Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Time Supplement

This supplement answers a series of questions designed to reveal more about what science requires of physical time, and to provide background information about other topics discussed in the Time article.

Table of Contents

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Spacetime Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Partly Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What Is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean For a Clock To Be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?

1. What Are Instants and Durations?

A duration is an amount of time. The duration of Earth’s existence is about five billion years; the duration of a flash of lightning is 0.0002 seconds. The second is the standard unit for the measurement of duration [in the S.I. system (the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d'Unités)]. In informal conversation, an instant is a very short duration. In physics, however, an instant is instantaneous; it is not a very short duration but rather a point in time of zero duration. It is assumed in physics that a finite duration of a real event is always a linear continuum of the instants that compose the duration, but it is an interesting philosophical question to ask how physicists know this.

2. What Is an Event?

In ordinary discourse, an event is a happening lasting a finite duration during which some object changes its properties. For example, this morning’s event of buttering the toast is the toast’s changing from unbuttered to buttered. In ordinary discourse, unlike in physics, events are not basic, but rather are defined in terms of something more basic—objects and their properties. In physics it is the other way round. Events are basic, and objects are defined in terms of them.

When physicists speak of a point in a spacetime diagram being a spacetime event, they mean a point place and instant of time where something might or might not happen. That is not an ordinary use of the word “event” because no change needs to be taking place there then. In physics, the word “event” is a technical term that differs from the way we use it in ordinary language because an event for a physicist is merely a moment in time plus a location in space. In ordinary discourse an event must involve a change in some property; the physicist’s event does not have this requirement. A physicist’s event at a place is called a “point event,” and, for the physicist, all other events are said to be composed of point events.

A mathematical space is a collection of points, and the points might represent anything, for example, dollars. But the points of a real space, that is, a physical space, are locations. For example, the place called “New York City” at one time is composed of the actual point locations which occur within the city’s boundary at that time.  A point event in a spacetime diagram is merely a tiniest place in space where an event might or might not be known to happen at that instant. That is, at some location in the past, such as at all the point locations constituting the Ford Theater in Washington DC on April 14, 1865, we might know that the event of U.S. President Abraham Lincoln’s assassination occurred there.

The physicists’ notion of point event is metaphysically unacceptable to many philosophers, in part because it deviates so much from the way “event” is used in ordinary language. In 1936, in order to avoid point events, Bertrand Russell and A. N. Whitehead developed a theory of time based on the assumption that all events in spacetime have a finite, non-zero duration. However, they had to assume that any finite part of an event is an event, and this assumption is no closer to common sense than the physicist’s assumption that all events are composed of point events. The encyclopedia article on Zeno’s Paradoxes mentions that Michael Dummett and Frank Arntzenius have continued in the 21st century to develop Russell’s and Whitehead’s idea that any event must have a non-zero duration.

McTaggart argued early in the twentieth century that events change. For example, the event of Queen Anne’s death is changing because it is receding ever farther into the past as time goes on. It is an open question in philosophy as to whether the passage of time is a feature of the world to be explained by noting how events change, such as their changing by growing deeper into the past. Many other philosophers believe it is improper to consider an event to be something that can change. This is still an open question in philosophy.

For a more detailed discussion of what an event is, see the article on Events.

3. What Is a Reference Frame?

A reference frame for a space is a standard point of view or a perspective for making observations, measurements and judgments about points of space and phenomena that take place there. Usually a reference frame is specified by choosing a coordinate system.

Choosing a good reference frame can make a situation much easier to describe. If you are trying to describe the motion of a car down a straight highway, you would not want to choose a reference frame that is fixed to a spinning carousel. Instead, choose a reference frame fixed to the highway.

A reference frame is often specified by selecting a solid object that doesn’t change its size and by saying that the reference frame is fixed to the object. We might select a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar. Another object is said to be at rest in the reference frame if it remains at a constant distance in a fixed direction from the Rock of Gibraltar. For example, your house is at rest in a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar [not counting your house's vibrating when a truck drives by, nor the house's speed due to plate tectonics]. When we say the Sun rose this morning, we are implicitly choosing a reference frame fixed to the Earth’s surface. The Sun is not at rest in this reference frame but the Earth is.

The reference frame or coordinate system must specify locations, and this is normally done by assigning numbers to points of space. In a flat (that is, Euclidean) three-dimensional space, the analyst who wants to assign a Cartesian (that is, flat or rectangular) coordinate system to the space will need to specify four distinct points on the reference body, or four objects mutually at rest somewhere in the frame. In a Cartesian coordinate system, one of the four points is the origin, and the other three can be used to define three independent, perpendicular axes, the familiar x, y and z directions. Two point objects are at the same place if they have the same x-value, the same y-value and the same z-value. To keep track of events rather than simply 3-d objects, you the analyst will need a time axis, a “t” axis, and so you will expand your three-dimensional mathematical space to a four-dimensional mathematical space. Two point events are identical if they occur at the same place and also at the same time. In this way, the analyst is placing a four-dimensional coordinate system on the space and time. The coordinates could have been letters instead of numbers, but numbers are the best choice because we want to use them for measurement, not just for naming places and events.

The fact that physical spacetime has curvature implies that no single rigid (or Cartesian) coordinate system is capable of covering the entire spacetime. To cover all of spacetime in that case, we must make do with covering different regions of spacetime with different coordinate patches that are “knitted together” where one patch meets another. No single Cartesian coordinate system can cover the surface of a sphere without creating a singularity, but the sphere can be covered by patching together coordinate systems. Nevertheless if we can live with non-rigid curvilinear coordinates, then any curved spacetime can be covered with a global four-dimensional coordinate system in which every point being uniquely identified with a set of four numbers in a continuous way. That is, we use a curved coordinate system on curved spacetime.

That we use four numbers per point conventionally indicates the space is four-dimensional. In creating reference frames for spaces, the usual assumption is that we should supply n independent numbers to specify a place in an n-dimensional space, where n is an integer. This is usual but not required; instead we could exploit the idea that there are space-filling curves which permit a single continuous curve to completely fill, and thus coordinatize, a region of dimension higher than one, such as a plane. For this reason (namely, that each point in n-dimensional space doesn’t always need n numbers to uniquely name the point), the contemporary definition of “dimension” is rather exotic.

Inertial frames are very special reference frames; see below.

4. What Is an Inertial Frame?

Special relativity is intended to apply only to inertial frames. Einstein’s theory of special relativity is his 1905 theory of bodies that move in space and time. It is called “special” because it postulates the Lorentz-invariance of all physical law statements that hold in a special reference frames, called inertial frames. If we do not speak too precisely, we can say an inertial reference frame is a frame of reference in which Newton’s laws of motion are satisfied. That means that if you place a rock somewhere and don’t put any unbalanced external force on it, then the rock stays there forever; and if you give that rock a speed of 3 miles per hour, then from then on it will travel at 3 miles per hour until some force acts on it such as its hitting another rock. Our reality isn’t so simple; inertial reference frames do not exist and Newton’s laws of motion are not true. However, for small volumes (rather than the whole universe) and short times (rather than eternity) there can be frames that are approximately inertial.

Suppose you’ve pre-selected your frame. How do you tell whether it is an inertial frame? The answer is that you check its laws of motion; you check that objects accelerate only when acted on by external forces. If no forces are present, then a moving object moves in a straight line. It doesn’t curve; it coasts. And it travels equal distances in equal amounts of time.

Any frame of reference moving at constant velocity relative to an inertial frame is also an inertial frame. A reference frame spinning relative to an inertial frame is never an inertial frame.

According to the theory, the speed of light in a vacuum is the same when observed from any inertial frame of reference. Unlike the speed of a spaceship, the speed of light in a vacuum isn’t affected by which inertial reference frame is used for the measurement. If you have two relatively stationary, synchronized clocks in an inertial frame, then they will read the same time, but if one moves relative to the other, then they will get out of synchrony. This loss of synchrony due to relative motion is called “time dilation.”

The presence of gravitation normally destroys any possibility of finding a perfect inertial frame. Nevertheless, any spacetime obeying the general theory of relativity and thus accounting for gravitation will be locally Minkowskian in the sense that any infinitesimal region of spacetime has an inertial frame obeying the principles of special relativity.

5. What Is Spacetime?

Spacetime is where events are located, or, depending on your theory of spacetime, it can be said to be all possible events. Metaphysicians might say it is the mereological sum of those events. The dimensions of real spacetime include the time dimension of happens-after and (at least) the three ordinary space dimensions of, say, up-down, left-right, and forward-backward. That is, spacetime is usually represented with a four-dimensional mathematical space, one of whose dimensions represents time and three of whose dimensions represent space.

Spacetime is the intended model of the general theory of relativity. This requires it to be a differentiable space in which physical objects obey the equations of motion of the theory. Minkowski space (that is, Minkowski spacetime) is the model of special relativity. General relativity theory requires that spacetime be locally a Minkowski spacetime.

Hermann Minkowski, in 1908, was the first person to say that spacetime is fundamental and that space and time are just aspects of spacetime. Minkowski meant it is fundamental in the sense that the spacetime interval between any two events is intrinsic to spacetime and does not vary with the reference frame, unlike a distance or a duration between the two events.

Spacetime is believed to be a continuum in which we can define points and straight lines. However, these points and lines do not satisfy the principles of Euclidean geometry when gravity is present. Einstein showed that the presence of gravity affects geometry by warping space and time. Einstein’s principal equation in his general theory of relativity implies that the curvature of spacetime is directly proportional to the density of mass in the spacetime. That is, Einstein says the structure of spacetime changes as matter moves because the gravitational field from matter actually curves spacetime. Black holes are a sign of radical curvature. The Earth’s curving of spacetime is very slight but still significant enough that it must be accounted for in clocks of the Global Positioning Satellites (GPS) along with the other time dilation effect that is caused by speed. The GPS satellites are launched with their clocks adjusted so that when they reach orbit they mark time the same as Earth-based clocks do.

There have been serious attempts over the last few decades to construct theories of physics in which spacetime is a product of more basic entities. The primary aim of these new theories is to unify relativity with quantum theory. So far these theories have not stood up to any empirical observations or experiments that could show them to be superior to the presently accepted theories. So, for the present, the concept of spacetime remains fundamental.

The metaphysical question of whether spacetime is a substantial object or a relationship among events, or neither, is considered in the discussion of the relational theory of time.

6. What Is a Minkowski Spacetime Diagram?

A spacetime diagram is a graphical representation of the point-events in spacetime. A Minkowski spacetime diagram is a representation of a spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity. In a Minkowski spacetime diagram, normally a rectangular coordinate system is used, the time axis is shown vertically, one or two of the spatial axes are suppressed (that is, not included). Here is an example with only one space dimension:
Minkows3

This Minkowski diagram shows a point-sized Einstein standing still midway between the two places at which there is a flash of light. The directed arrows represent the path of light rays from the flash. In a Minkowski diagram, a physical (point) object is not represented as occupying a point but as occupying a line containing all the spacetime points at which it exists. That line, which usually is not straight, is called the worldline of the object. In the above diagram, Einstein’s worldline is a vertical straight line because no total external force is acting on him. The history or path of an object’s inertial motion (its coasting) is a series of events that are represented by a straight line. If it is not straight, the object is not coasting (with zero external force acting on it).  If an object’s worldline intersects or meets another object’s worldline, then the two objects collide at the point of intersection. The units along the vertical time axis are customarily chosen to be the product of time and the speed of light so that worldlines of light rays make a forty-five degree angle with each axis. So, if a centimeter in the up or time direction is one second, then a centimeter to the right or space direction is one light-second, a very long distance.

The set of all possible photon histories or light speed worldlines going through an event defines the two light cones of that event: the past light cone and the future light cone. The future cone is called a “cone” because, if we were to add another space dimension to our diagram, so it has two space dimensions and one time dimension, light emitted from the flash spreads out in the two dimensions of space in a circle of growing diameter, producing a cone shape. The future light cone of the flash event is all the space-time events reached by the light emitted from the flash. Events inside the cone are events that in principle could have been affected by the event; they events are said to be causally-connectible to the event, and the relation between any other event and the event is said to be time-like.

Inertial motion produces a straight worldline, and accelerated motion produces a curved worldline. If at some time Einstein were to jump on a train moving by at constant speed, then his worldline would, from that time onward, tilt away from the vertical and form some angle less than 45 degrees with the time axis. In order to force a 45 degree angle to be the path of a light ray, the units on the time axis are not seconds but seconds times the speed of light. Any line tilted from than 45 degrees from the vertical is the worldline of an object moving faster than the speed of light in a vacuum. Events on the same horizontal line of the Minkowski diagram are simultaneous in that reference frame. Special relativity does not allow a worldline to be circular, or a closed curve, since the traveler would have to approach infinite speed at the top of the circle and at the bottom. A moving observer is added to the above diagram to produce the diagram below in section 12 in the discussion about the relativity of simultaneity.

Not all spacetimes can be given Minkowski diagrams, but any spacetime satisfying Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity can. Minkowski diagrams are diagrams of a Minkowski space, which is a spacetime satisfying the Special Theory of Relativity and having zero vacuum energy. Einstein’s Special Theory falsely presupposes that physical processes, such as gravitational processes, have no effect on the structure of spacetime. When attention needs to be given to the real effect of these processes on the structure of spacetime, that is, when general relativity needs to be used, then Minkowski diagrams become inappropriate for spacetime. General relativity assumes that the geometry of spacetime is locally Minkowskian but not globally. That is, spacetime is locally flat in the sense that in any very small region one always finds spacetime to be 4-D Minkowskian (but not 4-D Euclidean). Special relativity holds in infinitesimally small region of spacetime that satisfies general relativity, and so any such region can be fitted with an inertial reference frame. When we say spacetime is “really curved” and not flat, we mean it really deviates from 4-D Minkowskian geometry.

To repeat a point made earlier, when we speak of a point in these diagrams being a spacetime event, that is a non-standard use of the word “event.” A point event in a Minkowski diagram is merely a location in spacetime where an event might or might not happen. The point exists even if no object is actually there.

7. What Are the Metric and the Interval?

A space is simply a collection of points. A metrification of the space assigns locations to the points by assigning them numbers or sets of numbers. It will assign the origin of a coordinate system on a 3-D space the location <0,0,0>. How far is it between any two points? The metric is the answer to this question. A metric on a space, whether it’s a physical space or a mathematical space, provides a definition of distance (or length) by giving a function from each pair of points to a real number, called the distance between the points. In Euclidean space, the distance between two points is the length of the straight line connecting them. The metric of a space determines its geometry, and this metric and geometry are intrinsic in the sense that they do not change as we change the reference frame. Philosophers are interested in the issue of whether the choice of a metric for a space is natural (or objective) or whether it is always a matter of convention (or subjective).

How about the metric for time? The introduction of the metric for time allows the scientist to define the time interval between any two events, from which it follows that all pairs of events can be classified by the relation “earlier than” or “later than” or “simultaneous.” In this way it defines the future and the past of any given event. The customary metric for any two points in a one-dimensional Euclidean space, such as time, is the absolute value of the numerical difference between the coordinates of the two points (that, the length of the line segment connecting them). For example, the duration between an event with the coordinate 5:00 and an event with the coordinate 7:00 is exactly two hours (assuming the events occur on the same day and we do not have an a.m. vs. p.m. ambiguity or ambiguity due to change of time zone). If we select a standard clock and the standard way of calculating durations between clock readings, then that clock implicitly defines the metric of time because, by definition, it yields the correct answer for the duration between any two point events. Here we assume the period between any two successive clock ticks is congruent (the same) while the clock is stationary in the coordinate system where the clock readings are taken. When we define the unit of time (the second) to be so many successive ticks of the standard clock, what we are doing is implicitly specifying the metric, provided we implicitly agree that the clock readings are correct and agree to adopt the customary procedure for how to read the duration between two point events. For example, to speak simplistically, if you want to know how much time has passed between the birth of Mohammed and the death of Abraham Lincoln, then you find the dates of the two events and subtract the first from the second; this procedure is equivalent to noting the tick on the standard clock that is simultaneous with the birth of Mohammed and then counting how many ticks occurred until the tick that is simultaneous with the death of Abraham Lincoln. It is customary to subtract the dates, but would it be incorrect instead to subtract the square roots of the dates, or to subtract the dates and then take the square root of the result? Philosophers disagree about whether it would be incorrect or merely inconvenient.

Points of space are located by being assigned a coordinate. For doing quantitative science rather than merely qualitative science we want the coordinate to be a number and not, say, a letter of the alphabet. A coordinate for a point in two-dimensional space requires two numbers; a coordinate for a point in n-dimensional space requires n numbers, where n is a positive integer. You might consider why you’d prefer a real number rather than a rational number even though no measuring tool could detect the difference between the two choices.

In a 2-dimensional (or 2-D) space, the metric for the distance between the point (x,y) with Cartesian coordinates x and y and the point (x’,y’) with coordinates x’ and y’ is defined to be the square root of (x’ – x)2 + (y’ – y)2 when the space is flat, that is, Euclidean. If the space is not flat, then a more sophisticated definition of the metric is required. Note the application of the Pythagorean Theorem.

We have intuitions about locations and distances that we expect will hold. For example, we believe that in a one-dimensional space representing time, if event p happens before event q, and q happens before r, then the locations numbers for those events, namely, l(p), l(q) and l(r), must satisfy this inequality: l(p) < l(q) < l(r). If not, then we shouldn’t be labeling points that way.

Our intuitive idea of what a distance is tells us that, no matter how strange the space is, we want its metric d to have the following distance-like properties. Let d(p,q) stand for the distance between any two points p and q in the space. d is a function with two arguments. For any points p, q and r, the following five conditions must be satisfied:

  1. d(p,p) = 0
  2. d(p,q) is greater than or equal to 0
  3. If d(p,q) = 0, then p = q
  4. d(p,q) = d(q,p)
  5. d(p,q) + d(q,r) is greater than or equal to d(p,r)

Notice that there is no mention of the path the distance is taken across; all the attention is on the point pairs themselves. Does your idea of distance imply that those conditions on d should be true? If you were to check, then you’d find that the usual 2-D metric defined above, namely the square root of (x’ – x)2 + (y’ – y)2, does satisfy these four conditions. In 3-D Euclidean space, the metric that is defined to be the square root of (x’ – x)2 + (y’ – y)2 + (z’ – z)2 works very well. So does the 1-D metric for the duration that we get for two instantaneous events by subtracting their clock readings; the duration between two instants p and q is the absolute value of the difference in their dates (that is, their clock readings or locations in time). In real physical space, the Euclidean metric works very well—at least for small regions (such as apartments and farms but not solar systems) that aren’t too small (such as infinitesimally close to a proton). We might want a scale factor, say a, on the metric so that d2 = a[(x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2]. If space were to expand uniformly, then a is not a constant but a function of time a(t). a(t) was zero at the Big Bang.

To have a metric for a spacetime, we desire a definition of the distance between any two infinitesimally neighboring points in that spacetime. Less generally, consider an appropriate metric for the 4-D mathematical space that is used to represent the spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity theory, namely Minkowski spacetime. What’s an appropriate metric for this space? Well, if we were just interested in the space portion of this spacetime, then the above 3-D Euclidean metric is fine. But we’ve asked a delicate question because the fourth dimension of Minkowski’s mathematical space is really a time dimension and not a space dimension. Using Cartesian coordinates, the spacetime has the following Lorentzian metric (or Minkowski metric) for any pair of point events at (x’,y’,z’,t’) and (x,y,z,t):

Δs2 = – (x’ – x)2 – (y’ – y)2 – (z’ – z)2 + c2(t’ – t)2

Δs is called the interval of Minkowski spacetime. Notice the plus and minus signs on the four terms. The interval corresponds to the difference in clock measurements between a pair of instantaneous events that happen at the same point place in the reference frame but are separated enough in time so that one event could have had a causal effect on the other. For a pair of events that occur at the same time in the frame but are separated in space, then the interval is what a meter stick would measure between the events. That is, Δs is then our spatial metric d. Most pairs of events, though, do not occur at the same place in the frame nor at the same time. One happy feature of this Lorentzian metric is that the value of the interval is unaffected by changing to a new reference frame or coordinate system provided the new one is not accelerating relative to the first. That is, changing to a new, unaccelerated reference frame on the spacetime will change the values of all the coordinates of the points of the spacetime, but some relations between all pairs of points won’t be affected, namely the intervals between pairs of points. Thus there is something “absolute” about the metric; it is independent of unaccelerated reference frames. Take any two observers who use different reference frames that are not accelerating relative to each other. Now consider some single event with a finite duration. The two observers won’t agree on how long that event lasts, nor where it occurs, but they will always agree on the interval between the beginning and end of the event. That’s why the interval is said to be absolute.

The interval of spacetime between two point events is complicated because its square can be negative. If Δs2 is negative, the two points have a space-like separation, meaning these events have a greater separation in space than they do in time. If Δs2 is positive, then the two have a time-like separation, meaning enough time has passed that one event could have had a causal effect on the other. If Δs2 is zero, the two events might be identical, or they might have occurred millions of miles apart. In ordinary space, if the space interval between two events is zero, then the two events happened at the same time and place, but in spacetime, if the spacetime interval between two events is zero, this means only that there could be a light ray connecting them. It is because the spacetime interval between two events can be zero even when the events are far apart in distance that the term “interval” is very unlike what we normally mean by the term “distance.” All the events that have a zero spacetime interval from some event e constitute e’s two light cones. This set of events is given that name because it has the shape of cones when represented in a Minkowski diagram for 2-D space, one cone for events in e’s future and one cone for events in e’s past. If event 2 is outside the light cones of event 1, then event 2 is said to occur in the “absolute elsewhere” of event 1.

Another equally legitimate choice of a definition for a metric in Minkowskian 4-D spacetime is:

Δs2 =  (x’ – x)2 + (y’ – y)2 + (z’ – z)2 – c2(t’ – t)2

and now when Δs2 is positive we have a spacelike displacement instead of, as in the previous metric, a timelike displacement. Because true metrics are always positive, neither metric is a true metric, nor even a pseudometric; but it is customary for physicists to refer to it loosely as a “metric” because Δs retains enough other features of distance.

What if we turn now from special relativity to general relativity? Adding space and time dependence (particularly the values of mass-energy and momentum at points) to each term of the Lorentzian metric, the metric for special relativity, produces the metric for general relativity. That metric requires more complex tensor equations.

8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time Is Partly Space?

In 1908, Minkowski remarked that “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” Many people took this to mean that time is partly space, and vice versa. C. D. Broad countered that the discovery of spacetime did not break down the distinction between time and space but only their independence or isolation. He argued that their lack of independence does not imply a lack of reality.

Nevertheless, there is a deep sense in which time and space are “mixed up” or linked. This is evident from the Lorentz transformations of special relativity that connect the time t in one inertial frame with the time t’ in another frame that is moving in the x direction at a constant speed v. In this Lorentz equation, t’ is dependent upon the space coordinate x and the speed. In this way, time is not independent of either space or speed. It follows that the time between two events could be zero in one frame but not zero in another. Each frame has its own way of splitting up spacetime into its space part and its time part.

The reason why time is not partly space is that, within a single frame, time is always distinct from space. Time is a distinguished dimension of spacetime, not an arbitrary dimension. What being distinguished amounts to is that when you set up a rectangular coordinate system on spacetime with an origin at, say, the event of Mohammed’s birth, you may point the x-axis east or north or up, but you may not point it forward in time—you may do that only with the t-axis, the time axis.

9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?

Yes and no; it depends on what you are talking about. Time is the fourth dimension of 4-d spacetime, but time is not the fourth dimension of space, the space of places.

Mathematicians have a broader notion of the term “space” than the average person; and in their sense a space need not consist of places, that is, geographical locations. Not paying attention to the two meanings of the term “space” is the source of all the confusion about whether time is the fourth dimension. The mathematical space used by mathematical physicists to represent physical spacetime is four dimensional and in that space, the space of places is a 3-d sub-space and time is another 1-d sub-space. Minkowski was the first person to construct such a mathematical space, although in 1895 H. G. Wells treated time as a fourth dimension in his novel The time Machine. Spacetime is represented mathematically by Minkowski as a space of events, not as a space of ordinary geographical places.

In any coordinate system on spacetime, it takes at least four independent numbers to determine a spacetime location. In any coordinate system on the space of places, it takes at least three. That’s why spacetime is four dimensional but the space of places is three dimensional. Actually this 19th century definition of dimensionality, which is due to Bernhard Riemann, is not quite adequate because mathematicians have subsequently discovered how to assign each point on the plane to a point on the line without any two points on the plane being assigned to the same point on the line. The idea comes from Georg Cantor. Because of this one-to-one correspondence, the points on a plane could be specified with just one number. If so, then the line and plane must have the same dimensions according to the Riemann definition. To avoid this problem and to keep the plane being a 2-d object, the notion of dimensionality of a space has been given a new, but rather complex, definition.

10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?

Every reference frame has its own physical time, but the question is intended in another sense. At present, physicists measure time electromagnetically. They define a standard atomic clock using periodic electromagnetic processes in atoms, then use electromagnetic signals (light) to synchronize clocks that are far from the standard clock. In doing this, are physicists measuring ‘”electromagnetic time” but not other kinds of physical time?

In the 1930s, the physicists Arthur Milne and Paul Dirac worried about this question. Independently, they suggested there may be very many time scales. For example, there could be the time of atomic processes and perhaps also a time of gravitation and large-scale physical processes. Clocks for the two processes might drift out of synchrony after being initially synchronized, yet there would be no reasonable explanation for why they don’t stay in synchrony. Ditto for clocks based on the pendulum, on superconducting resonators, on the spread of electromagnetic radiation through space, and on other physical principles. Just imagine the difficulty for physicists if they had to work with electromagnetic time, gravitational time, nuclear time, neutrino time, and so forth. Current physics, however, has found no reason to assume there is more than one kind of time for physical processes.

In 1967, physicists did reject the astronomical standard for the atomic standard because the deviation between known atomic and gravitation periodic processes could be explained better assuming that the atomic processes were the more regular of the two. But this is not a cause for worry about two times drifting apart. Physicists still have no reason to believe a gravitational periodic process that is just as regular initially as the atomic process and that is not affected by friction or impacts or other forces would ever drift out of synchrony with the atomic process, yet this is the possibility that worried Milne and Dirac.

11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?

Physical time is not relative to any observer’s state of mind. Wishing time will pass does not affect the rate at which the observed clock ticks. On the other hand, physical time is relative to the observer’s reference system–in trivial ways and in a deep way discovered by Albert Einstein.

In a trivial way, time is relative to the chosen coordinate system on the reference frame, though not to the reference frame itself. For example, it depends on the units chosen as when the duration of some event is 34 seconds if seconds are defined to be a certain number of ticks of the standard clock, but is 24 seconds if seconds are defined to be a different number of ticks of that standard clock. Similarly, the difference between the Christian calendar and the Jewish calendar for the date of some event is due to a different unit and origin. Also trivially, time depends on the coordinate system when a change is made from Eastern Standard Time to Pacific Standard Time. These dependencies are taken into account by scientists but usually never mentioned. For example, if a pendulum’s approximately one-second swing is measured in a physics laboratory during the autumn night when the society changes from Daylight Savings Time back to Standard Time, the scientists do not note that one unusual swing of the pendulum that evening took a negative fifty-nine minutes and fifty-nine seconds instead of the usual one second.

Isn’t time relative to the observer’s coordinate system in the sense that in some reference frames there could be fifty-nine seconds in a minute? No, due to scientific convention, it is absolutely certain that there are sixty seconds in any minute in any reference frame. How long an event lasts is relative to the reference frame used to measure the time elapsed, but in any reference frame there are exactly sixty seconds in a minute because this is true by definition. Similarly, you do not need to worry that in some reference frame there might be two gallons in a quart.

In a deeper sense, time is relative, not just to the coordinate system, but to the reference frame itself. That is Einstein’s principal original idea about time. Einstein’s special theory of relativity requires physical laws not change if we change from one inertial reference frame to another. In technical-speak Einstein is requiring that the statements of physical laws must be Lorentz-invariant. The equations of light and electricity and magnetism (Maxwell electrodynamics) are Lorentz-invariant, but those of Newton’s mechanics are not, and Einstein eventually figured out that what needs changing in the laws of mechanics is that temporal durations and spatial intervals between two events must be allowed to be relative to which reference frame is being used. There is no frame-independent duration for an event extended in time.  To be redundant, Einstein’s idea is that without reference to the frame, there is no fixed time interval between two events, no ‘actual’ duration between them. This idea was philosophically shocking as well as scientifically revolutionary.

Einstein illustrated his idea using two observers, one on a moving train in the middle of the train, and a second observer standing on the embankment next to the train tracks. If the observer sitting in the middle of the rapidly moving train receives signals simultaneously from lightning flashes at the front and back of the train, then in his reference frame the two lightning strikes were simultaneous. But the strikes were not simultaneous in a frame fixed to an observer on the ground. This outside observer will say that the flash from the back had farther to travel because the observer on the train was moving away from the flash. If one flash had farther to travel, then it must have left before the other one, assuming that both flashes moved at the same speed. Therefore, the lightning struck the back of the train before the lightning struck the front of the train in the reference frame fixed to the tracks.

Let’s assume that a number of observers are moving with various constant speeds in various directions. Consider the inertial frame of reference in which each observer is at rest in his or her own frame. Which of these observers will agree on their time measurements? Only observers with zero relative speed will agree. Observers with different relative speeds will not, even if they agree on how to define the second and agree on some event occurring at time zero (the origin of the time axis). If two observers are moving relative to each other, but each makes judgments from a reference frame fixed to themselves, then the assigned times to the event will disagree more, the faster their relative speed. All observers will be observing the same objective reality, the same event in the same spacetime, but their different frames of reference will require disagreement about how spacetime divides up into its space part and its time part.

This relativity of time to reference frame implies that there be no such thing as The Past in the sense of a past independent of reference frame. This is because a past event in one reference frame might not be past in another reference frame. However, this frame relativity usually isn’t very important except when high speeds or high gravitational fields are involved.

In some reference frame, was Adolf Hitler born before George Washington? No, because the two events are causally connectible. That is, one event could in principle have affected the other since light would have had time to travel from one to the other. We can select a reference frame to reverse the usual Earth-based order of two events only if they are not causally connectible, that is, only if one event is in the absolute elsewhere of the other. Despite the relativity of time to a reference frame, any two observers in any two reference frames should agree about which of two causally connectible events happened first.

12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?

Because the universe obeys relativistic physics, events that occur simultaneously with respect to one reference frame will not occur simultaneously in another reference frame that is moving with respect to the first frame. This is called the relativity of simultaneity.

In order to explain this point that the spatial ‘plane’ or ‘time slice’ of simultaneous events is different in different reference frames, notice that we calculate the time when something occurred far away by computing the difference between the time when a light signal arrives to us from the event minus the time it took for the light to travel all that way.  We see a flash of light at time t arriving from a distant place P. When did the flash occur back at P? Let’s call the time of that earlier P-event tp. Here is how to compute tp. Suppose we know the distance from us to P is x. Then the flash occurred at t minus the travel time for the light. That travel time is x/c. So,

tp = t - x/c.

For example, if we see an explosion on the sun at t, then we know to say it really occurred eight minutes before, because x/c is approximately eight minutes, if x is the distance from Earth to the sun.

Calculations like this work fine for events in one reference frame, but they don’t always work when we change reference frames. The diagram below illustrates the problem. There are two light flashes that occur simultaneously, with Einstein at rest midway between them.

Minkows2

The Minkowski diagram represents Einstein sitting still in the reference frame (marked by the coordinate system with the thick black axes) while Lorentz is not sitting still but is traveling rapidly away from him and toward the source of flash 2. Because Lorentz’s timeline is a straight line we can tell that he is moving at a constant speed. The two flashes of light arrive at Einstein’s location simultaneously, creating spacetime event B. However, Lorentz sees flash 2 before flash 1. That is, the event A of Lorentz seeing flash 2 occurs before event C of Lorentz seeing flash 1. So, Einstein will readily say the flashes are simultaneous, but Lorentz will have to do some computing to figure out that the flashes are simultaneous in the frame because they won’t “look” simultaneous. However, if we’d chosen a different reference frame from the one above, one in which Lorentz is not moving but Einstein is, then Lorentz would be correct to say flash 2 occurs before flash 1 in that new frame. So, whether the flashes are or are not simultaneous depends on which reference frame is used in making the judgment. It’s all relative.

 

13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?

This relativity of simultaneity is philosophically less controversial than the conventionality of simultaneity. To appreciate the difference, consider what is involved in making a determination regarding simultaneity. Given two events that happen essentially at the same place, physicists assume they can tell by direct observation whether the events happened simultaneously. If we don’t see one of them happening first, then we say they happened simultaneously, and we assign them the same time coordinate. The determination of simultaneity is more difficult if the two happen at separate places, especially if they are very far apart. One way to measure (operationally define) simultaneity at a distance is to say that two events are simultaneous in a reference frame if unobstructed light signals from the two events would reach us simultaneously when we are midway between the two places where they occur, as judged in that frame. This is the operational definition of simultaneity used by Einstein in his theory of relativity. Instead of using the midway method, we could take the distant clock and send a signal home to our master clock, one already synchronized with our standard clock; the master clock immediately sends a signal back to the distant clock with the information about what time it was when the signal arrived. We at the distant clock notice that the total travel time is t and that the master clock’s signal says its time is, say, noon, so we immediately set our clock to be noon plus half of t.

The “midway” method described above of operationally defining simultaneity in one reference frame for two distant signals causally connected to us has a significant presumption: that the light beams travel at the same speed regardless of direction. Einstein, Reichenbach and Grünbaum have called this a reasonable “convention” because any attempt to experimentally confirm it presupposes that we already know how to determine simultaneity at a distance. This is the conventionality, rather than relativity, of simultaneity. To pursue the point, suppose the two original events are in each other’s absolute elsewhere; they couldn’t have affected each other. Einstein noticed that there is no physical basis for judging the simultaneity or lack of simultaneity between these two events, and for that reason said we rely on a convention when we define distant simultaneity as we do. Hillary Putnam, Michael Friedman, and Graham Nerlich object to calling it a convention–on the grounds that to make any other assumption about light’s speed would unnecessarily complicate our description of nature, and we often make choices about how nature is on the basis of simplification of our description. They would say there is less conventionality in the choice than Einstein supposed.

The “midway” method isn’t the only way to define simultaneity. Consider a second method, the “mirror reflection” method. Select an Earth-based frame of reference, and send a flash of light from Earth to Mars where it hits a mirror and is reflected back to its source. The flash occurred at 12:00, let’s say, and its reflection arrived back on Earth 20 minutes later. The light traveled the same empty, undisturbed path coming and going. At what time did the light flash hit the mirror? The answer involves the so-called conventionality of simultaneity. All physicists agree one should say the reflection event occurred at 12:10. The controversial philosophical question is whether this is really a convention. Einstein pointed out that there would be no inconsistency in our saying that it hit the mirror at 12:17, provided we live with the awkward consequence that light was relatively slow getting to the mirror, but then traveled back to Earth at a faster speed. If we picked the impact time to be 12:05, we’d have to live with the fact that light traveled slower coming back.

Let’s explore the reflection method that is used to synchronize a distant, stationary clock so that it reads the same time as our clock. Let’s draw a Minkowski diagram of the situation and consider just one spatial dimension in which we are at location A with the standard clock for the reference frame. The distant clock we want to synchronize is at location B. See the following diagram.

conventionality of simultaneity graph

The fact that the timeline of the B-clock is parallel to the time axis shows that the clock there is stationary. We will send light signals in order to synchronize the two clocks. Send a light signal from A at time t1 to B, where it is reflected back to us, arriving at time t3. Then the reading tr on the distant clock at the time of the reflection event should be t2, where

t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1).

If tr = t2, then the two clocks are synchronized.

Einstein noticed that the use of “(1/2)” in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) rather than the use of some other fraction implicitly assumes that the light speed to and from B is the same. He said this assumption is a convention, the so-called conventionality of simultaneity, and isn’t something we could check to see whether it is correct. If t2 were (1/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B faster than c and return more slowly. If t2 were (2/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B relatively slowly and return faster than c. Either way, the average travel speed to and from would be c. Only with the fraction (1/2) are the travel speeds the same going and coming back.

Notice how we would check whether the two light speeds really are the same. We would send a light signal from A to B, and see if the travel time was the same as when we sent it from B to A. But to trust these times we would already need to have synchronized the clocks at A and B. But that synchronization process will use the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1), with the (1/2) again, so we are arguing in a circle here.

Not all philosophers of science agree with Einstein that the choice of (1/2) is a convention nor with those philosophers who say the messiness of any other choice shows that the choice must be correct. Everyone agrees, though, that any other choice than (1/2) would make for messy physics, but they suggest that there’s a way to check on the light speeds without presuming the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) or presuming that the speeds are the same. Synchronize two clocks at A. Then transport one of the clocks to B at an infinitesimal speed. Going this slow, the clock will arrive at B without having its proper time deviate from that of the A-clock. That is, the two clocks will be synchronized even though they are distant from each other. Now the two clocks can be used to find the time when a light signal left A and the time when it arrived at B. The time difference can be used to compute the light speed. This speed can be compared with the speed computed for a signal that left B and then arrived at A. The experiment has never been performed, but the recommenders are sure that the speeds to and from will turn out to be identical, so they are sure that the (1/2) in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) is correct and not a convention. For more discussion of this controversial issue of conventionality in relativity, see pp. 179-184 of The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, edited by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, Inc., 2002.

 

14. What Is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?

Minkows1

The events in your absolute past are those that could have directly or indirectly affected you, the observer, now. These absolutely past events are the events in or on the backward light cone of your present event, your here-and-now. The backward light cone of event Q is the imaginary cone-shaped surface of spacetime points formed by the paths of all light rays reaching Q from the past. An event’s being in another event’s absolute past is a feature of spacetime itself because the event is in the point’s past in all possible reference frames. The feature is frame-independent. For any event in your absolute past, every observer in the universe (who isn’t making an error) will agree the event happened in your past. Not so for events that are in your past but not in your absolute past. Past events not in your absolute past will be in what Eddington called your “absolute elsewhere” and these past events will be in your present as judged by some other reference frames. The absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime containing events that are not causally connectible to your here-and-now. Your absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime that is neither in nor on either your forward or backward light cones. No event here now, can affect any event in your absolute elsewhere; and no event in your absolute elsewhere can affect you here and now. A spacetime point’s absolute future is all the future events outside the point’s absolute elsewhere.

A single point’s absolute elsewhere, absolute future, and absolute past partition all of spacetime beyond the point into three disjoint regions. If point A is in point B’s absolute elsewhere, the two events are said to be “spacelike related.” If the two are in each other’s forward or backward light cones they are said to be “timelike related” or “causally connectible.”

The past light cone looks like a triangle when the diagram has just one dimension for space. However, the past light cone is not a triangle but has a pear-shape because all very ancient light lines must have originated from the infinitesimal volume at the big bang.

15. What is Time Dilation?

According to special relativity, two properly functioning clocks next to each other will stay synchronized. Even if they were to be far away from each other, they’d stay synchronized if they didn’t move relative to each other. But if one clock moves away from the other, the moving clock will tick slower than the stationary clock, as measured in the inertial reference frame of the stationary clock. This slowing due to motion is called “time dilation.” If you move at 99% of the speed of light, then your time slows by a factor of 7 relative to stationary clocks. In addition, you are 7 times thinner than when you are stationary, and you are 7 times heavier. If you move at 99.9%, then you slow by a factor of 22.

Time dilation is about two synchronized clocks getting out of synchrony due either to their relative motion or due to their being in different gravitational fields. Time dilation due to difference in constant speeds is described by Einstein’s special theory of relativity. The general theory of relativity describes a second kind of time dilation, one due to different accelerations and different gravitational influences. Suppose your twin’s spaceship travels to and from a star one light year away. It takes light from your Earth-based flashlight two years to go there and back. But if the spaceship is fast, your twin can make the trip in less than two years, according to his own clock. Does he travel the distance in less time than it takes light to travel that distance? No, according to your clock he takes more than two years, and so is slower than light.

We sometimes speak of time dilation by saying time itself is “slower,” but time isn’t going slower in any absolute sense, only relative to some other frame of reference. Does time have a rate? Well, time in a reference frame has no rate in that frame, but time in a reference frame can have a rate as measured in a different frame, such as in a frame moving relative to the first frame.

Time dilation is not an illusion of perception; and it is not a matter of the second having different definitions in different reference frames.

Newton’s physics describes duration as an absolute property, implying it is not relative to the reference frame. However, in Newton’s physics the speed of light is relative to the frame. Einstein’s special theory of relativity reverses both of these aspects of time. For inertial frames, it implies the speed of light is not relative to the frame, but duration is relative to the frame. In general relativity, however, the speed of light can vary within one reference frame if matter and energy are present.

Time dilation due to motion is relative in the sense that if your spaceship moves past mine so fast that I measure your clock to be running at half speed, then you will measure my clock to be running at half speed also, provided both of us are in inertial frames. If one of us is affected by a gravitational field or undergoes acceleration, then that person isn’t in an inertial frame and the results are different.

Both types of time dilation play a significant role in time-sensitive satellite navigation systems such as the Global Positioning System. The atomic clocks on the satellites must be programmed to compensate for the relativistic dilation effects of both gravity and motion.

For more on general relativistic dilation, see the discussion of gravity and black holes.

16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?

Einstein’s general theory of relativity (1915) is a generalization of his special theory of special relativity (1905). It is not restricted to inertial frames, and it encompasses a broader range of phenomena, namely gravity and accelerated motions. According to general relativity, gravitational differences affect time by dilating it. Observers in a less intense gravitational potential find that clocks in a more intense gravitational potential run slow relative to their own clocks. People live longer in basements than in attics, all other things being equal. Basement flashlights will be shifted toward the red end of the visible spectrum compared to the flashlights in attics. This effect is known as the gravitational red shift. Even the speed of light is slower in the presence of higher gravity.

Informally one speaks of gravity bending light rays around massive objects, but more accurately it is the space that bends, and as a consequence the light is bent, too. The light simply follows the shortest path through spacetime, and when space curves the shortest paths are no longer Euclidean straight lines.

17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?

It takes an actually infinite amount of time for a person to fall into a black hole according to external clocks such as your clock that is safely back on Earth. A black hole is a body of matter with a very high gravitational field that constitutes a severe warp in the spacetime continuum, so much so that light from the inside the hole’s “horizon” cannot shine out beyond the horizon even if no object is blocking its path of escape. The horizon is a surface around the hole, and any object falling across the horizon cannot get back out no matter how much fuel is used. Judged from our perspective out beyond the horizon, time slows down for an unlucky person falling toward the horizon of a black hole, and it goes infinitely slowly as the person crosses the horizon. As judged by us back on Earth, when the person falls toward the horizon, their velocity slows to zero, and temperatures becomes infinite, and the frequency of light from them approaches zero frequency. But from the perspective of a person falling through the horizon, time is normal, temperature is normal, velocity is normal though increasing, light signals from them that are sent to Earth are normal, and there is no noticeable boundary or feature at the horizon. This difference in perspectives relative to one’s reference frame is called “black hole complementarity.” But from the perspective of the person falling into the hole, although there’s no unusual feature at the boundary, as one gets near the center of the black hole, the temperature approaches infinity and the curvature of spacetime approaches infinity. This center is a nasty place called a “singularity.”

Just as in other galaxies, there is a massive black hole at the center of the Milky Way. It is in the direction of the constellation Sagittarius. Astrophysicists believe black holes are commonly formed by the inward collapse of stars that have burned out and are at least two and a half times larger than our Sun. The center of a black hole (the singularity) is infinitely dense according to relativity theory, but not that dense according to theories of quantum gravity. If you were to fall into a black hole with a billion times the mass of our Sun, then you’d have a half hour on your clock before you reached the center. If you were to fall into a black hole that weighed the same as the Sun, then you’d have ten microseconds before you reached the center.

The first black hole solution to Einstein’s equations of general relativity was discovered by Schwarzschild in 1916. This black hole’s horizon is perfectly spherical. Because even light itself could not escape from inside a black hole, John Wheeler chose the name “black hole.” The radius of the black hole is directly proportional to its mass; if the mass doubles, so does the radius of the horizon.  The fact that real black holes are made from star dust rather than tomatoes or gold is irrelevant to their behavior outside their event horizon. All that counts is their total mass, how fast they spin, and whether they have any electric charge. Most black holes have no electric charge, but do spin very rapidly.

In relativity theory, the proper time between two events along a worldline is the time that would be shown on a clock whose path in spacetime is that worldline between the events. The proper time of any event on a particle’s worldline depends on the history of the particle and is not the same as the coordinate time of the same event. Coordinate time is time along the worldline of an ideal clock at the origin of the coordinate system. The coordinate time between the two point events is the time separation of the events given by an observer at rest in the frame. Proper time is independent of coordinate time, although the usual convention is to measure both times in the same units, namely seconds. As judged by a clock on Earth in an Earth-based frame of reference, an astronaut flying into a distant black hole will take an infinite coordinate time to reach the event horizon of the black hole. That is, if we could see the astronaut’s clock, the clock would appear to us to slow to a halt. But it will take only a small amount of the astronaut’s proper time to pass through the event horizon and crash into the center of the black hole. If you, the person falling toward the event horizon, were to successfully escape being pulled through the horizon, and if you were to return home to Earth, you’d discover that you were younger than your Earth-bound twin and that your initially synchronized clocks showed that yours had fallen behind. It is in this sense that you would have experienced a time warp, a warp in the time component of spacetime.

18. What Is the Solution to the Twin Paradox?

This paradox is also called the clock paradox and the twins paradox. It is an argument about time dilation that uses the special theory of relativity to produce a contradiction.  Consider two twins at rest on Earth with their clocks synchronized. One twin climbs into a spaceship and flies far away at a high, constant speed, then reverses course and flies back at the same speed. When they reunite, will the twins still be the same age? An application of the equations of special relativity theory implies that the twin on the spaceship will return and be younger than the Earth-based twin. Here is the argument for the twin paradox. It’s all relative, isn’t it? That is, either twin could regard the other as the traveler. Let’s consider the spaceship to be stationary. Wouldn’t relativity theory then imply that the Earth-based twin could race off (while attached to the Earth) and return to be the younger of the two twins? If so, we have a contradiction because, when the twins reunite, each will be younger than the other.

Herbert Dingle famously argued in the 1960s that the paradox reveals an inconsistency in special relativity. Almost all philosophers and scientists now agree that it is not a true paradox, in the sense of revealing a logical inconsistency within relativity theory, but is merely a complex puzzle that can be adequately solved within relativity theory, although there is dispute about whether the solution can occur in special relativity or only in general relativity. Those who say the resolution of the twin paradox requires only special relativity are a small minority. Einstein said the solution to the paradox requires general relativity. Max Born said, “the clock paradox is due to a false application of the special theory of relativity, namely, to a case in which the methods of the general theory should be applied.” In 1921, Wolfgang Pauli said, “Of course, a complete explanation of the problem can only be given within the framework of the general theory of relativity.”

There have been a variety of suggestions in the relativity textbooks on how to solve the paradox. Here is one, diagrammed below.

twin paradox

This suggestion for solving the paradox is to apply general relativity and then note that there must be a difference in the proper time taken by the twins because their behavior is different, as shown in their two world lines. The length of the line representing their path in spacetime in the above diagram is not a measure of their proper time. Instead, the spacing of the dots represents a tick of a clock and thus represents the proper time. The diagram shows how sitting still on Earth is a way of maximizing the proper during the trip, and it shows how flying near light speed in a spaceship away from Earth and then back again is a way of minimizing the proper time, even though if you paid attention only to the shape of the world lines and not to the dot spacing within them you might think just the reverse. Surprisingly, a straight world line between two events in a diagram like this has the longest proper time between two events, not the shortest. So, the reasoning in the paradox makes the mistake of supposing that the situation of the two twins is the same as far as elapsed proper time is concerned.

A second way to solve the twin paradox is to note that each twin can consider the other twin to be the one who moves, but their experiences will still be different because their situations are not symmetric. Regardless of which twin is considered to be stationary, only one twin feels the acceleration at the turnaround point, so it should not be surprising that the two situations have different implications about time. And when the gravitational fields are taken into considerations, the equations of general relativity do imply that the younger twin is the one who feels the acceleration. However, the force felt by the spaceship twin is not what “forces” that twin to be younger. Nothing is forcing the twin to be younger anymore than something is forcing the speed of light to remain constant.

A third suggestion for how to solve the paradox is to say that only the Earthbound twin can move at a constant velocity in a single inertial frame. If the spaceship twin is to be considered in an inertial frame and moving at a constant velocity, as required by special relativity, then there must be a different frame for the Earthbound twin’s return trip than the frame for the outgoing trip. But changing frames in the middle of the presentation is an improper equivocation and shows that the argument of the paradox breaks down. In short, both twins’ motions cannot always be inertial.

These three solutions, which are really variants of the same solution, tend to leave many people unsatisfied, probably because they think of the following situation. If we remove the stars and planets and other material from the universe and simply have two twins, isn’t it clear that it would be inappropriate to say “there is an observable difference” due to one twin feeling an acceleration while the other does not? Won’t both twins feel the same forces, and wouldn’t relativity theory be incorrect if it implied that one twin returned to be younger than the other? (The correct answer to these questions is “yes.”) Therefore, why does attaching the Earth to one of the twins force that twin to be the older one upon reunion? The answer to this last question requires appealing to general relativity. Notice that it is not just the Earth that is attached to the one twin. It is the Earth in tandem with all the planets and stars. When the spaceship-twin is considered to be at rest, then the planets and stars also rush away and back. Because of all this movement of mass, the turnaround isn’t felt by the Earthbound twin who moves in tandem with those stars, but is felt very clearly by the spaceship twin. So, regardless of which twin is considered to be at rest, it is only the spaceship twin who feels any acceleration. Explaining this failure of the Earthbound twin to feel the force at the turnaround when the spaceship twin is at rest shows that a solution to the paradox ultimately requires a theory of the origin of inertia. But the point remains that the asymmetry in the experience of the two twins accounts for the aging difference and for the error in the argument of the twin paradox.

If you are the twin in the spaceship, then by flying fast and returning to Earth you do gradually advance into your twin’s future, but your twin does not go to your past.

19. What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?

See the article “Zeno’s Paradoxes” in this encyclopedia.

20. How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?

To justify the assignment of time numbers (called dates or clock readings) to instants, we cannot literally paste a number to an instant. What we do instead is show that the structure of the set of instantaneous events is the same as the structure of our time numbers. The structure of our time numbers is the structure of real numbers along the mathematical line. Showing that this is so is called “solving the representation problem” for our theory of time measurement. We won’t go into detail on how to solve this problem, but the main idea is that to measure any space, including a one-dimensional space of time, we need a metrification for the space. The metrification assigns location coordinates to all points and assigns distances between all pairs of points. The method of assigning these distances is called the “metric” for the space.  A metrification for time assigns dates and durations to the points we call instants of time. Normally we use a clock to do this. Point instants get assigned a unique real number date (a clock reading or date), and the metric for the duration between any two of those point instants is normally found by subtracting their clock readings from each other. The duration is the absolute value of the numerical difference of their dates, that is |t(B) – t(A)| where t(B) is the date of B and t(A) is the date of A. One goal in the assignment of dates is to ensure that, if event A happens before event B, then t(A) < t(B). (Unfortunately, we cannot trust the subtraction of one clock reading from another if one of the clocks is far away from our standard clock and if we are not sure how to reliably synchronize the distant clock with our standard clock; but we will explore this problem in a later section.)

Lets’ consider the question of metrification in more detail, starting with the assignment of locations to points. Any space is a collection of points. In a space that is supposed to be time, these points are the instants and the space for time is presumably linear (since presumably time is one-dimensional). Before discussing time coordinates specifically, let’s consider what is meant by assigning coordinates to a mathematical space, one that might represent either physical space, or physical time, or spacetime, or something else. In a one-dimensional space, such as a curving line, we assign unique coordinate numbers to points along the line, and we make sure that no point fails to have a coordinate. For a 2-dimensional space, we assign pairs of numbers to points. For a 3-d space, we assign triples of numbers. Why numbers and not letters? If we assign letters instead of numbers, we can not use the tools of mathematics to describe the space. But even if we do assign numbers we cannot assign any coordinate numbers we please. There are restrictions. If the space has a certain geometry, then we have to assign numbers that reflect this geometry. If event A occurs before event B, then the date of event A, namely t(A), must be less than t(B). If event B occurs after event A but before event C, then we should assign dates so that t(A) < t(B) < t(C). Here is the fundamental method of analytic geometry:

Consider a space as a class of fundamental entities: points. The class of points has “structure” imposed upon it, constituting it a geometry—say the full structure of space as described by Euclidean geometry. [By assigning coordinates] we associate another class of entities with the class of points, for example a class of ordered n-tuples of real numbers [for a n-dimensional space], and by means of this “mapping” associate structural features of the space described by the geometry with structural features generated by the relations that may hold among the new class of entities—say functional relations among the reals. We can then study the geometry by studying, instead, the structure of the new associated system [of coordinates]. (Sklar, 1976, p. 28)

The goal in assigning coordinates to a space is to create a reference system for the space. A reference system is a reference frame plus either a coordinate system or an atlas of coordinate systems placed by the analyst upon the space to uniquely name the points. These names or coordinates are frame dependent in that a point can get new coordinates when the reference frame is changed. For 4-d spacetime that obeys special relativity and its Lorentzian geometry, a coordinate system is a grid of smooth timelike and spacelike curves on the spacetime that assigns to each point three space coordinate numbers and one time coordinate number. No two distinct points can have the same set of four coordinate numbers. Inertial frames can have global coordinate systems, but in general we have to make due with atlases. If we are working with general relativity where spacetime can curve and we cannot assume inertial frames, then the best we can do is to assign a coordinate system to a small region of spacetime where the laws of special relativity hold to a good approximation. General relativity requires special relativity to hold locally, and thus for spacetime to be Euclidean locally. That means that locally the 4-d spacetime is correctly described by 4-d Euclidean solid geometry. Consider two coordinate systems on adjacent regions. For the adjacent regions we make sure that the ‘edges’ of the two coordinate systems match up in the sense that each point near the intersection of the two coordinate systems gets a unique set of four coordinates and that nearby points get nearby coordinate numbers. The result is an “atlas” on spacetime.

For small regions of spacetime, we create a coordinate system by choosing a style of grid, say rectangular coordinates, fixing a point as being the origin, selecting one timelike and three spacelike lines to be the axes, and defining a unit of distance for each dimension. We cannot use letters for coordinates. The alphabet’s structure is too simple. Integers won’t do either; but real numbers are adequate to the task. The definition of “coordinate system” requires us to assign our real numbers in such a way that numerical betweenness among the coordinate numbers reflects the betweenness relation among points. For example, if we assign numbers 17, pi, and 101.3 to instants, then every interval of time that contains the pi instant and the 101.3 instant had better contain the 17 instant. When this feature holds, the coordinate assignment is said to be monotonic.

The choice of the unit presupposes we have defined what “distance” means. The metric for a space specifies what is meant by distance in that space. The natural metric between any two points in a one-dimensional space, such as the time sub-space of our spacetime, is the numerical difference between the coordinates of the two points. Using this metric for time, the duration between an event with the coordinate 11 and the event with coordinate 7 is 5. The metric for spacetime defines the spacetime interval between two spacetime locations, and it is more complicated than the metric for time alone. The spacetime interval between any two events is invariant or unchanged by a change to any other reference frame, although the time interval can vary with change of frame. More accurately, in the general theory, the infinitesimal spacetime interval between two neighboring points is invariant. The units of the spacetime interval are seconds squared.

In this discussion, there is no need to worry about the distinction between change in metric and change in coordinates. For a space that is topologically equivalent to the real line and for metrics that are consistent with that topology, each coordinate system determines a metric and each metric determines a coordinate system. More precisely, once you decide on a positive direction in the one-dimensional space and a zero-point for the coordinates, then the possible coordinate systems and the possible metrics are in one-to-one correspondence.

There are still other restrictions on the assignments of coordinate numbers. The restriction that we called the “conventionality of simultaneity” fixes what time-slices of spacetime can be counted as collections of simultaneous events. An even more complicated restriction is that coordinate assignments satisfy the demands of general relativity. The metric of spacetime in general relativity is not global but varies from place to place due to the presence of matter and gravitation. Spacetime cannot be given its coordinate numbers without our knowing the distribution of matter and energy.

The features that a space has without its points being assigned any coordinates whatsoever are its topological features. These are its dimensionality, whether it goes on forever or has a boundary, how many points there are, and so forth.

21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?

Ideally for any reference frame we would like to partition the set of all actual events into simultaneity equivalence classes by some reliable method. All events in the same class are said to happen at the same time in the frame, and every event is in some class or other. Consider what event near the supergiant star Betelgeuse is happening at the same time as now. That is a difficult question to answer, so let’s begin our discussion with some easier questions.

What is happening at time zero in our coordinate system? There is no way to select one point of spacetime and call it the origin of the coordinate system except by reference to actual events. In practice, we make the origin be the location of a special event. One popular choice is the birth of Jesus; another is the birth of Mohammed.

Our purpose in choosing a coordinate system or atlas is to express relationships among actual and possible events. The time relationships we are interested in are time-order relationships (Did this event occur between those two?) and magnitude-duration relationships (How long after A did B occur?) and date-time relationships (When did event A itself occur?). The date of a (point) event is the time coordinate number of the spacetime location where the event occurs. We expect all these assignments of dates to events to satisfy the requirement that event A happens before event B iff t(A) < t(B), where t(A) is the time coordinate of A, namely its date. The assignments of dates to events also must satisfy the demands of our physical theories, and in this case we face serious problems involving inconsistency as when a geologist gives one date for the birth of Earth and an astronomer gives a different date. By the way, in English the word “date” is ambiguous because we use it to stand for a specific time and also for the name of that specific time. In this article, we use the term both ways, hoping that the context indicates which way the word is intended.

It is a big step from assigning numbers to points of spacetime to assigning them to real events. Here are some of the questions that need answers. How do we determine whether a nearby event and a distant event occurred simultaneously? Assuming we want the second to be the standard unit for measuring the time interval between two events, how do we operationally define the second so we can measure whether one event occurred exactly one second later than another event? A related question is: How do we know whether the clock we have is accurate? Less fundamentally, attention must also be paid to the dependency of dates due to shifting from Standard Time to Daylight Savings Time, to crossing the International Date Line, to switching from the Julian to the Gregorian Calendar, and to comparing regular years with leap years.

Let’s design a coordinate system for time. Suppose we have already assigned a date of zero to the event that we choose to be at the origin of our coordinate system. To assign dates to other events, we first must define a standard clock and declare that the time intervals between any two consecutive ticks of that clock are the same. The second, our conventional unit of time measurement, will be defined to be so many ticks of the standard clock. We then synchronize other clocks with the standard clock so the clocks show equal readings at the same time. The time or date at which a point event occurs is the number reading on the clock at rest there. If there is no clock there, the assignment process is more complicated.

We want to use clocks to assign a time even to very distant events, not just to events in the immediate vicinity of the clock. To do this correctly requires some appreciation of Einstein’s theory of relativity. A major difficulty is that two nearby synchronized clocks, namely clocks that have been calibrated and set to show the same time when they are next to each other, will not in general stay synchronized if one is transported somewhere else. If they undergo the same motions and gravitational influences, they will stay synchronized; otherwise, they won’t. There is no privileged transportation process that we can appeal to. For more on how to assign dates to distant events, see the discussion of the relativity and conventionality of simultaneity.

As a practical matter, dates are assigned to events in a wide variety of ways. The date of the birth of the Sun is assigned very differently from dates assigned to two successive crests of a light wave in a laboratory laser. For example, there are lasers whose successive crests of visible light waves pass by a given location in the laboratory every 10 to the minus 15 seconds. This short time isn’t measured with a stopwatch. It is computed from measurements of the light’s wavelength. We rely on electromagnetic theory for the equation connecting the periodic time of the wave to its wavelength and speed. Dates for other kinds of events, such as the birth of the Sun, also are often computed rather than directly measured with a clock.

22. What Is Essential to Being a clock?

Every clock [a calendar is a kind of clock] has two essential functions: to tick and to count. In order to tick it must generate a sequence of events that are nearly all of the same duration. We need predictable, regular, cyclic behavior in order to measure time with a clock. In a pendulum clock, the cyclic behavior is the swings of the pendulum. In a digital clock, they are oscillations in an electronic circuit. In a sundial, they are regular movements of a shadow. The rotating earth is a clock that ticks once a day. A second essential function of any clock is to display a count of those periodic events. This count measures the duration of the event that the clock is used to measure, and the count is normally converted into seconds or some other standard unit of time. This counting can be especially difficult if the ticks are occurring a trillion times a second. It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on. It is also a convention that we re-set our clock by one hour as we move across a time-zone on the earth’s surface.

The goal in designing a clock is that it be accurate.

23. What Does It Mean For a Clock To Be Accurate?

An accurate clock is in synchrony with the standard clock. When the time measurements of the clock agree with the measurements made using the standard clock, we say the clock is accurate or properly calibrated or synchronized with the standard clock or simply correct. A perfectly accurate clock shows that it is time t just when the standard clock shows that it is time t, for all t. Accuracy is different from precision. If four clocks read exactly thirteen minutes slow compared to the standard clock, then the four are very precise, but they all are inaccurate by thirteen minutes.

A clock isn’t really measuring the time in a reference frame other than one fixed to the clock. In other words, a clock primarily measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. Technically, a clock is a device that measures the spacetime interval along its own worldline. If the clock is in an inertial frame and not moving relative to the standard clock, then it measures the “coordinate time,” the time we agree to use in the coordinate system. If the spacetime has no inertial frame, then that spacetime can’t have an ordinary coordinate time. Because clocks are intended to be used to measure events external to themselves, another goal in clock building is to ensure there is no difficulty in telling which clock tick is simultaneous with which events to be measured that are occuring away from the clock. For some situations and clocks, the sound made by the ticking helps us make this determination. We hear the tick just as we see the event occur that we desire to measure. But we might instead want to determine when the Sun comes up in the morning at some particular place where we and our clock are located.  In this situation, the time measurement is made by our seeing the Sun rise just when we see the digital clock face show a specific time of day. More accuracy in this kind of measurement process requires less reliance on human judgment.

In our discussion so far, we have assumed that the clock is very small, that it can count any part of a second and that it can count high enough to be a calendar. These aren’t always good assumptions. Despite those practical problems, there is the theoretical problem of there being a physical limit to the shortest duration measurable by a given clock because no clock can measure events whose duration is shorter than the time it takes light to travel between the components of that clock, the components in the part that generates the sequence of regular ticks. This theoretical limit places a lower limit on the error margin of the measurement.

To be an accurate clock that is in synchrony with the standard clock we want our clock to be adjustable in case it drifts out of synchrony a bit. It helps to keep it isolated from environmental influences such as heat, dust, unusual electromagnetic fields, physical blows (such as dropping the clock), and immersion in the ocean. And it helps to be able to be able to predict how much a specific influence affects the drift out of synchrony so that there can be an adjustment for this influence.

24. What Is Our Standard Clock?

We want to select as our standard clock a clock that we can be reasonably confident will tick regularly in the sense that all periods between adjacent ticks are congruent (the same duration). The international time standard used by most nations is called Coordinated Universal Time, or U.T.C. time, for the initials of the French name. It is not based on a single standard clock but rather on a large group of them. Here is how.

Atomic Time or A.T. time is what is produced by a cesium-based atomic fountain clock that counts in seconds, where those seconds are the S.I. seconds or Système International seconds (in the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d’Unités). The S.I. second is defined to be the time it takes for a standard cesium atomic clock to emit exactly 9,192,631,770 cycles of radiation produced as the clock’s cesium 133 atoms make a transition between two hyperfine levels of their ground state.

Actually, for the more precise timekeeping, the T.A.I. time scale is used rather than the A.T. scale. The T.A.I. scale does not use a single standard cesium clock but rather a calculated average of the readings of about 200 of the cesium atomic clocks that are distributed around the world in about fifty selected laboratories. One of those laboratories is the National Institute of Standards and Technology in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. This calculated average time is called T.A.I. time, the abbreviation of the French phrase for International Atomic Time. The International Bureau of Weights and Measures near Paris performs the averaging about once a month. If your laboratory had sent in your guess for what times “some” events occurred in the previous month according to your own clock, then in the following month, the Bureau would send you a report of how inaccurate your guess was, so you could make adjustments to your clock.

Coordinated Universal Time or U.T.C. time is T.A.I. time plus or minus some integral number of leap seconds. These leap seconds are the adjustments timekeepers make to ensure that, as the Earth spins and revolves irregularly, what we call midnight stays in synchrony with the Earth’s behavior so that over the years our midnight won’t drift closer to the daylight. The leap seconds and leap years are added to account for the temporal drift of solar system clocks. A leap second is added or subtracted every six months as needed to keep the time difference between atomic clocks and Earth’s rotation to below 0.9 seconds. U.T.C. is, by agreement, the time at the Prime Meridian, the longitude that runs through Greenwich England. The official government time in the U.S.A. is U.T.C. time minus the hourly offsets for the appropriate time zones of the U.S.A. including whether daylight savings time is observed. There is no single standard clock for U.T.C. time because it is a product of the averaging over 200 clocks producing the T.A.I. scale of time. U.T.C. time is informally called Zulu Time, and it is the time used by the Internet and the aviation industry throughout the world.

A.T. time, T.A.I. time, and U.T.C. time are not kinds of physical time. When they report the time, they are actually reporting their measure of time. They are three different ways to measure physical time. So, for this reason the word “time” is ambiguous; sometimes it means unmeasured time, and sometimes it means the measure of that time. Speakers rarely take care to say explicitly how they are using the term, so readers need to stay alert, even in the present Supplement and in the main Time article.

By a convention in 1964 [by ratification by the General Conference of Weights and Measures for the International System of Units, which replaced what was called the old "metric system"], the standard clock is the clock that the ratifying nations agree to use for defining the so-called “standard second” or S.I. second. This second, which has been used by the U.S.A. since 1999, is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods (cycles, oscillations, vibrations) of a certain kind of microwave radiation in the standard cesium clock. More specifically, the second is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods of the microwave radiation required to produce the maximum fluorescence of cesium 133 atoms (that is, their radiating a specific color of light) as the atoms make a transition between two specific hyperfine energy levels of the ground state of the atoms. This is the internationally agreed upon unit for atomic time [the T.A.I. system]. The old astronomical system [Universal Time 1 or UT1] defined a second to be 1/86,400 of an Earth day.

For this “atomic time,” or time measured atomically, the atoms of cesium with a uniform energy are sent through a chamber that is being irradiated with microwaves. The frequency of the microwaves is tuned until the maximum number of cesium atoms flip from one energy to the other, showing that the microwave radiation frequency is precisely tuned to be 9,192,631,770 vibrations per second. Because this frequency for maximum fluorescence is so stable from one experiment to the next, the vibration number is accurate to this many significant digits. The U.S.A.’s National Institute of Standards and Technology’s F-1 atomic fountain clock, that is used for reporting time in the U.S.A. (after adjustment so it reports the average from the other laboratories in the T.A.I. network), is so accurate that it drifts by less than one second every 20 million years. We know there is this drift because it is implied by the laws of physics, not because we have a better clock that measures this drift.

The meter depends on the second, so time measurement is more basic than space measurement. It does not follow, though, that time is more basic than space. The best way to measure length is to do it via measuring the number of periods of light, since light propagation is very stable or regular, and a light wave’s frequency can also be made very stable, and because distance can’t be measured as accurately as time. In 1999, the meter was defined in terms of the (pre-defined) second as being the distance light travels in a vacuum in an inertial frame in exactly 0.000000003335640952 seconds, or 1/299,792,458 seconds. That number is picked by convention so that the new meter will be very nearly the same distance as the old meter. The old meter was defined to be the distance between two specific marks on a platinum bar that was kept in the Paris Observatory. Time can be measured not only more accurately than distance but also more accurately than voltage, temperature, mass, or anything else.

One subtle implication of these standard definitions of the second and the meter is that they fix the speed of light in a vacuum in all inertial frames. The speed is exactly one meter per 0.000000003335640952 seconds or 299,792,458 meters per second, or approximately 186,282 miles per second or about three million football fields per second. There can no longer be any direct measurement to see if that is how fast light really moves; it is simply defined to be moving that fast. Any measurement that produced a different value for the speed of light would be presumed initially to have an error. The error would be in, say, its measurements of lengths and durations, or in its assumptions about being in an inertial frame, or in its adjustments for the influence of gravitation and acceleration, or in its assumption that the light was moving in a vacuum. This initial presumption of where the error lies comes from a deep reliance by scientists on Einstein’s theory of relativity. However, if it were eventually decided by the community of scientists that the theory of relativity is incorrect and that the speed of light shouldn’t have been fixed as it was, then the scientists would call for a new world convention to re-define the second.

25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?

Other clocks ideally are calibrated by being synchronized to “the” standard clock, but some choices of standard clock are better than others. The philosophical question is whether the better choice is objectively better because it gives us an objectively more accurate clock, or whether the choice is a matter of convenience and makes our concept of time a more useful tool for doing physics. The issue is one of realism vs. instrumentalism. Let’s consider the various goals we want to achieve in choosing one standard clock rather than another.

One goal is to choose a clock that doesn’t drift very much. That is, we want a clock that has a very regular period—so the durations between ticks are congruent. Throughout history, scientists have detected that their currently-chosen standard clock seemed to be drifting. In about 1700, scientists discovered that the time from one day to the next, as determined by sunrises, varied throughout the year. Therefore, they decided to define durations in terms of the mean day throughout the year. Before the 1950s, the standard clock was defined astronomically in terms of the mean rotation of the Earth upon its axis [solar time]. For a short period in the 1950s and 1960s, it was defined in terms of the revolution of the Earth about the Sun [ephemeris time]. The second was defined to be 1/86,400 of the mean solar day, the average throughout the year of the rotational period of the Earth with respect to the Sun. Now we’ve found a better standard clock, a certain kind of atomic clock [which displays "atomic time"] that was discussed in the previous section of this Supplement. All atomic clocks measure time in terms of the natural resonant frequencies of certain atoms or molecules. (The dates of adoption of these standard clocks omitted in this paragraph because different international organizations adopted different standards in different years.)

To achieve the goal of restricting drift, we isolate the clock from outside effects. That is, a practical goal in selecting a standard clock is to find a clock that can be well insulated from environmental impact such as comets impacting the Earth, earthquakes, stray electric fields or the presence of dust. If not insulation, then we pursue the goal of compensation. If there is some theoretically predictable effect of the influence upon the standard clock, then the clock can be regularly adjusted to compensate for this effect. Why is choosing the cesium atomic clock as our standard better than choosing an astronomical process such as the mean yearly motion of the Earth around the Sun? Can’t we compensate for all the relevant effects on the motion of the Earth around the Sun? Not easily. The problem is that the Earth’s rate of spin varies in a practically unpredictable manner. Meanwhile, we believe that the relevant factors affecting the spin (such as shifts in winds, comet bombardment, earthquakes, the ocean’s tides and currents, convection in Earth’s molten core) are affecting the rotational speed and period of revolution of the Earth, but not affecting the behavior of the atomic clock. We don’t want to be required to say that an earthquake on Earth or the melting of Greenland ice caused a change in the frequency of cesium emissions throughout the universe.

We add leap years and seconds in order to keep our atomic-based calendar in synchrony with the rotations and revolutions of the Earth. We want to keep atomic-noons occurring on astronomical-noons and ultimately to prevent Northern hemisphere winters from occurring in some future July, so we systematically add leap years and leap seconds and leap microseconds in the counting process. These changes do not affect the duration of a second, but they do affect the duration of a year because, with leap years, not all years last the same number of seconds. In this way, we compensate for the Earth-Sun clocks falling out of synchrony with our standard clock.

Another desirable feature of a standard clock is that reproductions of it stay in synchrony with each other when environmental conditions are the same. Otherwise we may be limited to relying on a specifically-located standard clock that can’t be trusted elsewhere and that can be stolen. Cesium clocks in a suburb of Istanbul work just like cesium clocks in an airplane over New York City.

Because of the interplay of space with time in relativity theory, the choice of a standard clock depends not only on the simplicity of having a clock with regular ticks but also on the regularity of distances such as having all atoms in a molecular lattice be the same distance apart.

The principal goal in selecting a standard clock is to reduce mystery in physics by finding a periodic process that, if adopted as our standard, makes the resulting system of physical laws simpler and more useful. Choosing the atomic clock as standard is much better for this purpose than choosing the periodic dripping of water from our goat skin bag or even the periodic revolutions of the Earth about the Sun. If scientists were to retain the Earth-Sun clock as the standard clock and say that by definition the Earth does not slow down in any rotation or in any revolution, then when a comet collides with Earth, tempting the scientists to say the Earth slowed down a bit, the scientists would be forced instead to alter, among many other things, their atomic theory and say the frequency of light emitted from cesium atoms mysteriously increases all over the universe when comets collide with Earth. By switching to the cesium atomic standard, these alterations are unnecessary, the mysteries vanish, and scientists can readily explain the non-uniform wobbling of the Earth’s daily rotations and yearly revolutions as being due to comet collisions, the tides on the Earth, convection within the Earth, the gravitational pull of the moon, Sun, and other planets, and our planet’s encounters with dust.

A related goal in choosing a standard clock is that its readings should be consistent with the accepted laws of motion. For instance, Newton’s first law of motion says that a body in motion should cover the same distance during the same time interval unless acted upon by an external force. If we used our standard clock to run a series of tests of the time intervals as a body moved along a carefully measured path and found that the law was violated and we couldn’t account for this violation by external forces and we were sure that there was no problem otherwise with Newton’s law or with the measurement of the length of the path, then the problem would be with the clock. Leonhard Euler [1707-1783] was the first person to suggest this consistency requirement on our choice of a standard clock. A similar argument holds today but with using the laws of motion from Einstein’s theory of relativity.

What it means for the standard clock to be accurate depends on your philosophy of time. If you are a conventionalist, then once you select the standard clock it can not fail to be accurate in the sense of being correct. On the other hand, if you are an objectivist, you will say the standard clock can be inaccurate.

When you want to know how long a basketball game lasts, why do you subtract the start time from the end time? Because the metric for time is that you subtract two time numbers to determine the duration between the two. Why don’t you subtract the square root of the start time from the square root of the end time? Our question is also asking whether our choice of metric can be incorrect or merely inconvenient.

Let’s say more about this. When we choose a standard clock we are choosing a metric. By agreeing to read the clock so that a duration from an event that lasts from 3:00 to 5:00 is the numerical difference of the two numbers, namely two hours, we are making a choice about how to measure the duration between any two events, and so we are making a choice abut how to compare any two durations in order to decide whether they are equal, that is, congruent. Philosophers of time continue to dispute the extent to which the choice of metric is conventional rather than forced by nature. The objectivist says the choice is forced and that the success of the standard atomic clock over the standard solar clock shows that we were more accurate in our choice of the standard clock. An objectivist believes that whether two intervals of time are really equivalent is an intrinsic feature of nature, and choosing the standard clock isn’t any more conventional than is choosing to say the Earth is round rather than flat. Taking this conventional side on this issue, Adolf Grünbaum argues that time is “metrically amorphous.” It has no intrinsic metric in the sense of its structure determining the measure of durations. Instead, we choose the metric we do in order to achieve the goals mentioned above, but satisfying those goals is no sign of being correct.

The conventionalist as opposed to the objectivist would say that if we were to require by convention that the instant at which Jesus was born and the instant at which Abraham Lincoln was assassinated occurred are to be only 24 seconds apart, whereas the duration between Lincoln’s assassination and his burial is to be 24 billion seconds, then we could not be mistaken. It is up to us as a civilization to say what is correct when we first create our conventions about measuring duration. We can consistently assign any numerical time coordinates we wish, subject only to the condition that the assignment properly reflect the betweenness relations of the events that occur at those instants. That is, if event J (birth of Jesus) occurs before event L (Lincoln’s assassination) and this in turn occurs before event B (burial of Lincoln), then the time assigned to J must be numerically less than the time assigned to L, and both must be less than the time assigned to B so that t(J) < t(L) < t(B). A simple requirement.

It is other features of nature that lead us to reject the above convention about 24 seconds and 24 billion seconds. What features? There are many periodic processes in nature that have a special relationship to each other; their periods are very nearly constant multiples of each other; and this constant stays the same over a long time. For example, the period of the rotation of the Earth is a fairly constant multiple of the period of the revolution of the Earth around the Sun, and both these periods are a constant multiple of the periods of swinging pendulums. The class of these periodic processes is very large, so the world will be easier to describe if we choose our standard clock from one of these periodic processes. A good convention for what is regular will make it easier for scientists to find simple laws of nature and to explain what causes other events to be irregular. It is the search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery that leads us to adopt the conventions we do for numerical time coordinate assignments. Objectivists disagree and say this search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery is all fine, but it is directing us toward the intrinsic or correct metric.

Back to the main “Time” article.

 

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Last updated: April 8, 2013 | Originally published: