Time is what we use a clock or calendar to measure. Or we can say time is all the instants. However, time is not all the times. Times are numbers such as dates and clock readings that we place on instants and on longer events, and these numbers are relative to reference frames and time zones and conventional agreements about how to define the second. It is because of the nature of time itself that we can succeed in assigning times to instants and events, and succeed in placing non-simultaneous events in a linear sequence one after the other, and succeed in coherently specifying with real numbers how long an event lasts. These are key features of time. Yet despite 2,500 years of investigating time, many issues about it are unresolved.
Here is a list in no particular order of the most important issues that will be discussed in this article: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •How time is related to mind; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •Whether future time will be infinite; •Whether there was time before the Big Bang; •Whether tensed or tenseless concepts are semantically basic; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; and •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.
Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This third theory is called “the block universe theory” or “eternalism.”
Philosophers of time tend to divide into two broad camps on some of the key philosophical issues, although many philosophers do not fit into these pigeonholes. Members of the A camp say that McTaggart’s A-series is the fundamental way to view time; the now is objectively real and so is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are semantically basic; and the ontologically fundamental entities are 3-dimensional objects. Members of the B camp say that McTaggart’s B-series is the fundamental way to view time; the now is subjective and so is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism or the block universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are not semantically basic; and the fundamental entities are 4-dimensional events. This article provides an introduction to this controversy between the camps.
However, there are many other issues about time whose solutions do not fit into one or the other of the above two camps. (i) Does time exist only for beings who have minds? (ii) What sorts of time travel are possible? (iii) Why does time have an arrow? (iv) Can time exist if no event is happening anywhere? (v) Is time real?
A full theory of time should address this constellation of philosophical issues about time. Narrower theories of time will focus on resolving one or more members of this constellation, but the long-range goal is to knit together these theories into a full, systematic, and detailed theory of time. Philosophers also ask whether to adopt a realist or anti-realist interpretation of a theory of time, but this article does not explore this subtle metaphysical question.
Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism’s circadian rhythm or body clock, which is normally regulated by the pattern of sunlight and darkness. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is perhaps best understood as awareness of physical time. Psychological time passes relatively swiftly for us while we are enjoying an activity, but it slows dramatically if we are waiting anxiously for the pot of water to boil on the stove. The slowness is probably due to focusing our attention on short intervals of physical time. Meanwhile, the clock by the stove is measuring physical time and is not affected by any person’s awareness or by any organism’s biological time.
When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” refers to physical time, not psychological time or biological time. Physical time is more basic than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences.
Psychological time is faster for older people than for children, as you notice when your grandmother says, “Oh, it’s my birthday again.” That is, an older person’s psychological time is faster relative to physical time. Psychological time is slower or faster depending upon where we are in the spectrum of conscious experience: awake normally, involved in a daydream, sleeping normally, drugged with anesthetics, or in a coma. Some philosophers claim that psychological time is completely transcended in the mental state called nirvana because psychological time slows to a complete stop. However, there is general agreement among philosophers that, when we are awake normally, we experience time as being continuous; we do not experience it as stopping and starting.
A major philosophical problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, how our experience of temporal phenomena produces our consciousness of our experiencing temporal phenomena. With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. Many philosophers also say people in a coma have a low level of consciousness, yet when a person awakes from a coma they can imagine other times but have no good sense about how long they’ve been in the coma.
We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time, with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.
Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience only of the momentary present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or do we have direct experience of what William James called a “specious present,” a short stretch of physical time? James said, “The tiniest feeling that we can possibly have comes with an earlier and a later part and with a sense of their continuous precession.” Anything with an earlier part and a later part cannot possibly be instantaneous in physical time. If a sequence of events occurs over a short enough duration of physical time, then we experience all the events as being simultaneous in psychological time. Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, there is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our stream of consciousness.
The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your nose to reach your brain, you will have the experience of the two tappings being simultaneous—thanks to the brain’s manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” Craig Callender surveyed the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concluded that, if the duration in physical time between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second (250 milliseconds), then humans will say both events happened simultaneously, and this duration is slightly different for different people but is stable within the experience of any single person. Also, “our impression of subjective present-ness…can be manipulated in a variety of ways” such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby times. (Callender, 2003-4, p. 124)
Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the proper time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). The most surprising experimental result about our experience of time is Benjamin Libet’s claim in the 1970s that his experiments show that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally agreed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet’s work has been used to challenge this universal claim about decisions. However, Libet’s own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue. See (Damasio 2002) for more discussion of Libet’s experiments.
Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall bridge with bungee cords attached to one’s ankles; and trying different forms of meditation. So far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.
Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon? Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds in the world, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? The majority answer is “no.” The ability of the concept of time to help us make sense of our phenomenological evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events is a sign that time may be objectively real. Consider succession, that is, order of events in time. We agree that our memories of events occur after the events occur. If judgments of time were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the ordering of public events in time. For example, first Einstein was born, then he went to school, then he died. Everybody agrees that it happened in this order: birth, school, death. No other order. The agreement on time order for so many events, both psychological events and physical events, is part of the reason that most philosophers and scientists believe physical time is an objective phenomenon that is not dependent on being consciously experienced.
Another large part of the reason time is believed to be objective is that our universe has so many different processes that bear consistent time relations, or frequency of occurrence relations, to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis is a constant multiple of the frequency of oscillation of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a multiple of the frequency of a vibrating violin string; the relationship of these oscillators does not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of relationships makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is something objective we are referring to with the time-variable in those laws. The stability of these relationships over a long time makes it easy to create clocks. Time can be measured easily because we have access to long-term simple harmonic oscillators that have a regular period or “regular ticking.” This regularity shows up in completely different stable systems: rotations of the Earth, a swinging ball hanging from a string (a pendulum), a bouncing ball hanging from a coiled spring, revolutions of the Earth around the Sun, oscillating electric circuits, and periodic atomic phenomena in a crystal lattice. Many of these systems make good clocks. The existence of these possibilities for clocks strongly suggests that time is objectively real, and is not merely an aspect of consciousness.
Aristotle raised this issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements being numbered were consciousness to exist.
St. Augustine, adopting a subjective view of time, said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind. In the 13th century, Duns Scotus clearly recognized both physical and psychological time.
At the end of the 18th century, Kant suggested a subtle relationship between time and mind–that our mind actually structures our perceptions so that we can know a priori that time is like a mathematical line. Time is, on this theory, a form of conscious experience, and our sense of time is a necessary condition of our having experiences such as sensations. In the 19th century, Ernst Mach claimed instead that our sense of time is a simple sensation, not an a priori form of sensation. This controversy took another turn when other philosophers argued that both Kant and Mach were incorrect because our sense of time is, instead, an intellectual construction (see Whitrow, p. 64).
In the 20th century, the philosopher of science Bas van Fraassen described time, including physical time, by saying, “There would be no time were there no beings capable of reason” just as “there would be no food were there no organisms, and no teacups if there were no tea drinkers.”
The controversy in metaphysics between idealism and realism is that, for the idealist, nothing exists independently of the mind. If this controversy is settled in favor of idealism, then physical time, too, would have that subjective feature.
It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that physical time depends on the observer, and thus that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s use of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration of an event depends on the observer’s frame of reference or coordinate system, but what Einstein means by “observer’s frame of reference” is merely a perspective or coordinate framework from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.
For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For more on whether the present, as opposed to time itself, is subjective, see the section called “Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?“
Time is what we use a clock or calendar to measure. Or we can say time is all the instants. However, time is not all the times. Times are numbers such as dates and clock readings that we place on instants and on longer events, and these numbers are relative to reference frames and time zones and conventional agreements about how to define the second. It is because of the nature of time itself that we can succeed in assigning times to instants and events, and succeed in placing non-simultaneous events in a linear sequence one after the other, and succeed in coherently specifying with real numbers how long an event lasts. These are key features of time, but they do not quite tell us what time itself is.
If physical time and psychological time are two different kinds of time, then two answers are required to the question “What is time?” and some commentary is required regarding their relationships, such as whether one is more fundamental. Physical time seems to be objective, whereas psychological time is subjective. Many philosophers of science argue that physical time is more fundamental even though psychological time is discovered first by each of us during our childhood, and even though psychological time was discovered first as we human beings evolved from our animal ancestors. The remainder of this article focuses more on physical time than psychological time.
We cannot trip over a moment of time nor enclose it in a box, so what exactly are moments? Are they created by humans analogous to how, according to some constructivist philosophers, mathematical objects are created by humans, and once created then they have well-determined properties some of which might be difficult for humans to discover? Or is time more like a Platonic idea? Or is time a general feature of sticks and stones and other physical objects analogous to how a sound wave is a general feature of the molecules of a vibrating tuning fork, with no single molecule making a sound and no single stick or stone creating a moment? When we know what time is, then we can answer all these questions.
One answer to our question, “What is time?” is that time is whatever the time variable t is denoting in the best-confirmed and most fundamental theories of current science. “Time” is given an implicit definition this way. Nearly all philosophers would agree that we do learn much about physical time by looking at the behavior of the time variable in these theories; but they complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only with a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.
Physicists often say time is a sequence of moments in a linear order. Presumably a moment is a durationless instant. Michael Dummett’s constructive model of time implies instead that time is a composition of intervals rather than of durationless instants. The model is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.
One answer to the question “What is time?” is that it is a collection of objects called “times” that ultimately reduce to relationships among events. A competing answer is that time is more like a substance in that it exists independently of relationships among events. A more popular answer post-Einstein is that time is not a substance but spacetime is, and time is a part of spacetime. These answers to our question are explored in a later section.
Time is intimately related to change, so an answer to our question is likely to depend on our answer to the question, “What is change?” The most popular type of answer here is that change is an alteration in the properties of some enduring thing, for example, the alteration from green to brown of an enduring leaf. The different type of answer is that change is basically a sequence of states, such as a sequence containing a state in which the leaf is green and a state in which the leaf is brown. This issue won’t be pursued here, and the former answer will be presumed at several places later in the article.
Before the creation of Einstein’s special theory of relativity, it might have been said that time must provide these four things: (1) For any event, it specifies when it occurs. (2) For any event, it specifies its duration—how long it lasts. (3) For any event, it specifies what other events are simultaneous with it. (4) For any pair of events that are not simultaneous, it specifies which happens first. With the creation of the special theory of relativity in 1905, it was realized that these questions can get different answers in different frames of reference.
Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart answer the question, “What is time?” by replying that it is nothing because it does not exist. In a similar vein, the early 20th century English philosopher F. H. Bradley argued, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance….The problem of change defies solution.” In the mid-twentieth century, Gödel argued for the unreality of time because Einstein’s equations allow for physically possible worlds in which events to precede themselves. In the twenty-first century some physicists such as Julian Barbour say that in order to reconcile general relativity with quantum mechanics either time does not exist or else it is not fundamental in nature; see Callender (2010) for a discussion of this. However, most philosophers agree that time does exist. They just can not agree on what it is.
Let’s briefly explore other answers that have been given throughout history to our question, “What is time?” Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12), but he emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time…” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a specific change such as the descent of a leaf can be faster or slower, but time itself can not be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11).
René Descartes had a very different answer to “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation (“Third Meditation” in Meditations on First Philosophy).
In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of motion or change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Newton argued very specifically that time and space are an infinitely large container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that space and time are not material substances, but are like substances in not being dependent on anything except God.
Gottfried Leibniz objected. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had underemphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of any pair of non-simultaneous events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. He accepted a relational theory of time and rejected a substantival theory.
In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space. If physical space and perceptual space are the same thing, then Kant is claiming we know a priori that physical space is Euclidean. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 1820s, and with increased doubt about the reliability of Kant’s method of transcendental proof, the view that truths about space and time are a priori truths began to lose favor.
The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is. And there is no sharp line separating a definition of time, a theory of time, and an explanation of time.
Whatever time is, it is not “time.” “Time” is the most common noun in all documents on the Internet’s web pages; time is not. Nevertheless, it might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word “time.” Should the proper answer to the question “What is time?” produce a definition of the word as a means of capturing its sense? No. At least not if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.
But how about narrowing the goal to a definition of the word “time” in its main sense, the sense that most interests philosophers and physicists? That is, explore the usage of the word “time” in its principal sense as a means of learning what time is. Well, this project would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Most philosophers today would agree with A. N. Prior who remarked that, “there are genuine metaphysical problems, but I think you have to talk about grammar at least a little bit in order to solve most of them.” However, do we learn enough about what time is when we learn about the grammatical intricacies of the word? John Austin made this point in “A Plea for Excuses,” when he said, if we are using the analytic method, the method of analysis of language, in order to sharpen our perception of the phenomena, then “it is plainly preferable to investigate a field where ordinary language is rich and subtle, as it is in the pressingly practical matter of Excuses, but certainly is not in the matter, say, of Time.” Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein’s expectation is that by drawing attention to ordinary ways of speaking we will be able to dissolve rather than answer our philosophical questions. But most philosophers of time are unsatisfied with this approach; they want the questions answered, not dissolved, although they are happy to have help from the ordinary language philosopher in clearing up misconceptions that may be produced by the way we use the word in our ordinary, non-technical discourse.
Is time more like a straight line or instead more like a circle? If your personal time were circular, then eventually you would be reborn. With circular time, the future is also in the past, and every event occurs before itself. If your time is like this, then the question arises as to whether you would be born an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that you’d be born only once appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles: each supposedly repeating state of the world would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs. The way to support the idea of eternal recurrence or repeated occurrence seems to be to presuppose a linear ordering in some “hyper” time of all the cycles so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor because it occurs at a different hyper time.
During history (and long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time), a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or, instead, closed like a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be motion and believed cosmic motion was cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring any detailed endless repetition such as the multiple rebirths of Socrates. However, the Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely for a moral lesson about how you should live your life if you knew that you’d live it over and over.
Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear plus the Jewish-Zoroastrian idea that the universe was created at a definite moment in the past. Augustine emphasized that human experience is a one-way journey from Genesis to Judgment, regardless of any recurring patterns or cycles in nature. In the Medieval period, Thomas Aquinas agreed. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line. The concept of linear time was promoted by Barrow, Newton, Leibniz, Locke and Kant. Kant argued that it is a matter of necessity. In 19th century Europe, the idea of linear time became dominant in both science and philosophy. However, in the twentieth century, Gödel and several others discovered solutions to the equations of Einstein’s general theory of relativity that allowed closed loops of proper time (closed time-like curves). Each event in the loop lies in its own causal history. These causal loops or closed curves in spacetime allow you to go forward continuously in time until you arrive back into your past. As far as we can tell today, our universe does not exemplify any of these solutions to Einstein’s equations.
There are many mathematically possible topologies for time. Time could be linear or closed. Linear time might have a beginning or have no beginning; it might have an ending or no ending. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds; perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter “Y”, and there could be a fusion time in which two different time streams merge into one. Time might be two dimensional instead of one dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be discrete time or, instead, continuous time. That is, the micro-structure of time’s instants might be analogous to a sequence of integers or, instead, analogous to a continuum of real numbers. For physicists, if time were discrete or quantized, their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds.
In ancient Greece, Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is eternal. Aristotle claimed that time had no beginning because, for any time, we always imagine an earlier time. The Medieval philosopher Thomas Aquinas objected to Aristotle’s position, saying that, although the world could have existed infinitely into the past, in fact it did not, and our imagination cannot always be trusted to tell us how things are. Instead, the past is finite because time began with God’s creation of Earth a finite time ago. In the late 17th century, Newton declared that time is infinite in both the past and future. Then, in the 18th century, Kant argued that this is not an empirical matter but rather a matter of necessity.
In the most well accepted version of the Big Bang Theory (namely, for large scale activity, the Friedman model of Einstein’s equations plus early inflation), the past is finite, not infinite. Time began about 13.8 billion years ago when the universe had infinitesimal size and a nearly infinite gravitational field. [It is not clear whether to call the Big Bang an event. It is either not an event, or else it is a non-standard event that has no cause. Assuming it is an event, then it occurs at a time but not in time.]
About 10-36 second after the beginning of the Big Bang, there was inflation, a rapidly accelerating expansion, that lasted for 10-30 seconds during which the universe expanded by a factor of 1078. Once this brief period of inflation ended, the energy causing the inflation was transformed into a dense gas of expanding hot radiation, and this expansion has never stopped. But with expansion comes cooling, which allowed individual material particles to condense and eventually much later to clump into galaxies. Nine billion years after the Big Bang, dark energy took over and started to accelerate the expansion again. This expansion of the universe will continue forever at an exponentially accelerating rate, turning space into an almost perfect vacuum as the remaining matter-energy becomes more and more diluted. The implication for both space and time is that, although they both were finite in the past, they will be potentially infinite in the future.
Consider this argument from Newton-Smith (1980, p. 111) that time cannot have had a beginning: “And as we have reasons for supposing that macroscopic events have causal origins, we have reason to suppose that some prior state of the universe led to the product of [the Big Bang]. So the prospects for ever being warranted in positing a beginning of time are dim.” The usual response to Newton-Smith here is two-fold. First, the Big Bang is a microscopic event, not a macroscopic event. Second, if a cosmological theory implies there is a first event and if that theory has indirect confirmation, then we can say there is an exception to the claim that every event has a prior cause.
The classical Big Bang Theory with inflation is challenged by other theories such as a cyclic theory in which every trillion years the expansion changes to contraction until the universe becomes infinitesimal, at which time there is a bounce or new Big Bang. The cycles of Bang and Crunch continue forever, and they might or might not have existed forever. (For the details, see Steinhardt 2012.)
When we discuss whether time was infinite in the past or will be in the future we are presuming an ordinary scale of time. Using a logarithmic scale can turn the finite into the infinite. With a scale change of time t to time log t, a finite event lasting from year 0 to year 1 becomes an infinite event lasting from -∞ to 0 because the log 0 = -∞ and log 1 = 0. An ordinary scale is one for which it is easy to find periodic processes to use in building clocks.
Is time a fundamental feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features–in analogy to the way the smoothness of water flow emerges from the complicated behavior of the underlying molecules, none of which is properly called “smooth”? That is, is time ontologically basic, or does it depend on something even more basic? We might rephrase this question more technically by asking whether facts about time supervene on more basic facts. Facts about sound supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, so molecular change is more basic than sound. Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, and this argument is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic? Some physicists argue that spacetime is the product of some more basic micro-substrate at the level of the Planck length, although there is no agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is. Other physicists say space is not basic, but time is. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed this viewpoint:
Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?
The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic or whether the idea of time is basic to concept formation.
It is an arbitrary convention that our civilizations designs clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on. It is just a matter of convenience that we agree to the convention of re-setting our clock by one hour as we cross a time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of ten, that there are sixty seconds in a minute rather than twelve, that a second lasts as long as it does, and that the origin of our coordinate system for time is associated with the birth of Jesus on some calendars but the entry of Mohammed into Mecca on other calendars.
Let us now turn to deeper issues about conventionality. When we decide to compute the duration of an event by subtracting the difference between the time of the start and the time of the end of the event, is this choice of computational method merely arbitrary, or could we have chosen to compute, instead, the square root of the difference, or perhaps the difference of the square roots of the readings for the start and end and called this the “duration”?
The French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that there is no true time in reality but only more or less convenient conventions to adopt as to what time is. He preferred the concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Other philosophers of science have recommended adopting a less idealistic view in which there is a true time in reality. Philosophers and scientists generally agree that many features of the metric of time are conventional. However, there is a raging dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. Einstein said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions because any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967 and D. Malament in 1977 gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see Callender and Hoefer (2002). A related controversy about the metric of time concerns whether our choosing an atomic clock rather than the Earth’s rotation as our standard clock indicates we’ve chosen a more correct metric or instead merely a more convenient metric.
Physics, including astronomy, is the only science that explicitly studies time, although all sciences use the concept. Yet different physical theories place different demands on this concept. So, let’s discuss time from the perspective of current science.
Suppose a speaker refers to two events A and B. A is the event of Queen Anne’s death, and event B is a particular explosion on the supergiant star Betelgeuse. The speaker points out that this is an odd pair of events, because A doesn’t happen before B happens, and B doesn’t happen before A, and yet no parts of the two events are simultaneous. Consider what grounds you have for saying, “That is impossible.” This impossibility is one of the requirements that the special theory of relativity places on its concept of time. It is the requirement that in any reference frame the binary (or two-place) happens-before relation be total on events.
Physics also requires that almost all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric. This means that a law, if it is a basic law, must not distinguish between backward and forward time directions. Also the laws cannot change from one day to another.
In physics we need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds after another. In ordinary discourse outside of science we would never need this kind of precision. The need for this precision has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line. So, one requirement that relativity, quantum mechanics and the Big Bang theory place on any duration is that is be a continuum. This implies that time is not quantized, even in quantum mechanics. In a world with time being a continuum, we cannot speak of some event being caused by the state of the world at the immediately preceding instant because there is no immediately preceding instant, just as there is no real number immediately preceding pi.
Einstein’s theory of relativity has had the biggest impact on our understanding of time. But Einstein was not the first physicist to appreciate the relativity of motion. Galileo and Newton would have said speed is relative to reference frame. Einstein would agree but would add that times and durations are relative, too. For example, any observer fixed to a moving railroad car in which you are seated will say your speed is zero, whereas an observer fixed to the train station will say you have a positive speed. But as Galileo and Newton understood relativity, both observers will agree about the time you had lunch on the train. Einstein would say they are making a mistake about your lunchtime; they should disagree about when you had lunch. For Newton, the speed of anything, including light, would be different in the two frames that move relative to each other, but Einstein said Maxwell’s equations require the speed of light to be invariant. This implies that the Galilean equations of motion are incorrect. Einstein figured out how to change the equations; the consequence is the Lorentz transformations in which two observers in relative motion will have to disagree also about the time and duration of events. What is happening here is that Einstein is requiring a mixing of space and time; Minkowski said it follows that there is a spacetime which divides into its space and time differently for different observers.
One consequence of this is that relativity’s spacetime is more fundamental than either space or time alone. Spacetime is commonly said to be four-dimensional, but because time is not space it is more accurate to think of spacetime as being (3 + 1)-dimensional. Time is a distinguished, linear subspace of four-dimensional spacetime.
Another profound idea from relativity theory is that accurate clocks do not tick the same for everyone everywhere. Each object has its own proper time, so the correct time shown by a clock depends on its history. Time is relative in the sense that the duration of an event depends on the reference frame used in measuring the duration. For some pairs of events, even the order in which they occur is relative, although all correct observers must agree on the order if the two events could be causally related. Specifying that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is like asking someone to stand over there and not giving any indication of where “there” is. Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. In general, two synchronized clocks do not stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock.
Unlike in Newton’s physics and the physics of special relativity, in general relativity the spacetime is not a passive container for events; it is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature of spacetime itself. Gravity is a manifestation of the warping of spacetime. In special relativity, its Minkowski spacetime has no curvature. In general relativity a spacetime with no mass or energy might or might not have curvature, so the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of matter and energy.
In 1611, Bishop James Ussher declared that the beginning of time occurred on October 23, 4004 B.C.E. Today’s science disagrees. According to the classical Big Bang theory of cosmology, the universe began 13.8 billion years ago as spacetime started to expand from an infinitesimal volume; and the expansion continues today, with the volume of space now doubling in size about every ten billion years. The amount of future time is a potential infinity (in Aristotle’s sense of the term) as opposed to an actual infinity. For more discussion of all these compressed remarks, see What Science Requires of Time.
Most philosophers and scientists believe time travel is physically possible. To define the term, we can say that in time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by the traveler’s correct clock takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by the correct clocks of those who do not take the journey. The physical possibility of travel to the future is well accepted, but travel to the past is more controversial, and time travel that changes the future or the past is generally considered to be impossible.
According to relativity theory, there are two ways to travel into the future using time dilation—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field. If you move at extremely high speed, you can travel into the future to the year 2,300 on Earth (as measured by Earth-based clocks or by clocks elsewhere that are not moving relative to Earth) while your personal clock measures that only ten years have elapsed. You can participate in that future, not just view it. But you can not get back to the twenty-first century on Earth by reversing your velocity. It’s not that you suddenly jump into the Earth’s future of the year 2,300; you have continually been traveling forward in both your personal time and the world’s external time, and you could have been continuously observed from Earth. But as judged by the world’s external time you do have a much longer lifetime than your biological twin whom you left back on Earth long ago. (See the discussion of the twin paradox for the solution to the famous paradox involving time dilation.)
In addition to time dilation due to high speed, there is time dilation due to being in the presence of a gravitation field; this is called gravitational time dilation or gravitational red shift. Because of Earth’s gravity, people who live in the ground floor apartment age slower than their twin who lives in the top floor apartment of the same building. This kind of time travel is more noticeable if the younger twin lives near a black hole where the gravity is much stronger than on Earth.
You may have heard the remark that you have no time to take a spaceship ride across the galaxy since it is 100,000 light years across. So, even if you were to travel at just under the speed of light, it would take you over 100,000 years. Who has that kind of time? This remark contains a misunderstanding about time dilation. This is 100,000 years as judged by clocks that are stationary relative to Earth, not as judged by your clock. If you were in the spaceship that accelerated quickly to just under the speed of light, then you and your clock might age hardly at all as you traveled across the galaxy. In fact, with a very fast spaceship, you have plenty of time to go anywhere in the universe you wish to go.
How about travel to the past, the more interesting kind of time travel? This is not allowed by either Newton’s physics or Einstein’s special relativity, but is allowed by general relativity. In 1949, Kurt Gödel discovered a solution to Einstein’s field equations that allows continuous, closed future-directed timelike curves. To say this more simply, Gödel discovered that in some possible worlds that obey the theory of general relativity, you can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past. In this unusual non-Minkowski spacetime, the universe as a whole is the time machine; no one needs to build a device in order to travel this way.
The situation required for travel to the past is much more exotic than merely having a fast spaceship, but scientists do know how you could get back to Hitler’s office in Berlin in a manner consistent with the laws of science. Unfortunately, you cannot do anything that hasn’t already been done, or else there would be a contradiction. In fact, if you did go back, then you would already have been back there. So, you can participate in a Hitler assassination attempt, but you cannot change its outcome. For the same reason, you cannot kill your childhood self no matter how hard you try. Also, when you travel to the past, you do not suddenly fade out of the present and into some past time, although this is how time travel is so often portrayed in films.
There are several well known philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel. None are generally considered to be decisive. Here are the arguments:
These six complaints are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, that it is not physically possible, that it is not technologically possible with current technology, and that it is unlikely, given today’s empirical evidence.
For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”
There are two main philosophical theories about whether time requires change. Substantival theories are theories that imply time is substance-like in that it exists independently of the spacetime relations exhibited by physical processes. This theory allows “empty time” in which nothing changes. On the other hand, relational theories do not allow this. They imply that at every time something is happening—such as an electron moving through space or a tree leaf changing its color. In short, no change implies no time.
Some substantival theories describe spacetime as being like a container for events. The container exists with or without events in it. Relational theories imply there is no container without contents. But the substance that substantivalists have in mind is more like a medium pervading all of spacetime and less like an external container.
Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. On this issue, we need to be clear about what sense of change and what sense of property we are intending. For the relational theory, the term “property” is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. Then the world’s chlorophyll undergoes a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to this by saying that change in chlorophyll’s grue property is not a “real change” in the world’s chlorophyll. Also, the term “change” excludes second-order change (McTaggartian change). Second-order change is the unusual kind of change that A-theorists say occurs when Queen Anne’s death recedes ever farther into the past; the idea here is that this is not a “real change” in her death. First-order change is ordinary change, the kind that occurs when a leaf on Queen Anne’s grave changes state from green to brown. The term “change” may or may not be intended to exclude change in subjective relational properties such as my varying my interest in Queen Anne’s death, the idea being that this is not a “real change” in her death although it is a real change in my own mental state.
Einstein’s general theory of relativity does imply it is possible for spacetime to exist while empty of events. This empty time is permissible according to the substantival theory but not allowed by the relational theory. Yet Einstein considered himself to be a relationalist.
Substantival theories are sometimes called “absolute theories.” Unfortunately the term “absolute theory” is used in two other ways. A second sense of ” to be absolute” is to be immutable, or changeless. A third sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies there is no absolute time in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines absolute time in the sense of substantival time; Einstein believed it did, but many philosophers of science do not.
The first advocate of a relational theory of time was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change.” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b) However, the battle lines were most clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Leibniz’s principal argument against Newton is a reductio ad absurdum. Suppose Newton’s space and time were to exist. But one could then imagine a universe just like ours except with everything shifted five kilometers east and five minutes earlier. However, there would be no reason why this shifted universe does not exist and ours does. Now we have arrived at a contradiction because, if there is no reason for there to be our universe rather than the shifted universe, then we have violated Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is an understandable reason for everything being the way it is. So, by reductio ad absurdum, Newton’s substantival space and time do not exist. In short, the trouble with Newton’s theory is that it leads to too many unnecessary possibilities.
Newton offered this two-part response: (1) Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason regarding the rational intelligibility of the universe, but there do not have to be knowable reasons for humans; God might have had His own sufficient reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. (2) The bucket thought-experiment shows that acceleration relative to absolute space is detectable; thus absolute space is real, and if absolute space is real, so is absolute time. Here’s how to detect absolute space. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, and let it come to equilibrium. Notice that there is no relative motion between the bucket and the water, and in this case the water surface is flat. Now spin the bucket, and keep doing this until the angular velocity of the water and the bucket are the same. In this second case there is again no relative motion between the bucket and the water, but now the water surface is concave. So spinning makes a difference, but how can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the surface? It can not, says Newton. When the bucket and water are spinning, what are they spinning relative to? Because we can disregard the rest of the environment including the tree and rope, says Newton, the only explanation of the difference in surface shape between the non-spinning case and the spinning case is that when it is not spinning there is no motion relative to space, but when it is spinning there is motion relative to a third thing, space itself, and space itself is acting upon the water surface to make it concave. Alternatively expressed, the key idea is that the presence of centrifugal force is a sign of rotation relative to absolute space. Leibniz had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.
One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in either case. However, we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory is better than the relational theory.
Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, Berkeley, and Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the “fixed” stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. In the 20th century, Hans Reichenbach and the early Einstein declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory, in large part because a Newtonian absolute space would be undetectable. Special relativity, they also said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect. And the response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that, if you hold the bucket still but spin the background stars in the environment, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface—so the bucket thought experiment does not require absolute space.
Although it was initially believed by Einstein and Reichenbach that relativity theory supported Mach regarding the bucket experiment and the absence of absolute space, this belief is controversial. Many philosophers argue that Reichenbach and the early Einstein have been overstating the amount of metaphysics that can be extracted from the physics. There is substantival in the sense of independent of reference frame and substantival in the sense of independent of events. Isn’t only the first sense ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether? The critics admit that general relativity does show that the curvature of spacetime is affected by the distribution of matter, so today it is no longer plausible for a substantivalist to assert that the “container” is independent of the behavior of the matter it contains. But, so they argue, general relativity does not rule out a more sophisticated substantival theory in which spacetime exists even if it is empty and in which two empty universes could differ in the curvature of their spacetime. For this reason, by the end of the 20th century, substantival theories had gained some ground.
In 1969, Sydney Shoemaker presented an argument attempting to establish the understandability of time existing without change, as Newton’s absolutism requires. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years, that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years, all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. Note that even if Shoemaker’s scenario successfully shows that the notion of empty time is understandable, it does not show that empty time actually exists. If we accept that empty time occasionally exists, then someone who claims the tick of the clock lasts one second could be challenged by a skeptic who says perhaps empty time periods occur randomly and this supposed one-second duration contains three changeless intervals each lasting one billion years, so the duration is really three billion and one second rather than one second. However, we usually prefer the simpler of two competing hypotheses.
Empty time isn’t directly detectable by those who are frozen, but it may be indirectly detectable, perhaps in the manner described by Shoemaker or by signs in advance of the freeze:
Suppose that immediately prior to the beginning of a local freeze there is a period of “sluggishness” during which the inhabitants of the region find that it makes more than the usual amount of effort for them to move the limbs of their bodies, and we can suppose that the length of this period of sluggishness is found to be correlated with the length of the freeze. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 374)
Is the ending of the freeze causeless, or does something cause the freeze to end? Perhaps the empty time itself causes the freeze to end. Yet if a period of empty time, a period of “mere” passage of time, is somehow able to cause something, then, argues Ruth Barcan Marcus, it is not clear that empty time can be dismissed as not being genuine change. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 380)
Time seems to flow or pass in the sense that future events become present events and then become past events, just like a runner who passes us by and then recedes farther and farther from us. In 1938, the philosopher George Santayana offered this description of the flow of time: “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” Time seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does flow. Is the flow objectively real? The dispute is related to the dispute about whether McTaggart’s A-series or B-series is more fundamental.
In 1908, the philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time by placing them into a series according to the times at which they occur. But this ordering can be created in two ways, an A way and a B way. Consider two past events a and b, in which b is the most recent of the two. In McTaggart’s B-series, event a happens before event b in the series because the time of occurrence of event a is less than the time of occurrence of event b. But when ordering the same events into McTaggart’s A-series, event a happens before event b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b. Both series produce exactly the same ordering of events. Here is a picture of the ordering. c is another event that happens after a and b.
There are many other events that are located within the series at event a‘s location, namely all events simultaneous with event a. If we were to consider an instant of time to be a set of simultaneous events, then instants of time are also linearly ordered into an A-series and a B-series. McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical [for reasons that will not be explored in this article], but McTaggart also believed the A-properties such as being past are essential to our current concept of time, so for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent.
Let’s suppose, in our reference frame, that event c occurs in our present after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it is what tells us to place c to the right of b. That information is not used to create the B-series.
Metaphysicians dispute whether the A-theory or instead the B-theory is the correct theory of reality. The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) Time is constituted by an A-series in which any event’s being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective property of the event itself and not merely a subjective relation between the event and us who exist. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:
Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes…. But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.
This special change is called secondary change and also McTaggartian change.
The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental, and McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically basic or ultimately real. The B-theory implies that an event’s property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is merely a subjective property of the event because, when analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Here is how it is subjective. Queen Anne’s death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past as opposed to, say, Aristotle’s past or Napoleon’s past; and it occurs in our past rather than our present or future because it occurs at a time that is less than the time of occurrence of some event that we (rather than Aristotle or Napoleon) would say is occurring. The B-theory is committed to there being no objective distinction among past, present and future. Both the A-theory and B-theory agree, however, that it would be a mistake to say of some event that it happens on a certain date but then later it fails to happen on that date.
When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of A-facts and B-facts, of A-terms and B-terms, of A-properties and B-properties, and of A-statements and B-statements. Typical B-series terms are “earlier than,” “happens twenty-three minutes after,” and “is simultaneous with.” Typical A-series terms are “near future,” “happened twenty-three minutes ago,” and “present.” The B-series terms name distinctively B-properties. The A-series terms name distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that a occurred about an hour ago is transitory. The A-statement “Event a occurred about an hour ago” will, if true, soon become false. The B-statement “Event a occurs before b” will, if true, never become false. The A-theory says A-facts are basically what make A-statements be true and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist appeals instead to B-facts. According to the B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says “It began snowing twenty-three minutes ago,” what really makes it true isn’t some A-fact; what makes it true is that the event of uttering the sentence occurs twenty-three minutes after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that “occurs … after” is a B-term.
There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is a myth or else is merely subjective. Often theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory while theory B is called the static theory or B-theory.
The static theory implies that the flow is an illusion, the product of a faulty metaphor. Time exists, things change, but time does not change by flowing. The present does not move. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience. There is some objective feature of our brains that causes us to believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the fact that we have different perceptions at different times and the fact that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences; but the flow itself is not objective. This kind of theory of time’s flow is often characterized as a myth-of-passage theory. The myth-of-passage theory is more likely to be adopted by those who believe in McTaggart’s B-theory. One argument offered in favor of the myth-of-passage theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly. One second divided by one second is the number one. That’s not a coherent rate. There are other arguments, but these won’t be explored here.
Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term “flow.” This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. That is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers normally use when debating the objectivity of time’s flow. There is another uncontroversial sense of flow—when physicists say that time flows differently for the two twins in Einstein’s twin paradox. All they mean here is that time is different in different reference frames that are moving relative to each other; they need not be promoting the dynamic theory over the static theory.
Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction from the past to the future. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time’s flow.
There is no doubt that time seems to pass, so a B-theorist might say the flow is subjectively real but not objectively real. There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the critics of the dynamic theories, that causes us to mistakenly believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences, but the flow itself is not objectively real.
According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective, a feature of our mind-independent reality. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart’s A-series is a fundamental feature of time but his B-series is not.
One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing; they change from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart’s second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times.
A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as “temporal becoming.”
Opponents of these two dynamic theories complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. For example, saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change from present to past or from indeterminate to determinate. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”
A third dynamic theory says time’s flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but, unlike the first two dynamic theories, there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism.
A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences (or of propositions). For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false on today’s sunny day. That’s an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it can not have a truth value, it can not change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value, the sentence with the temp0ral indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2007, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2007 in Sacramento, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time so they do not underlie any flow of time. Fully-described events do not change their properties and so time does not flow because complete or “eternal” sentences do not change their truth values.
Another dynamic theory is promoted by advocates of the B-theory of time and the block universe, who add to the block a flowing present which “spotlights” the block at a particular slice at any time. This is often called the moving spotlight view.
John Norton (Norton, 2010) argues that time’s flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour.” (Maudlin, 2007, p. 112)
Regardless of how we analyze the metaphor of time’s flow, we also need to analyze the metaphor of time’s having a direction—the arrow of time.
Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided into three camps on the question of the reality of the past, present, and future. Camp 1: The presentist thinks this way: If something is real, then it is real now; all and only things that exist now are real. The presentist maintains that the past and the future are not real, and that only the present is real, so if a statement about the past is true, this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus and A. N. Prior were presentists.
Camp 2: Advocates of a growing-past argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, Richard Jeffrey and Michael Tooley have defended this view. They claim the past and present are real, but the future is not real. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam, 1967), p. 244 for commentary.
Camp 3: Opposing both presentism and the growing-past theory, Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich object to assigning special ontological status to the present or the past. Advocates of this third camp say there is no objective ontological difference among the past, the present, and the future, just as there is no objective ontological difference among here, there, and far. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. This third camp or third ontology of time is called the eternalist theory. It is also called the block universe theory because eternalists normally regard reality as a single block of spacetime with its time slices (planes of simultaneous events) ordered by the temporally-before relation. It is mental perspectives only that divide the block into a past part, a present part, and a future part. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. William James coined the term “block universe.” The growing-past theory is also called the growing-block theory. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large. On the block theory, time is like a very special extra dimension of space, as in a Minkowski diagram, so the block theory is also said to promote the spatialization of time. This theory says events do not change merely by receding into the past. Because the block doesn’t change, the eternalist theory is called the “static theory of time.” McTaggart’s A-theory is consistent with any of the three camps, but the B-theory is consistent only with the eternalist theory.
One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. For example, what makes it true that U. S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated? Is it only some feature of the present, of the way things are now? Another issue is that the presentist must account for causation, for April showers causing May flowers. Some presentists argue that true propositions about the past are made true only by the way things are in the present; other presentists argue that the true propositions about the past are made true by abstract times, objects, events, persons, and so forth. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in Markosian, 2003.
The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past will usually unite in opposition to the block universe theory on three grounds: (i) the present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than is any other time. (ii) the block theory misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the block universe there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already, but we know this is incorrect. (iii) The present moves in the sense that which particular moment is the present moment changes by gaining or losing its property of being present.
The counter from the defenders of the block universe is that, regarding (i), the now is significant but not objectively real. Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block.
The advocates of the block universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block universe can make sense of the theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future, yet this implies that advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists, the advocates of the block theory. Two key assumptions of the block theory here are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other. Opponents of the block universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present should be considered part of objective reality. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam, 1967) and (Saunders, 2002).
Some philosophers claim that the three camps are basically just disagreeing about what the word “exist” means.
A calendar does not tell us which day is the present day. All philosophers agree that we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:
In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)
The debate about whether the present is objectively real is intimately related to the metaphysical dispute between McTaggart’s A-theory and B-theory. The B-theory implies that the present is mind-dependent whereas the A-theory does not. The principal argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so vivid to everyone; the present stands out specially among all times. If science doesn’t explain this vividness, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn’t that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. Notice all the present-tensed terminology in the English language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.
One criticism of the first argument, the argument from vividness, is that even if the argument from direct sense of the now worked for the now here, it does not work for the now there. What is happening now on the moon is not vivid. Yet the now is supposed to extend across all of space, isn’t it? We can directly tell that we are here rather than there, but we don’t conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. We don’t print “here” on maps (except perhaps on maps that can’t be moved), and we don’t print “now” on clock faces. A second criticism of the first argument regarding vividness points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists which show that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us across the dinner table; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.
Proponents of the subjectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases “the present” and “now” as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered or written by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. The main positive argument for subjectivity appeals to the relativity of simultaneity, a feature of the theory of relativity. The argument points out that in the special theory of special relativity there is a block of space-time in which past events are separated from future events by a plane or “time slice” of simultaneous, presently-occurring instantaneous events, but this time slice is different in different reference frames. For example, take a reference frame in which you and I are not moving relative to each other; then we will easily agree on what is happening now—that is, on the ‘now’ slice of spacetime—because our clocks tick at the same rate. Not so for someone moving relative to us. If that other person is far enough away from us and moving fast enough away from us, then that person might truly say that Beethoven’s death is occurring now. Yet if that person were moving rapidly towards us, they might truly say that our future death is happening now. Because an objective present should not be frame relative, the proponent of an objective now must select one of these different planes of simultaneous events as being “what’s really happening now,” but surely any such choice is just arbitrary, or so Einstein would say. Therefore, if we aren’t going to reject Einstein’s interpretation of his theory of special relativity, then we should reject the objectivity of the now.
There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God knows what time it is, then God must always be changing, yet if so then there is an incompatibility between God’s being omniscient and God’s being immutable.
Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional objects. The more familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually said to persist by enduring through time. Most advocates of the block universe theory endorse perduring objects and not enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. Considering time to be analogous to a space dimension with events, processes and all other objects being four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block universe, the perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of temporal parts (also called temporal stages and temporal slices). For example, a middle-aged man can be considered to be a perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his many temporal parts.
One argument in favor of the theory of 4-dimensional perduring objects is that it more easily solves the Heraclitus paradox of our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken. The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken because it has trouble saying what about the river stays the same. We don’t step into two different rivers, do we? The entire river exists at the time of our first step and the entire river exists at the time of our second step, and these two rivers are the same river, yet the two rivers seem to have different properties; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties.
A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus paradox is that you can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts (or river stages) of the same 4-d river. Similarly, you cannot see a football game at a moment; you can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-d game. According to David Lewis, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. Here is another example from Lewis. I am a persisting thing with my shape being one of my intrinsic properties. I can be bent at one time by sitting, then stand up and be straight at a later time. Strictly speaking, I myself don’t have a shape, but I change shape because one temporal part of me has a bent shape, and a later temporal part of me has a straight shape. There is something that stays the same throughout the change, namely the perduring object that is me. This object is the sum of a series of temporal parts from my birth to my death. So the perdurance theory solves the problem of temporary intrinsics by incorporating time into the 4-d object. [Strictly speaking, in relativity theory, shape is relative to reference frame .]
The endurance theory solves the problem of temporary intrinsics very differently. The advocate of endurance who accepts the reality of the past and future usually will say we don’t have the contrary properties of sitting-bent and standing-straight but rather have the non-contrary properties of sitting-bent-at-one-time and standing-straight-at-another-time. So, this endurance theory appeals to time-indexed properties, which is clearly a move away from common sense, and it appeals to the fact that objects don’t really change these properties, which is also a move away from the common sense belief that changing objects do gain and lose properties, yet the main attraction of the endurance theory is its being close to common sense.
The perdurance theory’s solution to the problem of temporary intrinsics also faces a challenge. “It violates a plausible principle about change, that an object that changes shape must itself have a shape simpliciter.” (Sider 2000, p. 445) In short, it is counterintuitive that I don’t myself have a shape yet my shape changes. To avoid this counterintuitive result but still retain four-dimensionalism, Sider recommends saying that ordinary objects such as chairs and people (that we often refer to, name, and quantify over) are not 4-d objects but are stages of those 4-d objects, usually their present, instantaneous 3-d stages. These present instantaneous stages are said to exdure rather than perdure. On the exdurance theory an object such as a chair exists directly only for an instant, but the chair exists indirectly at other times by having temporal counterparts that exist at those other times. I am a present stage that has, say, a bent shape because I am seated, but as I exdure I will later have a temporal counterpart that has a straight shape, and this property of being straight will be acquired when I stand up. What makes it true that it is the same me that is now sitting and will be standing? For the exdurance theory, what makes it true is that both the sitting object and the future straight object are temporal counterparts of the one 4-d object that is the sum of all the temporal counterparts. This 4-d object is what the perdurantists unfortunately have to say is me, says Sider.
The ontological question is to decide which one, if any, of the following three camps is correct, or whether some combination is correct. The endurantist says 3-d objects are the basic ontological objects. The perdurantist says 4-d objects are basic, and ordinary objects such as chairs and people are more properly analyzed as being 4-d objects that perdure. The exdurantist says 4-d objects are basic; but ordinary objects such as chairs and people are really 3-d objects that exdure. Do objects persist by enduring or perduring or exduring, or does this depend on the object, or instead should we go back and tinker with Leibniz’s Law?
The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past. The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur.
Suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block universe argue that, if so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a tenseless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false. If so, the sentence cannot have any other value such as “indeterminate” or “neither true or false now.” Many other philosophers, following a suggestion from Aristotle, argue that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.
The principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.
This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.
Second, according to the compatibilist, your choices affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions are different, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.
A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:
There will be a sea battle tomorrow.
If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.
So, we should wake up the admiral.
Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so Aristotle’s position is implausible.
In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument claim that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.
Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as “now” and “tomorrow” because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.
Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.
Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. For example, the Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages do not have any tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs but also in other ways, such as with the adverbial time phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” and with the adjective phrases “brand-new” and “ancient,” and with the prepositions “until” and “since.” Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in the past, in the present, or in the future.
There are two principal answers or theories. One is that tense distinctions represent objective features of reality that are not captured by the popular block universe approach. Tenses are the same as positions in McTaggart‘s A-series, so this answer is said to “take tense seriously” and is called the tensed theory of time, or the A-theory. A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that tenses are merely subjective features of the perspective from which the speaking subject views the universe. Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way not of locating an event in the A-series but rather locating the event in time relative to the time that the verb is uttered or written. Actually this philosophical disagreement is not just about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather is also about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, pastness independent of the event’s relation to us and our temporal location?
On the tenseless theory of time, or the B-theory, whether the death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s relation to the death event (Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana?); similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective (Is it now 1876 for the speaker?). The proponent of the tenseless view does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will say it should be analyzed in terms of talk about the speaker’s relation to events. My assertion that the event of Custer’s death occurred in the past might be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that Custer’s death event happens before the event of my writing this sentence. This latter assertion does not explicitly use the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense is an extraneous and eliminable feature of language, as is all use of the terminology of the A-series.
This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true. For the purposes of explaining this dispute, let us uncritically accept the Correspondence Theory of Truth and apply it to the following sentence:
Custer died in Montana.
If we apply the Correspondence Theory directly to this sentence, then the tensed theory or A-theory implies
The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tensed fact that Custer died in Montana.
The old tenseless theory or B-theory, created by Bertrand Russell (1915), would give a different analysis without tensed facts. It would say that the Correspondence Theory should be applied only to the result of first analyzing away tensed sentences into equivalent sentences that do not use tenses. Proponents of this classical tenseless theory prefer to analyze our sentence “Custer died in Montana” as having the same meaning as the following “eternal” sentence:
There is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the writing of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
In this analysis, the verb dies is logically tenseless (although grammatically it is in the present tense just like the “is” in “7 plus 5 is 12″). Applying the Correspondence Theory to this new sentence then yields:
The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tenseless fact that there is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the utterance (or writing) of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
This Russell-like analysis is less straight-forward than the analysis offered by the tensed theory, but it does not use tensed facts.
This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never uttered or written by anyone. There are other challenges. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to analyze it as, say, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical still needs analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.
(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,
one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).
D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak, but claim it is not important for describing temporal, extra-linguistic reality. They advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.] According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, “It is now midnight,” then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of “It is now midnight” are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it’s true because it’s uttered at the same time as the event it is about. Notice that no tensed facts were appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions. Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory could say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over.” I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I’d be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Notice that appeal to tensed terminology was removed in that explanation.
In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences: that one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. Understanding a declarative sentence’s truth conditions and its truth implications and how it behaves in a network of inferences is what we understand whenever we know the meaning of the sentence. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist. To summarize, tensed facts were presumed to be needed to account for the truth of tensed talk; but the new B-theory analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The theory concludes that we should not take seriously metaphysical tenses with their tensed facts because they are not needed for describing the objective features of the extra-linguistic world. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.
Time’s arrow is revealed in the way processes tend to go over time, and that way is the direction toward disarray, the direction toward equilibrium, the direction toward higher entropy. Egg processes always go from unbroken eggs to omelets, never from omelets to unbroken eggs. Coffee mixing always goes from black coffee and cream toward brown coffee. You can’t unmix brown coffee. We can ring a bell but never un-ring it. The arrow of a physical process is the way it normally goes, the way it normally unfolds through time. If a process goes only one-way, we call it an irreversible process; otherwise it is reversible. (Strictly speaking, a reversible process is one that is reversed by an infinitesimal change of its surrounding conditions, but we can overlook this fine point because of the general level of the present discussion.) The amalgamation of the universe’s irreversible processes produces the cosmic arrow of time, the master arrow. Usually this arrow is what is meant when one speaks of time’s arrow. So, time’s arrow indicates directed processes in time, and the arrow may or may not have anything to do with the flow of time.
How to explain the arrow is still an open question in science and philosophy. For example, if time’s arrow is not simply “revealed” in the way processes tend to go over time, but instead is defined to be identical to the way processes tend to go over time, then time gets reversed if the whole universe happens to become more orderly but isn’t reversed if any particular subsystem of the universe happens to reverse. To some philosophers, this is an unacceptable consequence.
Because so many of the physical processes that we commonly observe do have an arrow, you might think that an inspection of the basic micro-physical laws would readily reveal time’s arrow. It will not. With some exceptions, such as the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function and the decay of a B meson, all the basic laws of fundamental processes are time symmetric. This means that if a certain process is allowed by the laws, then that process reversed in time is also allowed. Maxwell’s equations of electromagnetism, for example, can be used to predict that television signals can exist, but these equations do not tell us whether those signals arrive before or arrive after they are transmitted. In other words, the basic laws of science do not by themselves imply an arrow of time. Something else must tell us why television signals are emitted from, but not absorbed into, TV antennas and why omelets don’t turn into whole, unbroken eggs.
There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us (1) why time has an arrow; (2) why the basic laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (3) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (4) why the arrow is apparent in macro processes but not micro processes; (5) why the entropy of a closed system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (6) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (7) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (8) what the relationships are among the various more specific arrows of time—the various kinds of temporally asymmetric processes such as a B meson decay [the B-meson arrow], the collapse of the wave function [the quantum mechanical arrow], entropy increases [the thermodynamic arrow], causes preceding their effects [the causal arrow], light radiating away from hot objects rather than converging into them [the electromagnetic arrow], and our knowing the past more easily than the future [the knowledge arrow].
There are three principal explanations of the arrow: (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of the universe, (ii) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to some as yet unknown asymmetrical laws of nature, (iii) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical. Leibniz first proposed (iii), the so-called causal theory of time’s order, but 21st century physicists generally favor (i). They say the most likely explanation of the emergence of an arrow of time in a world with time-blind basic laws is that the arrow is a product of the direction of entropy change, and this directedness of entropy change is due to, among other things, the low-entropy state of the universe at the time of the Big Bang. Unfortunately there is no known explanation of why the entropy was so low at the time of the Big Bang. Some say the initially low entropy is just a brute fact with no more fundamental explanation. Others say it is due to as yet undiscovered basic laws that are time-asymmetric. And still others say it must be the product of the way the universe was before the Big Bang.
There are many useful definitions of entropy. On one definition, it is a measure inversely related to the energy available for work in a physical system. According to another definition, the entropy of a physical system that is isolated from external influences is a measure [specifically, the logarithm] of how many microstates are macroscopically indistinguishable. Less formally, entropy is a measure of how disordered or “messy” or “run down” a closed system is. More entropy implies more disorganization. Changes toward disorganization are so much more frequent than changes toward more organization because there are so many more ways for a closed system to be disorganized than for it to be organized. For example, there are so many more ways for the air molecules in an otherwise empty room to be scattered randomly over the room than there are ways for there to be a concentration of air within a sphere near the floor while the rest of the room is a vacuum. According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, which is not one of our basic laws of science, entropy in an isolated system or region never decreases in the future and almost always increases toward a state of equilibrium. Said more simply, the change in entropy of a system that is not yet in equilibrium is a one-way street toward greater disorganization and less useful forms of energy. For example, when a car burns gasoline, the entropy increase is evident in the fact that the new heat energy distributed throughout the byproducts of the gasoline combustion is much less useful than was the potential chemical energy in the pre-combustion gasoline. The entropy of our universe, conceived of as the largest isolated system, has been increasing for the last 13.8 billion years and will continue to do so for a very long time. At the time of the Big Bang, our universe was in a highly organized, low-entropy, non-equilibrium state, and it has been running down and getting more disorganized ever since. This running down is the cosmic arrow of time.
According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, if an isolated system is not in equilibrium and has a great many particles, then it is overwhelmingly likely that the system’s entropy will increase in the future. This 2nd law is universal but not fundamental because it apparently can be explained in terms of the behavior of the atoms making up the system. Ludwig Boltzmann was the first person to claim to have deduced the macroscopic 2nd law from reversible microscopic laws of Newtonian physics. Yet it seems too odd, said Joseph Loschmidt, that a one-way macroscopic process can be deduced from two-way microscopic processes. In 1876, Loschmidt argued that if you look at our present state (the black dot in the diagram below), then you ought to deduce from the basic laws (assuming you have no knowledge that the universe actually had lower entropy in the past) that it evolved not from a state of low entropy in the past, but from a state of higher entropy in the past, which of course is not at all what we know our past to be like. The difficulty is displayed in the diagram below.
Yet we know our universe is an isolated system by definition, and we have good observational evidence that it surely did not have high entropy in the past—at least not in the past that is between now and the Big Bang—so the actual low value of entropy in the past is puzzling. Sean Carroll (2010) offers a simple illustration of the puzzle. If you found a half-melted ice cube in an isolated glass of water (analogous to the black dot in the diagram), and all you otherwise knew about the universe is that it obeys our current, basic time-reversible laws and you knew nothing about its low entropy past, then you’d infer, not surprisingly, that the ice cube would melt into a liquid in the future (solid green line). But, more surprisingly, you also would infer that your glass evolved from a state of liquid water (dashed red line). You would not infer that the present half-melted state evolved from a state where the glass had a solid ice cube in it (dashed green line). To infer the solid cube you would need to appeal to your empirical experience of how processes are working around you, but you’d not infer the solid cube if all you had to work with were the basic time-reversible laws. To solve this so-called Loschmidt Paradox for the cosmos as a whole, and to predict the dashed green line rather than the dashed red line, physicists have suggested it is necessary to adopt the Past Hypothesis—that the universe at the time of the Big Bang was in a state of very low entropy. Using this Past Hypothesis, the most probable history of the universe over the last 13.8 billion years is one in which entropy increases.
Can the Past Hypothesis be justified from other principles? Some physicists (for example, Richard Feynman) and philosophers (for example, Craig Callender) say the initial low entropy may simply be a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for the initial low entropy. Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose say we need to keep looking for basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initial low entropy and thus for time’s arrow. A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis is that perhaps a future theory of quantum gravity will provide a justification of the Hypothesis. A fourth perspective appeals to God’s having designed the Big Bang to start with low entropy. A fifth perspective appeals to the anthropic principle and the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there exist so many universes with different initial entropies, there had to be one universe like our particular universe with its initial low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy initially.
The past and future are different in many ways that reflect the arrow of time. Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:
Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we can not have some arrows reversing while others do not. For example, the collapse of the wave function is generally considered to be due to an increase in the entropy of the universe. It is well accepted that entropy increase can account for the fact that we remember the past but not the future, that effects follow causes rather than precede them, and that animals grow old and never young. However, whether all the arrows are linked is still an open question.
Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists suspect that the answer is yes, and they say it could have gone the other way if the initial conditions of the universe at the Big Bang had been different. Crudely put, if all the particles’ trajectories and charges are reversed, then the arrow of time would reverse. Here is a scenario of how it might happen. As our universe evolves closer to a point of equilibrium and very high entropy, time would lose its unidirectionality. Eventually, though, the universe could evolve away from equilibrium and perhaps it would evolve so that the directional processes we are presently familiar with would go in reverse. For example, we would get eggs from omelets very easily, but it would be too difficult to get omelets from eggs. This new era would be an era of reversed time, and there would be a vaguely defined period of non-directional time separating the two eras.
If the cosmic arrow of time were to reverse this way, perhaps our past would be re-created and lived in reverse order. This re-occurrence of the past is different than the re-living of past events via time travel. With time travel the past is re-visited in the original order, not in reverse order.
Philosophers have asked interesting questions about the reversal of time’s arrow. What does it really mean to say time reverses? Does it require entropy to decrease on average in closed systems? If time were to reverse only in some far off corner of the universe, but not in our region of the universe, would dead people there become undead, and would the people there walk backwards up steps while remembering the future? First off, would it even be possible for them to be conscious? Assuming consciousness is caused by brain processes, could there be consciousness if their nerve pulses reversed, or would this reversal destroy consciousness? Supposing the answer is that they would be conscious, would people in that far off corner appear to us to be pre-cognitive if we could communicate with them? Would the feeling of being conscious be different for time-reversed people? [Here is one suggestion. There is one direction of time they would remember and call “the past,” and it would be when the entropy is lower. That is just as it is for us who do not experience time-reversal.] Consider communication between us and the inhabitants of that far off time-reversed region of the universe. If we sent a signal to the time-reversed region, could our message cross the border, or would it dissolve there, or would it bounce back? If residents of the time-reversed region successfully sent a recorded film across the border to us, should we play it in the ordinary way or in reverse?
Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements (or propositions or sentences) about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart’s B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time. Let the two-argument relation B(x,y) be interpreted as “x happens before y.” Now, consider this informally valid reasoning:
Adam’s arrival at the train station happened before Bryan’s. Therefore, Bryan’s arrival at the station did not happen before Adam’s.
If we translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of events, where the individual constant ‘a’ denotes Adam’s arrival at the train station and ‘b’ denotes Bryan’s arrival at the train station, then we have:
Unfortunately, this formal reasoning is invalid. What is wrong (according to many logicians although even this answer is controversial) is that a premise is missing that states one of the principles obeyed by the B relation, namely that it is asymmetric. We need the implicit premise:
∀x∀y[B(x,y) → ~B(y,x)]
OK, by this reasoning one might want to add this principle of B being asymmetric as an axiom into our temporal logic. But in other informally valid reasoning we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. Suppose Adam arrived at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrived before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrived before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:
To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:
∀x∀y∀z [(B(x,y) & B(y,z)) → B(x,z)]
What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Logicians have offered many suggestions: that B is irreflexive, that in any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation (there are no disconnected pairs of events), that B is dense in the sense that there is an event between any two events that aren’t simultaneous, and so forth.
The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, is not to add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. Instead it is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time. Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.
Prior’s main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or “it once was that.” Let the capital letter ‘P’ represent this operator. P will operate on present-tensed propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana. If Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then he may have found a way to eliminate any ontological commitment to non-present entities such as dinosaurs while preserving the possibility of true past tense propositions such as “There were dinosaurs.”
Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.
If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then
P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)
Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.
The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,
Pp & Pq ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].
This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.
Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be
Pp ↔ ~H~p.
This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p.
A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.
It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn’t come to an end; the reason is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.
Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at a time t if and only if p is true at a time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.
The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.
The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word “is”. If the “x is resting” is represented classically as P(x), where P is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic instead as the two-argument predicate P(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property P at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable ‘t’ is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.
Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say ‘n’, to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The sentence or proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be translated into first-order temporal logic as
(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].
Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack, 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.
Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle, 1995).
The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:
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Last updated: October 11, 2013 | Originally published: August 11, 2001
Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/time/
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