of space is located by being assigned a coordinate. For doing quantitative science rather than merely qualitative science, we want the coordinate to be a number and not, say, a letter of the alphabet. A coordinate for a point in two-dimensional space requires two numbers rather than just one; a coordinate for a point in n-dimensional space requires n independently assigned numbers, where n is a positive integer. You might consider why you'd prefer a real number rather than a rational number even though no measuring tool could detect the difference.

In a 1-dimensional Euclidean space for time, namely for a straight line, the metric d for two points x and y is given by

d(x,y) = |x - y|.

So, d is the duration between instants x and y (in a reference frame).

In a 2-dimensional (or 2-D) Euclidean space, the metric for the distance between the point (x,y) with Cartesian coordinates x and y and the point (x',y') with coordinates x' and y' is customarily defined to be the square root of (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2. Note the application of the Pythagorean Theorem. If the space curves and so is not Euclidean, then a more sophisticated definition of the metric is required because we can no longer apply the Pythagorean Theorem, except perhaps in infinitesimal regions.

We have intuitions about locations and distances that we expect will hold. For example, we believe that in a one-dimensional space representing time, if event p happens before event q, and if q happens before r, then the locations numbers for those events, namely, l(p), l(q) and l(r), must satisfy the inequality l(p) < l(q) < l(r). If not, then we should not be labeling points that way.

more generally, our intuitive idea of what a distance is tells us that, no matter how strange the space is, we want its metric function d to have the following distance-like properties. Let d(p,q) stand for the interval between any two points p and q in the space. d is a function with two arguments. For any points p, q and r, the following five conditions must be satisfied:

  1. d(p,p) = 0
  2. d(p,q) is greater than or equal to 0
  3. If d(p,q) = 0, then p = q
  4. d(p,q) = d(q,p)
  5. d(p,q) + d(q,r) is greater than or equal to d(p,r)

Notice that there is no mention of the path the distance is taken across; all the attention is on the point pairs themselves. Notice also that the metric between p and q is specified without any mention of how many points exist between p and q. Does your idea of distance imply that those conditions on d should be true? If you were to check, then you'd find that the usual 2-D metric defined above, namely the square root of (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2, does satisfy these five conditions. So, does the 1-D metric. In 3-D Euclidean space, the customary metric is the square root of (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2. We might want a scale factor, say a, on the metric so that d2 = a[(x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2]. If space were to expand uniformly with time, then a is not a constant but a function of time, namely a(t).

After a metric is defined mathematically for a spacetime, the metric is commonly connected to empirical observations by saying that the readings taken with ideal meter sticks and ideal clocks (and lasers and radar and so forth) yield the values of the metric.

To have a metric specifically for a 4-dimensional spacetime, we desire a definition of the interval between any two infinitesimally neighboring points in that spacetime. Less generally, consider an appropriate metric for the 4-D mathematical space that is used to represent the spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity theory, namely Minkowski spacetime. What's an appropriate metric for this space? Well, if we were just interested in the space portion of this spacetime, then the above 3-D Euclidean metric is fine. But we've asked a delicate question because the fourth dimension of Minkowski's mathematical space is special, and it represents a time dimension and not a space dimension. Remember the square root of negative one mentioned in the above discussion of the Minkowski diagram? Its square is negative one. Using Cartesian coordinates, spacetime has the following Lorentzian metric (also call a Minkowski metric) for any pair of point events at (x',y',z',t') and (x,y,z,t).

Δs2 = (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2 - c2(t' - t)2

When the square of the spacetime interval is Δs2. If this is positive we have a spacelike interval or displacement; when it is negative we have a timelike displacement. Because true metrics are always positive, this Lorentzian metric is not a true metric, nor even a pseudometric; but it is customary for physicists to refer to it loosely as a "metric" because Δs retains enough other features of the metric. Here is another equally good candidate for the Lorentzian metric:

Δs2 = - (x' - x)2 - (y' - y)2 - (z' - z)2 + c2(t' - t)2

Δs is called the interval of Minkowski spacetime. Notice the plus and minus signs on the four terms. The interval is not really a strictly spatial distance. The interval is sensitive to both space and time. For two point events happening in the same place, the interval is just the temporal duration between them. For two point events happening at the same time, the interval is the spatial distance between them.

One happy feature of this Lorentzian metric is that the value of the interval is unaffected by changing to a new reference frame or coordinate system provided the new one is not accelerating relative to the first. That is, changing to a new, unaccelerated reference frame on the spacetime will change the values of all the coordinates of the points of the spacetime, but some relations between all pairs of points will not be affected, namely the intervals between pairs of points. Thus there is something absolute or "objective" about the interval; it is independent of the unaccelerated reference frame. Take any two observers who use different reference frames that are not accelerating relative to each other. Now consider some single event with a finite duration. The two observers won't agree on how long that event lasts, nor where it occurs, but they will always agree on the interval between the beginning and end of the event. That is why the interval is said to be absolute.

The interval of spacetime between two point events is complicated because its square can be negative. Notice that if Δs2 is zero, the two events might be identical, or they might have occurred millions of miles apart. In ordinary space, if the space interval between two events is zero, then the two events happened at the same time and place, but in spacetime, if the spacetime interval between two events is zero, this means only that there could be a light ray connecting them. It is because the spacetime interval between two events can be zero even when the events are far apart in distance that the term "interval" is very unlike what we normally mean by the term "distance." All the events that have a zero spacetime interval from some event e constitute e's two light cones. This set of events is given that name because it has the shape of cones when represented in a three dimensional Minkowski diagram, one cone for events in e's future and one cone for events in e's past. If event 2 is outside the light cones of event 1, then event 2 is said to occur in the "absolute elsewhere" of event 1. In that case, neither event could have affected the other by a causal influence traveling less than the speed of light. And, you as the analyst are free to choose a coordinate system in which event 1 happens first, or another coordinate system in which event 2 happens first, or even a coordinate system in which the two are simultaneous. But once the coordinate system is chosen, then this choice fixes the happens-before relation for all events.

Strictly speaking, a clock ticks off the amount

(1/c)√[- (x' - x)2 - (y' - y)2 - (z' - z)2 + c2(t' - t)2]

between position (x,y,z,t) and position (x',y',z',t') along its worldline. The ticking marks off congruent, invariant intervals along its worldline. If the clock is stationary in its own inertial reference frame, then x' - x is zero, and so are y'-y and z'-z'; so, the clock measures the quantity t'-t.

What if we turn now from special relativity to general relativity? Adding space and time dependence (particularly the values of mass-energy and momentum at points) to each term of the Lorentzian metric produces the metric for general relativity. That metric requires more complex tensor equations; these put multiplication factors g in front of each of the products of the differential displacements such as (x' - x)2 and (x' - x)(y' - y), and the mathematical difficulty of the description escalates.

In a static space obeying general relativity, it would be natural to assume homogeneity so that the metric on spacetime is the same everywhere, but we need to relax this assumption if we want to allow for the space to expand as galaxies growth farther apart. In fact the expansion is not constant, because the more distant the galaxy the faster it is moving away from us.

8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time Is Partly Space?

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski remarked that "Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality." Many people took this to mean that time is partly space, and vice versa. The philosopher C. D. Broad countered that the discovery of spacetime did not break down the distinction between time and space but only their independence or isolation. He argued that their lack of independence does not imply a lack of reality.

Nevertheless, there is a deep sense in which time and space are "mixed up" or linked. This is evident from the Lorentz transformations of special relativity that connect the time t in one inertial frame with the time t' in another frame that is moving in the x direction at a constant speed v. In this Lorentz equation, t' is dependent upon the space coordinate x and the speed. In this way, time is not independent of either space or speed. It follows that the time between two events could be zero in one frame but not zero in another. Each frame has its own way of splitting up spacetime into its space part and its time part.

The reason why time is not partly space is that, within a single frame, time is always distinct from space. Time is a distinguished dimension of spacetime, not an arbitrary dimension. What being distinguished amounts to is that when you set up a rectangular coordinate system on spacetime with an origin at, say, at some important event, you may point the x-axis east or north or up, but you may not point it forward in time—you may do that only with the t-axis, the time axis.

9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?

Yes and no; it depends on what you are talking about. Time is the fourth dimension of 4-d spacetime, but time is not the fourth dimension of physical space. And even in 4-d spacetime, the time dimension is special and unlike any of the other three dimensions.

Mathematicians have a broader notion of the term "space" than the average person; and in their sense a space need not consist of places, that is, geographical locations. Not paying attention to the two meanings of the term "space" is the source of all the confusion about whether time is the fourth dimension.

Newton treated space as three dimensional, and treated time as a separate one-dimensional space. He could have used Minkowski's 1908 idea, if he had thought of it, of treating spacetime as four dimensional. If Newton had, then he could have called time the fourth dimension, just as Minkowski did.

The mathematical space used by mathematical physicists to represent physical spacetime that obeys the laws of relativity is four dimensional; and in that mathematical space, the space of places is a 3-d sub-space and time is another 1-d sub-space. Minkowski was the first person to construct such a mathematical space, although in 1895 H. G. Wells treated time informally as a fourth dimension in his novel The Time Machine.

In any coordinate system on spacetime, mathematicians of the early twentieth century believed it was necessary to treat a point event with at least four independent numbers in order to account for the four dimensionality of spacetime. Actually this appeal to the 19th century definition of dimensionality, which is due to Bernhard Riemann, is not quite adequate because mathematicians have subsequently discovered how to assign each point on the plane to a point on the line without any two points on the plane being assigned to the same point on the line. The idea comes from the work of Georg Cantor. Because of this one-to-one correspondence, the points on a plane could be specified with just one number. If so, then the line and plane must have the same dimensions according to the Riemann definition of dimension. To avoid this problem and to keep the plane being a 2-d object, the notion of dimensionality of a space has been given a new, but rather complex, definition.

10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?

Every reference frame has its own physical time, but the question is intended in another sense. At present, physicists measure time electromagnetically. They define a standard atomic clock using periodic electromagnetic processes in atoms, then use electromagnetic signals (light) to synchronize clocks that are far from the standard clock. In doing this, are physicists measuring '"electromagnetic time" but not other kinds of physical time?

In the 1930s, the physicists Arthur Milne and Paul Dirac worried about this question. Independently, they suggested there may be very many time scales. For example, there could be the time of atomic processes and perhaps also a time of gravitation and large-scale physical processes. Clocks for the two processes might drift out of synchrony after being initially synchronized, yet there would be no reasonable explanation for why they don't stay in synchrony. Ditto for clocks based on the pendulum, on superconducting resonators, on the spread of electromagnetic radiation through space, and on other physical principles. Just imagine the difficulty for physicists if they had to work with electromagnetic time, gravitational time, nuclear time, neutrino time, and so forth. Current physics, however, has found no reason to assume there is more than one kind of time for physical processes.

In 1967, physicists did reject the astronomical standard for the atomic standard because the deviation between known atomic and gravitation periodic processes could be explained better assuming that the atomic processes were the more regular of the two. But this is not a cause for worry about two times drifting apart. Physicists still have no reason to believe a gravitational periodic process that is just as regular initially as the atomic process and that is not affected by friction or impacts or other forces would ever drift out of synchrony with the atomic process, yet this is the possibility that worried Milne and Dirac.

11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?

Physical time is not relative to any observer's state of mind. Wishing time will pass does not affect the rate at which the observed clock ticks. On the other hand, physical time is relative to the observer's reference system—in trivial ways and in a deep way discovered by Albert Einstein.

In a trivial way, time is relative to the chosen coordinate system on the reference frame, though not to the reference frame itself. For example, it depends on the units chosen as when the duration of some event is 34 seconds if seconds are defined to be a certain number of ticks of the standard clock, but is 24 seconds if seconds are defined to be a different number of ticks of that standard clock. Similarly, the difference between the Christian calendar and the Jewish calendar for the date of some event is due to a different unit and origin. Also trivially, time depends on the coordinate system when a change is made from Eastern Standard Time to Pacific Standard Time. These dependencies are taken into account by scientists but usually never mentioned. For example, if a pendulum's approximately one-second swing is measured in a physics laboratory during the autumn night when the society changes from Daylight Savings Time back to Standard Time, the scientists do not note that one unusual swing of the pendulum that evening took a negative fifty-nine minutes and fifty-nine seconds instead of the usual one second.

Isn't time relative to the observer's coordinate system in the sense that in some reference frames there could be fifty-nine seconds in a minute? No, due to scientific convention, it is absolutely certain that there are sixty seconds in any minute in any reference frame. How long an event lasts is relative to the reference frame used to measure the time elapsed, but in any reference frame there are exactly sixty seconds in a minute because this is true by definition. Similarly, you do not need to worry that in some reference frame there might be two gallons in a quart.

In a deeper sense, time is relative, not just to the coordinate system, but to the reference frame itself. That is Einstein's principal original idea about time. Einstein's special theory of relativity requires physical laws not change if we change from one inertial reference frame to another. In technical-speak Einstein is requiring that the statements of physical laws must be Lorentz-invariant. The equations of light and electricity and magnetism (Maxwell electrodynamics) are Lorentz-invariant, but those of Newton's mechanics are not, and Einstein eventually figured out that what needs changing in the laws of mechanics is that temporal durations and spatial intervals between two events must be allowed to be relative to which reference frame is being used. There is no frame-independent duration for an event extended in time. To be redundant, Einstein's idea is that without reference to the frame, there is no fixed time interval between two events, no 'actual' duration between them. This idea was philosophically shocking as well as scientifically revolutionary.

Einstein illustrated his idea using two observers, one on a moving train in the middle of the train, and a second observer standing on the embankment next to the train tracks. If the observer sitting in the middle of the rapidly moving train receives signals simultaneously from lightning flashes at the front and back of the train, then in his reference frame the two lightning strikes were simultaneous. But the strikes were not simultaneous in a frame fixed to an observer on the ground. This outside observer will say that the flash from the back had farther to travel because the observer on the train was moving away from the flash. If one flash had farther to travel, then it must have left before the other one, assuming that both flashes moved at the same speed. Therefore, the lightning struck the back of the train before the lightning struck the front of the train in the reference frame fixed to the tracks.

Let's assume that a number of observers are moving with various constant speeds in various directions. Consider the inertial frame of reference in which each observer is at rest in his or her own frame. Which of these observers will agree on their time measurements? Only observers with zero relative speed will agree. Observers with different relative speeds will not, even if they agree on how to define the second and agree on some event occurring at time zero (the origin of the time axis). If two observers are moving relative to each other, but each makes judgments from a reference frame fixed to themselves, then the assigned times to the event will disagree more, the faster their relative speed. All observers will be observing the same objective reality, the same event in the same spacetime, but their different frames of reference will require disagreement about how spacetime divides up into its space part and its time part.

This relativity of time to reference frame implies that there be no such thing as The Past in the sense of a past independent of reference frame. This is because a past event in one reference frame might not be past in another reference frame. However, this frame relativity usually isn't very important except when high speeds or high gravitational field strengths are involved.

In some reference frame, was Adolf Hitler born before George Washington? No, because the two events are causally connectible. That is, one event could in principle have affected the other since light would have had time to travel from one to the other. We can select a reference frame to reverse the usual Earth-based order of two events only if they are not causally connectible, that is, only if one event is in the absolute elsewhere of the other. Despite the relativity of time to a reference frame, any two observers in any two reference frames should agree about which of any two causally connectible events happened first. But information from our absolute elsewhere will never have time to reach us.

12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?

The relativity of simultaneity is the feature of spacetime in which two different reference frames moving relative to each other will disagree on which events are simultaneous.

How do we tell the time of occurrence of an event that is very far away from us? We assign the time when something is occurring far away from us by subtracting, from the time we noticed it, the time it took the signal to travel all that way to us.

For example, we see a flash of light at time t arriving from a distant place P. When did the flash occur back at P? Let's call that time tp. Here is how to compute tp. Suppose we know the distance x from us to P. Then the flash occurred at t minus the travel time for the light. That travel time is x/c. So,

tp = t - x/c.

For example, if we see an explosion on the Sun at t, then we know to say it really occurred about eight minutes before, because x/c is approximately eight minutes, where x is the distance from Earth to the Sun. In this way, we know what events on the distant Sun are simultaneous with what clicks on our Earth clock.

The deeper problem is that other observers will not agree with us that the event on the Sun occurred when we say it did. The diagram below illustrates the problem. There are two light flashes that occur simultaneously, with Einstein at rest midway between them.


The Minkowski diagram represents Einstein sitting still in the reference frame (marked by the coordinate system with the thick black axes) while Lorentz is not sitting still but is traveling rapidly away from him and toward the source of flash 2. Because Lorentz's timeline is a straight line, we can tell that he is moving at a constant speed. The two flashes of light arrive at Einstein's location simultaneously, creating spacetime event B. However, Lorentz sees flash 2 before flash 1. That is, the event A of Lorentz seeing flash 2 occurs before event C of Lorentz seeing flash 1. So, Einstein will readily say the flashes are simultaneous, but Lorentz will have to do some computing to figure out that the flashes are simultaneous in the frame because they won't "look" simultaneous. However, if we'd chosen a different reference frame from the one above, one in which Lorentz is not moving but Einstein is, then Lorentz would be correct to say flash 2 occurs before flash 1 in that new frame. So, whether the flashes are or are not simultaneous depends on which reference frame is used in making the judgment. It's all relative.

Because the notion of a single reference frame spanning space is not definable for the curved spaces of general relativity, and because any small enough region of a space obeying general relativity obeys special relativity, the notion of relativity of simultaneity in general relativity is only the notion that works for special relativity. General relativity cannot make sense of the question of what event on Earth is simultaneous with a flash on the Sun. So, the discussion above was presupposing that the region of interest obeyed the special theory of relativity.

13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?

The relativity of simultaneity is philosophically less controversial than the conventionality of simultaneity. To appreciate the difference, consider what is involved in making a determination regarding simultaneity. Given two events that happen essentially at the same place, physicists assume they can tell by direct observation whether the events happened simultaneously, assuming they are in a space obeying special relativity. If we don't see one of them happening first, then we say they happened simultaneously, and we assign them the same time coordinate. The determination of simultaneity is more difficult if the two happen at separate places, especially if they are very far apart. One way to measure (operationally define) simultaneity at a distance is to say that two events are simultaneous in a reference frame if unobstructed light signals from the two events would reach us simultaneously when we are midway between the two places where they occur, as judged in that frame. This is the operational definition of simultaneity used by Einstein in his theory of special relativity. Instead of using the midway method, we could take the distant clock and send a signal home to our master clock, one already synchronized with our standard clock; the master clock immediately sends a signal back to the distant clock with the information about what time it was when the signal arrived. We at the distant clock notice that the total travel time is t and that the master clock's signal says its time is, say, noon, so we immediately set our clock to be noon plus half of t.

The "midway" method described above has a significant presumption: that the light beams travel at the same speed regardless of direction. Einstein, Reichenbach and Grünbaum have called this a reasonable "convention" because any attempt to experimentally confirm it presupposes that we already know how to determine simultaneity at a distance. This is the conventionality, rather than relativity, of simultaneity. To pursue the point, suppose the two original events are in each other's absolute elsewhere; that is, they could not have affected each other. Einstein noticed that there is no physical basis for judging the simultaneity or lack of simultaneity between these two events, and for that reason he said we rely on a convention when we define distant simultaneity as we do. Hilary Putnam, Michael Friedman, and Graham Nerlich object to calling it a convention—on the grounds that to make any other assumption about light's speed would unnecessarily complicate our description of nature, and we often make choices about how nature is on the basis of simplification of our description. They would say there is less conventionality in the choice than Einstein supposed.

The "midway" method isn't the only way to define simultaneity. Consider a second method, the "mirror reflection" method. Select an Earth-based frame of reference, and send a flash of light from Earth to Mars where it hits a mirror and is reflected back to its source. The flash occurred at 12:00, let's say, and its reflection arrived back on Earth 20 minutes later. The light traveled the same empty, undisturbed path coming and going. At what time did the light flash hit the mirror? The answer involves the so-called conventionality of simultaneity. All physicists agree one should say the reflection event occurred at 12:10. The controversial philosophical question is whether this is really a convention. Einstein pointed out that there would be no inconsistency in our saying that it hit the mirror at 12:17, provided we live with the awkward consequence that light was relatively slow getting to the mirror, but then traveled back to Earth at a faster speed.

Let's explore the reflection method that is used to synchronize a distant, stationary clock so that it reads the same time as our clock. Let's draw a Minkowski diagram of the situation and consider just one spatial dimension in which we are at location A with the standard clock for the reference frame. The distant clock we want to synchronize is at location B. See the following diagram.

conventionality of simultaneity graph

The fact that the timeline of the B-clock is parallel to the time axis shows that the clock there is stationary. We will send light signals in order to synchronize the two clocks. Send a light signal from A at time t1 to B, where it is reflected back to us, arriving at time t3. Then the reading tr on the distant clock at the time of the reflection event should be t2, where

t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1).

If tr = t2, then the two clocks are synchronized.

Einstein noticed that the use of "(1/2)" in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) rather than the use of some other fraction implicitly assumes that the light speed to and from B is the same. He said this assumption is a convention, the so-called conventionality of simultaneity, and isn't something we could check to see whether it is correct. If t2 were (1/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B faster than c and return more slowly. If t2 were (2/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B relatively slowly and return faster than c. Either way, the average travel speed to and from would be c. Only with the fraction (1/2) are the travel speeds the same going and coming back.

Notice how we would check whether the two light speeds really are the same. We would send a light signal from A to B, and see if the travel time was the same as when we sent it from B to A. But to trust these times we would already need to have synchronized the clocks at A and B. But that synchronization process will use the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1), with the (1/2) again, so we are arguing in a circle here.

Not all philosophers of science agree with Einstein that the choice of (1/2) is a convention, nor with those philosophers such as Putnam who say the messiness of any other choice shows that the choice must be correct. Everyone agrees, though, that any other choice than (1/2) would make for messy physics.

However, some researchers suggest that there is a way to check on the light speeds and not simply presume they are the same. Transport one of the clocks to B at an infinitesimal speed. Going this slow, the clock will arrive at B without having its proper time deviate from that of the A-clock. That is, the two clocks will be synchronized even though they are distant from each other. Now the two clocks can be used to find the time when a light signal left A and the time when it arrived at B. The time difference can be used to compute the light speed. This speed can be compared with the speed computed for a signal that left B and then arrived at A. The experiment has never been performed, but the recommenders are sure that the speeds to and from will turn out to be identical, so they are sure that the (1/2) in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) is correct and not a convention. For more discussion of this controversial issue of conventionality in relativity, see pp. 179-184 of The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, edited by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, Inc., 2002.

14. What Is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?

What does it mean to say the human condition is one in which you never will be able to affect an event outside your forward light cone? With any action you take, the speed of transmission of your action to its effect cannot move faster than c. This c is the c in E = mc2. It is the maximum speed in any reference frame. It is the speed of light and the speed of gravitons and the speed of anything else with zero rest mass; it is also the speed of any electron or quark at the big bang before the Higgs field appeared and slowed them down.

Here is a visual representation of the human condition according to the special theory of relativity, whose spacetime can always be represented by a Minkowski diagram of the following sort:


The absolutely past events (the green events in the diagram above) are the events in or on the backward light cone of your present event, your here-and-now. The backward light cone of event Q is the imaginary cone-shaped surface of spacetime points formed by the paths of all light rays reaching Q from the past.

The events in your absolute past are those that could have directly or indirectly affected you, the observer, at the present moment. The events in your absolute future are those that you could directly or indirectly affect.

An event's being in another event's absolute past is a feature of spacetime itself because the event is in the point's past in all possible reference frames. The feature is frame-independent. For any event in your absolute past, every observer in the universe (who isn't making an error) will agree the event happened in your past. Not so for events that are in your past but not in your absolute past. Past events not in your absolute past will be in what Eddington called your "absolute elsewhere." The absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime containing events that are not causally connectible to your here-and-now. Your absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime that is neither in nor on either your forward or backward light cones. No event here now, can affect any event in your absolute elsewhere; and no event in your absolute elsewhere can affect you here and now.

A single point's absolute elsewhere, absolute future, and absolute past partition all of spacetime beyond the point into three disjoint regions. If point A is in point B's absolute elsewhere, the two events are said to be "spacelike related." If the two are in each other's forward or backward light cones they are said to be "timelike related" or "causally connectible." The order of occurrence of two space-like events depends on the chosen frame of reference, but the order of time-like events does not.

The past light cone looks like a cone when the region we are interested in is relatively small. However, the past light cone is not cone-shaped at the cosmological level but has a pear-shape because all very ancient light lines must have originated from the infinitesimal volume at the big bang.

15. What is Time Dilation?

According to special relativity, two properly functioning, stationary clocks next to each other. Even if they were to be far away from each other, they would stay synchronized. But if one clock does move and the other does not, then the moving clock will tick slower than the stationary clock, as measured in the inertial reference frame of the stationary clock. This slowing due to motion is called "time dilation." If you move at 99% of the speed of light, then your time slows by a factor of 7 relative to stationary clocks. Your mass also increases by this amount. In addition, you are 7 times thinner along your direction of motion than when you were stationary. If you move at 99.9%, then your aging process slows by a factor of 22.

Time dilation is about two synchronized clocks getting out of synchrony due either to their relative motion or due to their being in regions of different gravitational field strengths. Time dilation due to difference in constant speeds is described by Einstein's special theory of relativity. Time dilation due to difference in acceleration or difference in travel through a varying gravitational field is described by Einstein's general theory of relativity. Suppose your twin's spaceship travels to and from a star one light year away. It takes light from your Earth-based flashlight two years to go there and back. But if the spaceship is fast, your twin brother can make the trip in less than two years, according to his own clock. Could your brother travel the distance in less time than it takes light to travel that distance? No, according to your clock on Earth he takes more than two years, and so is slower than light.

We sometimes speak of time dilation by saying time itself is "slower." Time is not going slower in any absolute sense, only relative to some other frame of reference. Does time have a rate? It depends. It is odd to say time flows at a rate of a second every second. So, we say time has no rate at all in a single reference frame. But time in a reference frame can have a rate as measured in a different frame, such as in a frame moving relative to the first frame. When there is a non-zero rate, we say there exists time dilation. Time dilation is not an illusion of perception.

Newton's physics describes duration as an absolute property, implying it is not relative to the chosen reference frame. However, in Newton's physics the speed of light is relative to the frame. Einstein's special theory of relativity reverses both of these aspects of time. For inertial frames, it implies the speed of light is not relative to the frame, but a duration is relative to the frame.

Time dilation due to motion is relative in the sense that if your spaceship moves past mine so fast that I measure your clock to be running at half speed, then you will measure my clock to be running at half speed also, provided both of us are in inertial frames. If one of us is affected by different gravitational field strengths or undergoes acceleration, then that person is not in an inertial frame and the results are different.

Both types of time dilation play a significant role in time-sensitive satellite navigation systems such as the Global Positioning System. The atomic clocks on the satellites must be programmed to compensate for the relativistic dilation effects of both gravity and motion. The first experimental verification of Einstein's prediction of time dilation occurred in a 1938 experiment by Ives and Stilwell.

For more on general relativistic dilation, see the discussion of gravity and black holes.

16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?

Spacetime in the presence of masses is curved. So, time is warped, too. The light cone structure of spacetime is affected by gravity and its description requires the general theory of relativity rather than the special theory. According to that theory, the warping of spacetime just is gravity, and vice versa. So, when spacetime tilts, so do the light cones, and that is why time is warped, too.

According to general relativity, gravitational differences affect time by dilating it. Observers in a less intense gravitational potential find that clocks in a more intense gravitational potential run slow relative to their own clocks. People live longer in basements than in attics, all other things being equal. Basement flashlights will be shifted toward the red end of the visible spectrum compared to the flashlights in attics. This effect is known as the gravitational red shift.

Informally, one speaks of gravity bending light rays around massive objects, but more accurately it is the spacetime that bends, and as a consequence the light is bent, too. The light simply follows the shortest path through spacetime (called “geodesics”), and when spacetime curves the shortest paths are no longer Euclidean straight lines.

17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?

A black hole is a body of matter-energy with a very high gravitational field strength that constitutes such a severe warp in the spacetime continuum that objects near the outer edge of the hole feel an extremely high gravitational field, and objects inside the hole cannot escape the hole, regardless of how energetic they are. Even a light wave cannot escape. The edge or outer shell of no-return is called the black hole's "event horizon." As far as we know, the closest black hole to us is at the center of the Milky Way. There is controversy in the physics literature about whether black holes are black, as first believed, or very bright.

The existence of black holes is implied by the general theory of relativity, and in these classical black holes, there is a central singularity where the mass density and spacetime curvature is infinite. However, most physicists believe that a better description of black holes will include a theory of quantum gravity that will imply the central singularity is not real and is merely an artifact of using the classical version of the general theory of relativity.

Let's consider black holes here without considering the quantum mechanical implications. When an astronomer reports that something fell into a black hole or that two neutron stars collided and turned into a single black hole, they mean this occurred as judged by an observer near the black hole, never as judged by an observer on Earth.  Here is why. If you on Earth were to observe an astronaut falling toward the event horizon of a black hole, their emitted light would become dimmer and redder, and their clock would tick progressively slower compared to your clock. You, the observer outside the black hole, could never see astronauts actually reach the horizon because the astronauts and their clocks would suffer progressively greater time dilation as they approached the horizon. You would die long before the astronauts reached the horizon. In fact, you cannot observe an astronaut falling into a black hole because it takes an infinite time for the astronaut to reach the event horizon. And from our proper frame, there has not been time for any black hole anywhere to form from a collapsed star because it takes an infinite amount of time for this to happen. Distance is strange, too. The distance from Earth to any event horizon is infinite; no wonder an astronaut has not enough time to reach the horizon.

From the infalling astronauts' perspective, though, their proper time would be unaffected. That is, they would rapidly plunge into the event horizon and perhaps also fall through it and into the black hole. Actually the situation is much more exotic inside the black hole, and it is better to think of a person or object inside the black hole as aging toward the singularity rather than moving spatially toward the singularity.

Suppose you are an astronaut who orbits very near the event horizon of a black hole. What happens to your time? It will be dilated in the sense that, if you were to return home to Earth, you'd discover that you were younger than your Earth-bound twin. Your initially synchronized clocks would show that yours had fallen behind. It is in this sense that you would have experienced a time warp, a warp in the time component of spacetime.

When we speak of the singularity located at the center of a black hole, we are not speaking accurately. The singularity is not really at a place. It is at a point of time that is infinitely in the future. Think of time and space as "switching places" inside a black hole.

18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox?

This paradox is also called the clock paradox and the twins paradox. It is an argument about time dilation that uses the special theory of relativity to produce a contradiction. Consider two twins at rest on Earth with their clocks synchronized. One twin climbs into a spaceship and flies far away at a high, constant speed, then reverses course and flies back at the same speed. An application of the equations of special relativity theory implies that because of time dilation the twin on the spaceship will return and be younger than the Earth-based twin. Here is the argument for the twin paradox. It’s all relative, isn’t it? That is, either twin could regard the other as the traveler. Let's consider the spaceship to be stationary. Wouldn’t relativity theory then imply that the Earth-based twin could race off (while attached to the Earth) and return to be the younger of the two twins? If so, when the twins reunite, each will be younger than the other. That is paradoxical.

Herbert Dingle famously argued in the 1960s that the paradox reveals an inconsistency in special relativity. Almost all philosophers and scientists now agree that it is not a true paradox, in the sense of revealing a logical inconsistency within relativity theory, but is merely a complex puzzle that can be adequately solved within relativity theory, although there is a dispute about whether the solution can occur in special relativity or only in general relativity. Those who say the resolution of the twin paradox requires only special relativity are a small minority. Einstein said the solution to the paradox requires general relativity. Max Born said, "the clock paradox is due to a false application of the special theory of relativity, namely, to a case in which the methods of the general theory should be applied." In 1921, Wolfgang Pauli said, “Of course, a complete explanation of the problem can only be given within the framework of the general theory of relativity.”

There have been a variety of suggestions in the relativity textbooks on how to understand the paradox. Here is one, diagrammed below.

twin paradox

This suggestion for solving the paradox is to apply general relativity and then note that there must be a difference in the proper time taken by the twins because their behavior is different, as shown in their two world lines above. The coordinate time, that is, the time shown by clocks fixed in space in the coordinate system, is the same for both travelers. Their proper times are not the same. The longer line in the graph represents a shorter proper time. That is, the length of the line representing the traveler's path in spacetime in the above diagram is not a correct measure of their proper time. Instead, the number of dots in the line is a measure of the proper time for the traveler. The spacing of the dots represents a tick of a clock in that world line and thus represents the proper time elapsed along the world line. The diagram shows how sitting still on Earth is a way of maximizing the proper during the trip, and it shows how flying near light speed in a spaceship away from Earth and then back again is a way of minimizing the proper time, even though if you paid attention only to the shape of the world lines and not to the dot spacing within them you might think just the reverse. Surprisingly, a vertical world line between two events in a diagram like this has the longest proper time between two events, and this is also the coordinate time. The way to maximize the time between two events that you participate in is to not move and to not vary the gravitation field you are in. So, the reasoning in the twin paradox makes a mistake, the mistake of supposing that the situation of the two twins is the same as far as elapsed proper time is concerned.

A second way to understand the twin paradox—this is not a different solution, just a different description of the solution—is to note that each twin can consider the other twin to be the one who moves, but their experiences will still be different because their situations are not symmetric. Regardless of which twin is considered to be stationary, only one twin feels the acceleration at the turnaround point, so it should not be surprising that the two situations have different implications about time. And when the gravitational fields are taken into considerations, the equations of general relativity do imply that the younger twin is the one who feels the acceleration. However, the force felt by the spaceship twin is not what "forces" that twin to be younger. Nothing is forcing the twin to be younger just as nothing is forcing there to be the same speed limit in every reference frame.

A third suggestion for how to understand the paradox is to say that only the Earthbound twin can move at a constant velocity in a single inertial frame. If the spaceship twin is to be considered in an inertial frame and moving at a constant velocity, as required by special relativity, then there must be a different frame for the Earthbound twin's return trip than the frame for the outgoing trip. But changing frames in the middle of the presentation is an improper equivocation and shows that the argument of the paradox breaks down. In short, both twins' motions cannot always be inertial.

These three resolutions of the paradox—which are really variants of the same solution—tend to leave many people unsatisfied, probably because they think of the following situation. Consider a universe that is empty except for two clocks that are moving toward each other with constant speed. The time shown on each clock can’t be less than what is shown on the other, can it? If we remove the stars and planets and other material from the universe and simply have two twins, isn't it clear that it would be inappropriate to say "there is an observable difference" due to one twin feeling an acceleration while the other does not? Won't both twins feel the same forces, and wouldn't relativity theory be incorrect if it implied that one twin returned to be younger than the other? Therefore, why does attaching the Earth to one of the twins force that twin to be the older one upon reunion? The answer to this last question requires appealing to general relativity. Notice that it is not just the Earth that is attached to the one twin. It is the Earth in tandem with all the planets and stars. When the spaceship-twin is considered to be at rest, then the planets and stars also rush away and back. Because of all this movement of mass, the turnaround isn't felt by the Earthbound twin who moves in tandem with those stars, but is felt very clearly by the spaceship twin. So, regardless of which twin is considered to be at rest, it is only the spaceship twin who feels any acceleration. Explaining this failure of the Earthbound twin to feel the force at the turnaround when the spaceship twin is at rest shows that a solution to the paradox ultimately requires a theory of the origin of inertia. But the point remains that the asymmetry in the experience of the two twins accounts for the aging difference and for the error in the argument of the twin paradox.

If you are the twin in the spaceship, then by flying fast and returning to Earth you do gradually advance into your twin's future, but your twin does not go to your past.

19. What Is the Solution to Zeno's Paradoxes?

See the article "Zeno's Paradoxes" in this encyclopedia.

20. How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?

This question is asking how we coordinatize the four-dimensional manifold. The manifold is a collection of points (technically, a topological space) which behaves as a Euclidean space in neighborhoods around any point. Coordinates applied to the space are not physically real; they are tools used by the analyst, the physicist. In other words, they are invented, not discovered.

In the late 16th century, the Italian mathematician Rafael Bombelli interpreted real numbers as lengths on a line and interpreted addition, subtraction, multiplication, and division as movements along the line. This work eventually led to our assigning real numbers to both instants and durations.

To justify the assignment of time numbers (called time coordinates or dates or clock readings) to instants, we cannot literally paste a number to an instant. What we do instead is show that the structure of the set of instantaneous events is the same as, or embeddable within, the structure of our time numbers. The structure of our time numbers is the structure of real numbers. Showing that this is so is called "solving the representation problem" for our theory of time measurement. We won't go into detail on how to solve this problem, but the main idea is that to measure any space, including a one-dimensional space of time, we need a metrification for the space. The metrification assigns location coordinates to all points and assigns distances between all pairs of points. The method of assigning these distances is called the “metric” for the space. A metrification for time assigns dates to the points we call instants of time; these assignments are called time coordinates. Normally we use a clock to do this. Point instants get assigned a unique real number coordinate, and the metric or duration between any two of those point instants is found by subtracting their time coordinates from each other. The duration is the absolute value of the numerical difference of their coordinates, that is |t(B) - t(A)| where t(B) is the time coordinate of event B and t(A) is the time coordinate of A.

Let's reconsider the question of metrification in more detail, starting with the assignment of locations to points. Any space is a collection of points. In a space that is supposed to be time, these points are the instants, and the space for time is presumably linear (since presumably time is one-dimensional). Before discussing time coordinates specifically, let's consider what is meant by assigning coordinates to a mathematical space, one that might represent either physical space, or physical time, or spacetime, or the two-dimensional mathematical space in which we graph the relationship between the price of rice in China and the wholesale price of tulips in Holland. In a one-dimensional space, such as a curving line, we assign unique coordinate numbers to points along the line, and we make sure that no point fails to have a coordinate. For a two-dimensional space, we assign ordered pairs of numbers to points. For a 3-d space, we assign ordered triplets of numbers. Why numbers and not letters? If we assign letters instead of numbers, we can not use the tools of mathematics to describe the space. But even if we do assign numbers, we cannot assign any coordinate numbers we please. There are restrictions. If the space has a certain geometry, then we have to assign numbers that reflect this geometry. If event A occurs before event B, then the time coordinate of event A, namely t(A), must be less than t(B). If event B occurs after event A but before event C, then we should assign coordinates so that t(A) < t(B) < t(C). Here is the fundamental method of this analytic geometry:

Consider a space as a class of fundamental entities: points. The class of points has "structure" imposed upon it, constituting it as a geometry—say the full structure of space as described by Euclidean geometry. [By assigning coordinates] we associate another class of entities with the class of points, for example a class of ordered n-tuples of real numbers [for a n-dimensional space], and by means of this "mapping" associate structural features of the space described by the geometry with structural features generated by the relations that may hold among the new class of entities—say functional relations among the reals. We can then study the geometry by studying, instead, the structure of the new associated system [of coordinates]. (Sklar, 1976, p. 28)

The goal in assigning coordinates to a space is to create a reference system for the space. A reference system is a reference frame plus (or including [the literature is ambiguous on this point]) a coordinate system. Or if the space cannot be spanned with a single coordinate system, then we use an atlas of coordinate systems, each of which is called a "chart" and is placed by the analyst upon the space to uniquely name all the points. The coordinates are frame dependent in that a point can get a different coordinate when the reference system's frame is changed, say by putting the coordinate system into motion relative to where it was previously. For 4-d spacetime obeying special relativity with its Lorentzian geometry, a coordinate system is a grid of smooth timelike and spacelike curves on the spacetime that assigns to each point three space coordinate numbers and one time coordinate number. No two distinct points can have the same set of four coordinate numbers.

Inertial frames can have global coordinate systems, but in general we have to make due with atlases. If we are working with general relativity where spacetime can curve and we cannot assume inertial frames, then the best we can do is to assign a coordinate system to a small region of spacetime where the laws of special relativity hold to a good approximation. General relativity requires special relativity to hold locally, and thus for spacetime to be Euclidean locally. That means that locally the 4-d spacetime is correctly described by 4-d Euclidean solid geometry.

As we get more global, we have to make adjustments. Consider two coordinate systems on adjacent regions. For the adjacent regions, we make sure that the 'edges' of the two coordinate systems match up in the sense that each point near the intersection of the two coordinate systems gets a unique set of four coordinates and that nearby points get nearby coordinate numbers. The result is an "atlas" on spacetime.

For small regions of spacetime, we create a coordinate system by choosing a style of grid, say rectangular coordinates, fixing a point as being the origin, selecting one timelike and three spacelike lines to be the axes, and defining a unit of distance for each dimension. We cannot use letters for coordinates. The alphabet's structure is too simple. Integers won't do either; but real numbers are adequate to the task. The definition of "coordinate system" requires us to assign our real numbers in such a way that numerical betweenness among the coordinate numbers reflects the betweenness relation among points. For example, if we assign numbers 17, pi, and 101.3 to instants, then every interval of time that contains the pi instant and the 101.3 instant had better contain the 17 instant. When this feature holds everywhere, the coordinate assignment is said to "be monotonic" or to "obey the continuity requirement."

Because mathematical spaces are used for so many different purposes, the unit of distance measurement might be a meter or a second or a price in yen, depending on the space we are working with. The choice of the unit of distance presupposes we already have defined what "distance" means. The metric for a space is what specifies what is meant by distance in that space.

The natural metric between any two points in a one-dimensional space, such as the time sub-space of our spacetime, is the absolute value of the numerical difference between the coordinates of the two points. Using this metric for time, the duration between an event with the coordinate 11 and the event with coordinate 7 is 5. The metric for spacetime defines the spacetime interval between two spacetime locations, and it is more complicated than the metric for time alone, as we have discussed elsewhere in this Supplement. The spacetime interval between any two events is invariant or unchanged by a change to any other reference frame. More accurately, in the general theory, the infinitesimal spacetime interval between two neighboring points is invariant.

There are still other restrictions on the assignments of coordinate numbers. The restriction that we called the "conventionality of simultaneity" fixes what time-slices of spacetime can be counted as collections of simultaneous events. An even more complicated restriction is that coordinate assignments satisfy the demands of general relativity. The metric of spacetime in general relativity is not global but varies from place to place due to the presence of matter and gravitation. Spacetime cannot be given its coordinate numbers without our knowing the distribution of matter and energy.

The features that a space has without its points being assigned any coordinates whatsoever are its topological features, its differential structures and affine structures. The topological features include its dimensionality, whether it goes on forever or has a boundary, and how many points there are. The affine structure is about lines, the geodesics. Differential structure allows us to use the differential calculus on the manifold.

21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?

Ideally for any reference frame we would like to partition the set of all actual events into simultaneity equivalence classes by some reliable method. All events in the same class are said to happen at the same time in the frame, and every event is in some class or other. Consider what event near the supergiant star Betelgeuse is happening (at the same time as our) now. That is a difficult question to answer, so let's begin our discussion with some easier questions.

What is happening at time zero in our coordinate system? There is no way to select one point of spacetime and call it the origin of the coordinate system except by reference to actual events. In practice, we make the origin be the location of a special event.

Our purpose in choosing a coordinate system or atlas is to express relationships among actual and possible events. The time relationships we are interested in are time-order relationships (Did this event occur between those two?) and magnitude-duration relationships (How long after A did B occur?) and date-time relationships (When did event A itself occur?). The date of a (point) event is the time coordinate number of the spacetime location where the event occurs. We expect all these assignments of dates to events to satisfy the requirement that event A happens before event B iff t(A) < t(B), where t(A) is the time coordinate of A, namely its date. The assignments of dates to events also must satisfy the demands of our physical theories, and in this case we face serious problems involving inconsistency as when a geologist gives one date for the birth of Earth, an astronomer gives a different date, and a theologian gives yet another date.

It is a big step from assigning numbers to points of spacetime to assigning them to real events. Here are some of the questions that need answers. How do we determine whether a nearby event and a very distant event occurred simultaneously? Assuming we want the second to be the standard unit for measuring the time interval between two events, how do we operationally define the second so we can measure whether one event occurred exactly one second later than another event? A related question is: How do we know whether the clock we have is accurate? Less fundamentally, attention must also be paid to the dependency of dates due to shifting from Standard Time to Daylight Savings Time, to crossing the International Date Line, to switching from the Julian to the Gregorian Calendar, and to comparing regular years with leap years.

Let's design a coordinate system for time. Suppose we have already assigned a date of zero to the event that we choose to be at the origin of our coordinate system. To assign dates (that is, time coordinates) to other events, we first must define a standard clock and declare that the time intervals between any two consecutive ticks of that clock are the same. The second is our conventional unit of time measurement, and it will be defined to be so many ticks of the standard clock. We then synchronize other clocks with the standard clock so the clocks show equal readings at the same time, when they are all relatively stationary and also not affected differently by gravitational fields. The time or date at which a point event occurs is the number reading on the clock at rest there. If there is no clock there, the assignment process is more complicated. One could transport a synchronized clock to that place, but any clock speed or influence by a gravitational field during the transport will need to be compensated for. If the place is across the galaxy, then any transport is out of the question, and other means must be used.

Because we want to use clocks to assign a time (coordinate) even to very distant events, not just to events in the immediate vicinity of the clock, and because we want to do this correctly, some appreciation of Einstein's theory of relativity is required. A major difficulty is that two nearby synchronized clocks, namely clocks that have been calibrated and set to show the same time when they are next to each other, will not in general stay synchronized if one is transported somewhere else. If they undergo the same motions and gravitational influences, they will stay synchronized; otherwise, they won't. There is no privileged transportation process that we can appeal to. For more on how to assign dates to distant events, see the discussion of the relativity and conventionality of simultaneity.

As a practical matter, dates are assigned to events in a wide variety of ways. The date of the birth of the Sun is assigned very differently from dates assigned to two successive crests of a light wave in a laboratory laser. For example, there are lasers whose successive crests of visible light waves pass by a given location in the laboratory every 10-15 seconds. This short time isn't measured with a stopwatch. It is computed from measurements of the light's wavelength. We rely on electromagnetic theory for the equation connecting the periodic time of the wave to its wavelength and speed. Dates for other kinds of events, such as the birth of Mohammad or the origin of the Sun, are computed from historical records rather than directly measured with a clock.

22. What Is Essential to Being a Clock?

Clocks are physically observable objects that can be used to assign times to instants and to assign durations to longer events. Clocks must tick and count those ticks and convert the ticks to measures of time, and have a means of displaying the time. Not just any ticking will do. Ideally, the ticks need to be regular in the sense that the duration between any tick and the next tick is the same duration. The technical term is that durations between ticks are congruent.

We need predictable, regular, cyclic behavior in order to measure time. In a pendulum clock, the cyclic behavior is the swings of the pendulum. In a digital clock, the cycles are oscillations in an electronic circuit. In a sundial, the cycles are daily movements of a shadow. The rotating Earth is a clock that ticks once a day (in a reference frame in which the stars are approximately stationary), or it would be a clock if we were to add the feature that there is some counting of those ticks and displaying of the times. Similarly, the revolving Earth can be used as a clock that ticks once a year. A calendar is not a clock.

The count of a clock's ticks is normally converted and displayed in seconds—or in some other standard unit of time such as days or years. This counting can be difficult if the ticks are very many per second. Our standard atomic clock ticks 9,192,631,770 times per second.

It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers. It is also a convention that we re-set our clock by one hour as we move across a time-zone on the Earth's surface, or that we add leap days and leap seconds. However, it is no convention that in a reference frame the duration from instantaneous event A to instant B plus the duration from B to instant C is equal to the duration from A to C. It is one of the objective characteristics of time.

We like to use clocks that are in synchrony. That is, we want them to tick at the same rate when they are not moving relative to each other. This implies that, for any event, they agree on the duration of the event. However, we want more than synchrony. We also want our clocks to be accurate.

23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to be Accurate?

An accurate clock is a clock that is in synchrony with the standard clock. When the time measurements of the clock agree with the measurements made using the standard clock, we say the clock is accurate or properly calibrated or synchronized with the standard clock or simply correct. A perfectly accurate clock shows that it is time t just when the standard clock shows that it is time t, for all t. Accuracy is different from precision. If four clocks read exactly thirteen minutes slow compared to the standard clock, then the four are very precise, but they all are inaccurate by thirteen minutes.

If other clocks are synchronized with the standard clock when both are stationary, then those other clocks need to be used in a reference frame in which the standard clock is stationary, or else time dilation will make the clocks be inaccurate.

One philosophical issue is whether the standard clock itself is accurate. Realists will say that the standard clock is our best guess as to what time it really is, and we can make incorrect choices for our standard clock. Anti-realists will say that the standard clock cannot, by definition, be inaccurate, so any choice of a standard clock, even the choice of the president's heartbeat as our standard clock, will yield a standard clock that is accurate. Leibniz would qualify as an anti-realist because he said the best we can do in setting our clocks is to place them in synchrony with each other. Newton would disagree and say that for the standard clock to be accurate it must tick in synchrony with time itself.

Let's reconsider the answer to the question: Can the time shown on a standard clock can be inaccurate? There are a variety of answers to this question.

  1. Yes, because what we mean by accurate is the average of the many standard clocks, about 200 of them, and any single one could fail to be in sync with the average. That is why standard clocks get re-set every month.

So, let’s rephrase the question: Can the average time shown on our standard clocks be inaccurate?

  1. No, because the goal for accuracy is the best known clock, and that is just the average of our current standard clocks.
  2. Yes because the goal for accuracy is absolute time.
  3. Yes because the goal for accuracy is the best possible clock, and we don’t know what that is yet; we would need to see into the future.

Of the four answers, most physicists prefer answer (2).

A clock measures its own proper time, namely the times along its own worldline. If the clock is in an inertial frame and not moving relative to the standard clock, then it measures the "coordinate time," the time we agree to use in the coordinate system. If the spacetime has no inertial frame, then that spacetime cannot have an ordinary, Euclidean coordinate time.

Because clocks are intended to be used to measure events external to themselves, another goal in clock building is to ensure there is no difficulty in telling which clock tick is simultaneous with which events to be measured that are occurring away from the clock. For some situations and clocks, the sound made by the ticking helps us make this determination. We hear the tick just as we see the event occur that we desire to measure. Note that doing this presupposes that we can ignore the difference between the speed of sound and the speed of light.

In our discussion so far, we have assumed that the clock is very small, that it can count any part of a second and that it can count high enough to provide information for our calendars and longer-term records. These aren't always good assumptions. Despite those practical problems, there is the theoretical problem of there being a physical limit to the shortest duration measurable by a given clock because no clock can measure events whose duration is shorter than the time it takes light to travel between the components of that clock, the components in the part that generates the sequence of regular ticks. This theoretical limit places a lower limit on the error margin of any measurement made with that clock.

Every physical motion of every clock is subject to disturbances. So, to be an accurate clock, one that is in synchrony with the standard clock, we want our clock to be adjustable in case it drifts out of synchrony a bit. It helps to keep it isolated from environmental influences such as heat, dust, unusual electromagnetic fields, physical blows (such as dropping the clock), and immersion in the ocean. And it helps to be able to predict how much a specific influence affects the drift out of synchrony so that there can be an adjustment for this influence.

24. What Is Our Standard Clock?

In our earth-based reference frame, our standard clock is the clock that other motionless clocks are synchronized with. We want to select as our standard clock a clock that we can be reasonably confident will tick regularly in the sense that all periods between adjacent ticks are congruent (that is, the same duration). Choosing a standard clock that is based on the beats of the president's heart would be a poor choice because stationary clocks everywhere would go out of synchrony with the standard clock when the president goes jogging.

Most nations agree on what clock is the standard clock. The international time standard used by most nations is called Coordinated Universal Time [or U.T.C. time, for the initials of the French name]. It is not based on only a single standard clock but rather on a large group of them. Here are more details about U.T.C. time.

Atomic Time or A.T. time is what is produced by a cesium-based atomic fountain clock that counts in seconds, where those seconds are the S.I. seconds or Système International seconds (in the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d'Unités). The S.I. second is defined to be the time it takes for a motionless standard cesium atomic clock to emit exactly 9,192,631,770 cycles of radiation of a certain color of light that is emitted from the clock’s cloud of cesium 133 atoms. This frequency is very stable. (More details about this process are offered below. As physics research continues to improve time measurement, the standard use of the cesium clock is likely to be changed by convention to clocks with even more stable frequencies.)

Actually, for the more precise timekeeping, the T.A.I. time scale is used rather than the A.T. scale. The T.A.I. scale does not use merely a single standard cesium clock but rather a calculated average of the readings of about 200 official cesium atomic clocks that are distributed around the world in about fifty selected laboratories. One of those laboratories is the National Institute of Standards and Technology in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. This calculated average time is called T.A.I. time, the abbreviation of the French phrase for International Atomic Time. The International Bureau of Weights and Measures near Paris performs the averaging about once a month. If your laboratory in the T.A.I. system had sent in your clock's reading for certain events that occurred in the previous month, then in the following month, the Bureau would calculate the average answer for the clock readings, then send you a report of how inaccurate your guess was from the average, so you could make adjustments to your clock.

Coordinated Universal Time or U.T.C. time is T.A.I. time plus or minus some integral number of leap seconds. U.T.C. is, by agreement, the time at the Prime Meridian, the longitude that runs through Greenwich England. The official government time is different in the time zones in different countries. In the U.S.A., for example, the government time is U.T.C. time minus the hourly offsets for the appropriate time zones of the U.S.A. including whether daylight savings time is observed. U.T.C. time is informally called Zulu Time, and it is the time used by the Internet and the aviation industry throughout the world.

A.T. time, T.A.I. time, and U.T.C. time are not kinds of physical time but rather kinds of measurements of physical time. So, this is another reason why the word "time" is ambiguous; sometimes it means unmeasured time, and sometimes it means the measure of that time. Speakers rarely take care to say explicitly how they are using the term, so readers need to stay alert, even in the present Supplement and in the main Time article.

At the 13th General Conference on Weights and Measures in 1967, the definition of a second was changed from a certain fraction of a solar day to a specific number of periods of radiation produced by an atomic clock. This new second is the so-called "standard second" or S.I. second. It is now defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods (cycles, oscillations, vibrations) of a certain kind of microwave radiation emitted in the standard cesium atomic clock. More specifically, the second is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods of the microwave radiation required to produce the maximum fluorescence of a small cloud of cesium 133 atoms (that is, their radiating a specific color of light) as an electron in the atom makes a transition between two specific hyperfine energy levels of the ground state of the atom. This is the internationally agreed upon unit for atomic time [the T.A.I. system]. The old astronomical system [Universal Time 1 or UT1] defined a second to be 1/86,400 of an an average solar day.

For this "atomic time," or time measured atomically, the atoms of cesium are cooled to near absolute zero and given a uniform energy while trapped in an atomic fountain or optical lattice and irradiated with microwaves. The frequency of the microwave radiation is tuned until maximum fluorescence is achieved. That is, it is adjusted until the maximum number of cesium atoms flip from one energy level to another, showing that the microwave radiation frequency is precisely tuned to be 9,192,631,770 vibrations per second. Because this frequency for maximum fluorescence is so stable from one experiment to the next, the vibration number is accurate to this many significant digits.

The meter depends on the second, so time measurement is more basic than space measurement. It does not follow, though, that time is more basic than space. After 1983, scientists agreed that the best way to define and to measure length between any two points A and B is to do it via measuring the number of periods of a light beam reaching from A to B. This is for three reasons: (i) light propagation is very stable or regular; its speed is constant, or when not constant such as its moving through air instead of a vacuum, we know how to compensate for the influence of the medium; (ii) a light wave's frequency can also be made very stable; and (iii) distance can not be measured more accurately.

In 1999, the meter was defined in terms of the (pre-defined) second as being the distance light travels in a vacuum in an inertial reference frame in exactly 0.000000003335640952 seconds, or 1/299,792,458 seconds. That number is picked by convention so that the new meter will be very nearly the same distance as the old meter that was once defined to be the distance between two specific marks on a platinum bar that was kept in the Paris Observatory.

Time can be measured not only more accurately than distance but also more accurately than voltage, temperature, mass, or anything else.

One subtle implication of the standard definition of the second and the meter is that they fix the speed of light in a vacuum in all inertial frames. The speed is exactly one meter per 0.000000003335640952 seconds or 299,792,458 meters per second, or approximately 186,282 miles per second or about three million football fields per second. There can no longer be any direct measurement to see if that is how fast light really moves; it is simply defined to be moving that fast. Any measurement that produced a different value for the speed of light would be presumed initially to have an error. The error would be in, say, its measurements of lengths and durations, or in its assumptions about being in an inertial frame, or in its adjustments for the influence of gravitation and acceleration, or in its assumption that the light was moving in a vacuum. This initial presumption of where the error lies comes from a deep reliance by scientists on Einstein's theory of relativity. However, if it were eventually decided by the community of scientists that the speed of light shouldn't have been fixed as it was, then the scientists would call for a new world convention to re-define the second.

Leap years (with their leap days) are needed as adjustments to the standard clock in order to account for the fact that the number of the Earth’s rotations per Earth revolution does not stay constant from year to year. The Earth is spinning slower every day. Without an adjustment, our midnights will drift into the daylight. Leap seconds are needed for another reason. The Earth's period changes irregularly due to earthquakes and hurricanes. This effect is not practically predictable, so, when the irregularity occurs, a leap second is added or subtracted every six months as needed.

25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?

Other clocks ideally are calibrated by being synchronized to "the" standard clock, but some choices of standard clock are better than others. The philosophical question is whether the better choice is objectively better because it gives us an objectively more accurate clock, or whether the choice is a matter merely of convenience and makes our concept of time a more useful tool for doing physics. The issue is one of realism vs. instrumentalism. Let's consider the various goals we want to achieve in choosing one standard clock rather than another.

One goal is to choose a clock that doesn't drift very much. That is, we want a clock that has a very regular period—so the durations between ticks are congruent. Throughout history, scientists have detected that their currently-chosen standard clock seemed to be drifting. In about 1700, scientists discovered that the time from one day to the next, as determined by sunrises, varied throughout the year. Therefore, they decided to define durations in terms of the mean day throughout the year. Before the 1950s, the standard clock was defined astronomically in terms of the mean rotation of the Earth upon its axis [solar time]. For a short period in the 1950s and 1960s, it was defined in terms of the revolution of the Earth about the Sun [ephemeris time]. The second was defined to be 1/86,400 of the mean solar day, the average throughout the year of the rotational period of the Earth with respect to the Sun.

Now we've found a better standard clock, a certain kind of atomic clock [which displays "atomic time"] that was discussed in the previous section of this Supplement. All atomic clocks measure time in terms of the natural resonant frequencies of certain atoms or molecules. (The dates of adoption of these standard clocks is omitted in this paragraph because different international organizations adopted different standards in different years.) The U.S.A.'s National Institute of Standards and Technology's F-1 atomic fountain clock, that is used for reporting standard time in the U.S.A. (after adjustment so it reports the average from the other laboratories in the T.A.I. network), is so accurate that it drifts by less than one second every 300 million years. We know there is this drift because it is implied by the laws of physics, not because we have a better clock that measures this drift. With engineering improvements, the "300 million" number may improve.

In 2014, several physicists writing in the journal Nature Physics suggested someday replacing our current standard clock with a network of atomic clocks that are connected via quantum entanglement. They claim that this new clock would not lose a second in 1380 million years, which is the approximate age of the universe since the big bang.

To achieve the goal of restricting drift, we isolate the clock from outside effects. That is, a practical goal in selecting a standard clock is to find a clock that can be well insulated from environmental impact such as comets impacting the Earth, earthquakes, stray electric fields or the presence of dust. If not insulation, then we pursue the goal of compensation. If there is some theoretically predictable effect of the influence upon the standard clock, then the clock can be regularly adjusted to compensate for this effect.

Consider the insulation problem we would have if we were to use as our standard clock the mean yearly motion of the Earth around the Sun. Can we compensate for all the relevant disturbing effects on the motion of the Earth around the Sun? Not easily. The problem is that the Earth's rate of spin varies in a practically unpredictable manner. Meanwhile, we believe that the relevant factors affecting the spin (such as shifts in winds, comet bombardment, earthquakes, the ocean's tides and currents, convection in Earth's molten core) are affecting the rotational speed and period of revolution of the Earth, but not affecting the behavior of the atomic clock. We don't want to be required to say that an earthquake on Earth or the melting of Greenland ice caused a change in the frequency of cesium emissions throughout the galaxies.

We add leap days and seconds in order to keep our atomic-based calendar in synchrony with the rotations and revolutions of the Earth. We want to keep atomic-noons occurring on astronomical-noons and ultimately to prevent Northern hemisphere winters from occurring in some future July, so we systematically add leap years and leap seconds and leap microseconds in the counting process. These changes do not affect the duration of a second, but they do affect the duration of a year because, with leap years, not all years last the same number of seconds. In this way, we compensate for the Earth-Sun clocks falling out of synchrony with our standard clock.

Another desirable feature of a standard clock is that reproductions of it stay in synchrony with each other when environmental conditions are the same. Otherwise we may be limited to relying on a specifically-located standard clock that can't be trusted elsewhere and that can be stolen. Cesium clocks in a suburb of Istanbul work just like cesium clocks in an airplane over New York City.

The principal goal in selecting a standard clock is to reduce mystery in physics by finding a periodic process that, if adopted as our standard, makes the resulting system of physical laws simpler and more useful, and allows us to explain phenomena that otherwise would be mysterious. Choosing an atomic clock as standard is much better for this purpose than choosing the periodic dripping of water from our goat skin bag or even the periodic revolution of the Earth about the Sun. If scientists were to have retained the Earth-Sun clock as the standard clock and were to say that by definition the Earth does not slow down in any rotation or in any revolution, then when a comet collides with Earth, tempting the scientists to say the Earth's period of rotation and revolution changed , the scientists would be forced instead to alter, among many other things, their atomic theory and say the frequency of light emitted from cesium atoms mysteriously increases all over the universe when comets collide with Earth. By switching to the cesium atomic standard, these alterations are unnecessary, and the mystery vanishes.

To achieve the goal of choosing a standard clock that maximally reduces mystery, we want the clock's readings to be consistent with the accepted laws of motion, in the following sense. Newton's first law of motion says that a body in motion should continue to cover the same distance during the same time interval unless acted upon by an external force. If we used our standard clock to run a series of tests of the time intervals as a body coasted along a carefully measured path, and we found that the law was violated and we couldn't account for this mysterious violation by finding external forces to blame and we were sure that there was no problem otherwise with Newton's law or with the measurement of the length of the path, then the problem would be with the clock. Leonhard Euler [1707-1783] was the first person to suggest this consistency requirement on our choice of a standard clock. A similar argument holds today but with using the laws of motion from Einstein's theory of relativity.

What it means for the standard clock to be accurate depends on your philosophy of time. If you are a conventionalist, then once you select the standard clock it can not fail to be accurate in the sense of being correct. On the other hand, if you are an objectivist, you will say the standard clock can be inaccurate. There are different sorts of objectivists. Suppose we ask the question, "Can the time shown on a properly functioning standard clock be inaccurate?" The answer is "no" if the target is to be in synchrony with the current standard clock, as the conventionalists believe, but "yes" if there is another target. Objectivists can propose at least three distinct targets: (1) absolute time in Newton's sense, (2) the best possible clock, and (3) the best known clock. We do not have a way of knowing whether our current standard clock is close to target 1 or target 2. But if the best known clock has not yet been chosen to be the standard clock, then the current standard clock can be inaccurate in sense 3.

When you want to know how long a basketball game lasts, why do we subtract the start time from the end time? The answer is that we accept a metric for duration in which we subtract two time numbers to determine the duration between the two. Why don't we choose another metric and, let's say, subtract the square root of the start time from the square root of the end time? This question is implicitly asking whether our choice of metric can be incorrect or merely inconvenient.

Let's say more about this. When we choose a standard clock, we are choosing a metric. By agreeing to read the clock so that a duration from 3:00 to 5:00 is 5-3 hours or 2 hours, we are making a choice about how to compare any two durations in order to decide whether they are equal, that is, congruent. We suppose the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 as shown by yesterday's reading of the standard clock was the same as the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 on the readings from two days ago, and will be the same for today's readings and tomorrow's readings. Philosophers of time continue to dispute the extent to which the choice of metric is conventional rather than objective in the sense of being forced on us by nature. The objectivist says the choice is forced and that the success of the standard atomic clock over the standard solar clock shows that we were more accurate in our choice of the standard clock. An objectivist disagrees and believes that whether two intervals of time are really equivalent is an intrinsic feature of nature, so choosing the standard clock is not any more conventional than our choosing to say the Earth is round rather than flat. Taking this conventional side on this issue, Adolf Grünbaum argues that time is "metrically amorphous." It has no intrinsic metric. Instead, we choose the metric we do in order only to achieve the goals of reducing mystery in science, but satisfying those goals is no sign of being correct.

The conventionalist as opposed to the objectivist would say that if we were to require by convention that the instant at which Jesus was born and the instant at which Abraham Lincoln was assassinated are to be only 24 seconds apart, whereas the duration between Lincoln's assassination and his burial is to be 24 billion seconds, then we could not be mistaken. It is up to us as a civilization to say what is correct when we first create our conventions about measuring duration. We can consistently assign any numerical time coordinates we wish, subject only to the condition that the assignment properly reflect the betweenness relations of the events that occur at those instants. That is, if event J (birth of Jesus) occurs before event L (Lincoln's assassination) and this in turn occurs before event B (burial of Lincoln), then the time assigned to J must be numerically less than the time assigned to L, and both must be less than the time assigned to B so that t(J) < t(L) < t(B). A simple requirement. Yes, but the implication is that this relationship among J, L, and B must hold for events simultaneous with J, and for all events simultaneous with K, and so forth.

It is other features of nature that lead us to reject the above convention about 24 seconds and 24 billion seconds. What features? There are many periodic processes in nature that have a special relationship to each other; their periods are very nearly constant multiples of each other; and this constant stays the same over a long time. For example, the period of the rotation of the Earth is a fairly constant multiple of the period of the revolution of the Earth around the Sun, and both these periods are a constant multiple of the periods of a swinging pendulum and of vibrations of quartz crystals. The class of these periodic processes is very large, so the world will be easier to describe if we choose our standard clock from one of these periodic processes. A good convention for what is regular will make it easier for scientists to find simple laws of nature and to explain what causes other events to be irregular. It is the search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery that leads us to adopt the conventions we do for numerical time coordinate assignments and thus leads us to choose the standard clock we do choose. Objectivists disagree and say this search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery is all fine, but it is directing us toward the intrinsic metric, not simply the useful metric.

26. What is a Field?

A field is something filling the universe that takes on a value everywhere. Field theory has the advantage that, if you want to know what will happen next, you don't have to consider the influence of everything in the universe, but only nearby field values. For example, to figure out what happens to a thrown ball that is influenced only by gravity, Newton's theory of gravity requires consideration of gravitational forces on the ball from all the other matter in the universe at the instant the ball is thrown. In field theory, one need only consider the gravitational field near the ball's location. However, Newton's theory of gravity is often practical to use because gravitational forces get weaker with distance, so in most calculations that don't require extreme accuracy one can ignore the very distant objects and consider only the large nearby objects.

Quantum field theory of the Standard Model of Particle Physics is a theory of non-classical physics that treats a material particle as a localized vibration in a field. The vibration is a fuzzy bundle of energy occupying a region of space bigger than a single point. The propagation is due to the fact that, over time, any changes in the field values induce nearby changes. The particle of the electromagnetic field is called the "photon," and the particle of the gravitational field is called the "graviton.

There are many fields that co-exist. There are twelve matter fields (such as the electron field and the up quark field), four force fields (such as the electromagnetic field and the gravitational field) and the Higgs field (whose interactions [or not] with a particle cause the particle to have mass [or no mass]). As far as physicists know, these fields have existed either forever, or since the big bang, or at least since 10-33 seconds after the big bang (because there is no reliable physical theory that explains what happens any earlier).

According to quantum field theory, a field cannot be removed from existence; it exists everywhere even if its values are all zero. Yet, even when its value is zero somewhere, because of the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle there is always a probability that its value will spontaneously change to non-zero as a particle and its anti-particle spontaneously come into existence.

What is the relationship between spacetime and these fields? The most common position among physicists is that spacetime is a geometric entity. However, many physicists believe instead that spacetime is really a physical field, perhaps the gravitational field, but a field that can be described by geometrical means. Then there is the question of whether this spacetime field grounds all other physical fields, or is just one of the many fields.

It is not at all clear that a distinction can be maintained between spacetime and the other fields because the energy contained in the matter fields of spacetime cannot be clearly separated from the gravitational energy of spacetime itself. Gravitational energy can be transformed into the energy of the matter fields, and vice versa. There are significant metaphysical implications for this breakdown of the common distinction. Many physicists believe that, even though it is common for physicists including themselves to say it is, strictly speaking the universe is not composed of various fields; it is composed of a single entity, the quantum field, which has such a character that it appears as if it is composed of various fields.

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Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.