Time travel is commonly defined with David Lewis’ definition: An object time travels if and only if the difference between its departure and arrival times as measured in the surrounding world does not equal the duration of the journey undergone by the object. For example, Jane is a time traveler if she travels away from home in her spaceship for one hour as measured by her own clock on the ship but travels two hours as measured by the clock back home, assuming both clocks are functioning properly.
Before the twentieth century, scientists and philosophers rarely investigated time travel, but now it is an exciting and deeply studied topic. There are investigations into travel to the future and travel to the past, although travel to the past is more problematical and receives more attention. There are also investigations of the logical possibility of time travel, the physical possibility of time travel, and the technological practicality of time travel. The most attention is paid to time travel that is consistent with current physical theory such as Einstein’s general theory of relativity. In science, different models of the cosmos and the laws of nature governing the universe imply different possibilities for time travel. So, theories about time travel have changed radically as the dominant cosmological theories have evolved from classical, Newtonian conceptions to modern, relativistic and quantum mechanical conceptions. Philosophers were quick to note some of the implications of the new physics for venerable issues in metaphysics: the nature of time, causation and personal identity, to name just a few. The subject continues to produce a fruitful cross-fertilization of ideas between scientists and philosophers as theorists in both fields struggle to resolve confounding paradoxes that emerge when time travel is pondered seriously. This article discusses both the scientific and philosophical issues relevant to time travel.
Table of Contents
- Time in Philosophy
- Time in Physics
- Personal Identity
- References and Further Reading
Time travel stories have been a staple of the science fiction genre for the past century. Good science fiction stories often pay homage to the fundamentals of scientific knowledge of the time. Thus, we see time travel stories of the variety typified by H. G. Wells as set within the context of a Newtonian universe: a three-dimensional Euclidean spatial manifold that changes along an inexorable arrow of time. By the early to mid-twentieth century, time travel stories evolved to take into account the features of an Einsteinian universe: a four-dimensional spacetime continuum that curves and in which time has the character of a spatial dimension (that is, there can be local variations or “warps”). More recently, time travel stories have incorporated features of quantum theory: phenomena such as superposition and entanglement suggest the possibility of parallel or many universes, many minds, or many histories. Indeed, the sometimes counter-intuitive principles and effects of quantum theory have invigorated time travel stories. Bizarre phenomena like negative energy density (the Casimir effect) lend their strangeness to the already odd character of time travel stories.
In this article, we make a distinction between time travel stories that might be possible within the canon of known physical laws and those stories that contravene or go beyond known laws. The former type of stories, which we shall call natural time travel, exploit the features or natural topology of spacetime regions. Natural time travel tends to severely constrain the activities of a time traveler and entails immense technological challenges. The latter type of stories, which we shall call Wellsian time travel, enable the time traveler more freedom and simplify the technological challenges, but at the expense of the physics. For example, in H. G. Wells’ story, the narrator is a time traveler who constructs a machine that transports him through time. The time traveler’s journey, as he experiences it, occurs over some nonzero duration of time. Also, the journey is through some different nonzero duration of time in the world. It is the latter condition that distinguishes the natural time travel story from the Wellsian time travel story. Our laws of physics do not allow travel through a nonzero duration of time in the world (in a sense that will be made clearer below). Wellsian time travel stories are mortgaged on our hope or presumption that more fundamental laws of nature are yet to be discovered beyond the current horizon of scientific knowledge. Natural time travel stories can be analyzed for consistency with known physics while Wellsian time travel stories can be analyzed for consistency with logic. Finally, time travel stories implicate themselves in a constellation of common philosophical problems. Among these philosophically related issues we will address in this article are the metaphysics of time, causality, and personal identity.
What is time travel? One standard definition is that of David Lewis’s: an object time travels iff the difference between its departure and arrival times in the surrounding world does not equal the duration of the journey undergone by the object. This definition applies to both natural and Wellsian time travel. For example, Jane might be a time traveler if she travels for one hour but arrives two hours later in the future (or two hours earlier in the past). In both types of time travel, the times experienced by a time traveler are different from the time undergone by their surrounding world.
But what do we mean by the “time” in time travel? And what do we mean by “travel” in time travel? As the definition for time travel presently stands, we need to clarify what we mean by the word “time” (see the next section). While philosophical analysis of time travel has attended mostly to the difficult issue of time, might there also be vagueness in the word “travel”? Our use of the word “travel” implies two places: an origin and a destination. “I’m going to Morocco,” means “I’m departing from my origination point here and I plan to arrive eventually in Morocco.” But when we are speaking of time travel, where exactly does a time traveler go? The time of origin is plain enough: the time of the time traveler and the time traveler’s surrounding world coincide at the beginning of the journey. But “where” does the time traveler arrive? Are we equivocating in our use of the word ‘travel’ by simply substituting a when for a where? In truth, how do we conceive of a “when”—as a place, a locale, or a region? Different scientific ontologies result in different ideas of what travel through time might be like. Also, different metaphysical concepts of time result in different ideas of what kinds of time travel are possible. It is to the issue of time in philosophy that we now turn.
How is time related to existence? Philosophy offers three primary answers to this metaphysical question: eternalism, possibilism, and presentism. The names of these views indicate the ontological status given to time. The eternalist thinks that time, correctly understood, is a fourth dimension essentially constitutive of reality together with space. All times, past, present and future, are actual times just like all points distributed in space are actual points in space. One cannot privilege any one moment in the dimension of time as “more” real than any other moment just like one cannot privilege any point in space as “more” real than any other point. The universe is thus a spacetime “block,” a view that has philosophical roots at least as far back as Parmenides. Everything is one; the appearance of things coming to be and ceasing to be, of time passing or flowing, is simply phenomenal, not real. Objects from the past and future have equal ontological status with present objects. Thus, a presently extinct individual dodo bird exists as equably as a presently existing individual house finch, and the dodo bird and the house finch exist as equably as an individual baby sparrow hatched next Saturday. Whether or not the dodo bird and the baby sparrow are present is irrelevant ontologically; they simply aren’t in our spacetime region right now. The physicist typically views the relation of time to existence in the way that the eternalist does. The life of an object in the universe can be properly shown as:
This diagram shows the spatial movement (in one dimension) of an object through time. The standard depiction of an object’s spacetime “worldline” in Special Relativity, the Minkowski diagram (see below), privileges this block view of the universe. Many Wellsian time travel stories assume the standpoint of eternalism. For example, in Wells’ The Time Machine, the narrator (the time traveler) explains: “There is no difference between Time and any of the three dimensions of Space except that our consciousness moves along it.” Eternalism fits easily into the metaphysics of time travel.
The second view is possibilism, also known as the “growing block” or “growing universe” view. The possibilist thinks that the eternalist’s picture of the universe is correct except for the status of the future. The past and the present are fixed and actual; the future is only possible. Or more precisely, the future of an object holds the possibility of many different worldlines, only one of which will become actual for the object. If eternalism seems overly deterministic, eliminating indeterminacies and human free choice, then possibilism seems to retain some indeterminacy and free choice, at least as far as the future is concerned. For the possibilist, the present takes on a special significance that it does not have for the eternalist. The life of an object according to possibilism might be shown as:
This diagram shows that the object’s worldline is not yet fixed or complete. (It should be pointed out that the necessity of illustrating the time axis with a beginning and end should not be construed as an implicit claim that time itself has a beginning and end.) Some Wellsian time travel stories make use of possibilism. Stories like Back to the Future and Terminator suggest that we can change the outcome of historical events in our world, including our own personal future, through time travel. The many different possible histories of an object introduce other philosophical problems of causation and personal identity, issues that we will consider in greater depth in later sections of the article.
The third view is presentism. The presentist thinks that only temporally present objects are real. Whatever is, exists now. The past was, but exists no longer; the future will be, but does not exist yet. Objects are scattered throughout space but they are not scattered throughout time. Presentists do not think that time is a dimension in the same sense as the three spatial dimensions; they say the block universe view of the eternalists (and the intermediate view of the possibilists) gets the metaphysics of time wrong. If eternalism has its philosophical roots in Parmenides, then presentism can be understood as having its philosophical roots in Heraclitus. Presently existing things are the only actuality and only what is now is real. Each “now” is unique: “You cannot step twice into the same river; for fresh waters are ever flowing in upon you.” The life of an object according to presentism might be shown as:
Many presentists account for the continuity of time, the timelike connection of one moment to the next moment, by appealing to the present intrinsic properties of the world (Bigelow). To fully describe some of these present intrinsic properties of the world, you need past- and future-tensed truths to supervene on those properties. For example, in ordinary language we might make the claim that “George Washington camped at Valley Forge.” This sentence has an implicit claim to a timeless truth, that is, it was true 500 years ago, it was true when it was happening, it is true now, and it will be true next month. But, according to presentism, only presently existing things are real. Thus, the proper way to understand the truth of this sentence is to translate it into a more primitive form, where the tense is captured by an operator. So in our example, the truth of the sentence supervenes on the present according to the formulation “WAS(George Washington camps at Valley Forge).” In this way, presentists can describe events in the past and future as truths that supervene on the present. It is the basis for their account of persistence through time in issues like causality and personal identity.
Since the use of the term ‘time’ in our definition of time travel remains ambiguous, we may further distinguish external, or physical time from personal, or inner time (again, following Lewis). In the ordinary world, external time and one’s personal time coincide with one another. In the world of the time traveler, they do not. So, with these two senses of time, we may further clarify time travel to occur when the duration of the journey according to the personal time of the time traveler does not equal the duration of the journey in external time. Most (but not all) philosophy of time concerns external time (see the encyclopedia entry Time). For the purpose of natural time travel, we need to examine the scientific understanding of external time and how it has changed.
Newton argued that space, time and motion were absolute, that is, that the entire universe was a single, uniform inertial frame and that time passed equably throughout it according to an eternally fixed, immutable and inexorable rate, without relation to anything external. Natural time travel in the Newtonian universe is impossible; there are no attributes or topography of space or time that can be exploited for natural time travel stories. Only time travel stories that exceed the bounds of Newtonian physics are possible and scenarios described by some Wellsian time travel stories (most notably like the one Wells himself wrote) are examples of such unscientific time travel.
Several philosophers and scientists objected to the notion of absolute space, time and motion, most notably Leibniz, Berkeley and Mach. Mach rejected Newton’s implication that there was anything substantive about time: “It is utterly beyond our power to measure the changes of things by time. Quite the contrary, time is an abstraction, at which we arrive by means of the changes of things” (The Science of Mechanics, 1883). For Mach, change was more fundamental than the concept of time. We talk about time “passing” but what we’re really noticing is that things move and change around us. We find it convenient to talk as if there were some underlying flowing substance like the water of a river that carries these changes along with it. We abstract time to have a standard measuring tool by which we can quantify change. These views of Mach’s were influential for the young Albert Einstein. In 1905, Einstein published his famous paper on Special Relativity. This theory began the transformation of our understanding of space, time and motion.
The theory of Special Relativity has two defining principles: the principle of relativity and the invariance of the speed of light. Briefly, the principle of relativity states that the laws of physics are the same for any inertial observer. An observer is an inertial observer if the observer’s trajectory has a constant velocity and therefore is not under the influence of any force. The second principle is the invariance of the speed of light. All inertial observers measure the speed c of light in a vacuum as 3 x 108 m/s, regardless of their velocities relative to one another. This principle was implied in Maxwell’s equations of electromagnetism (1873) and the constancy of c was verified by the Michelson-Morley interferometer experiment (1887).
This second principle profoundly affected the model of the cosmos: the constancy of c was inconsistent with Newtonian physics. The invariance of the speed of light according to Special Relativity replaces the invariance of time and distance in the Newtonian universe. Intervals of space, like length, and intervals of time (and hence, motion) are no longer absolute quantities. Instead of speaking of an object in a particular position independently of a particular time, we now speak of an event in which position and time are inseparable. We can relate two events with a new quantity, the spacetime interval. For any pair of events, the spacetime interval is an absolute quantity (that is, has the same value) for all inertial observers. To visualize this new quantity, one constructs spacetime diagrams (Minkowski diagrams) in which an event is defined by its spatial position (usually restricted to one dimension, x) and its time (ct). Thus, a spacetime interval might be null (parallel to the trajectory of light, which, because of the y-axis units, is shown at a 45° angle), spacelike (little or no variation in time), or timelike (little or no variation in spatial position). The following figure shows a Minkowski diagram depicting the flat spacetime of Special Relativity and three different spacetime intervals, or worldlines.
What are the consequences of Special Relativity for time travel? First, we lose the common sense meaning of simultaneity. For example, the same event happens at two different times if one observer’s inertial frame is stationary relative to another observer’s inertial frame moving at some velocity. Furthermore, an observer in the stationary inertial frame may determine two events to have happened simultaneously, but an observer in the second moving inertial frame would see the same two events happening at different times. Thus, there is no universal or absolute external time; we can only speak of external time within one’s own frame of reference. The lack of simultaneity across frames of reference means that we might experience the phenomenon of time dilation. If your frame of reference is moving at some fraction of the speed of light, your external time passes more slowly than the external time in a frame of reference that is stationary relative to yours. If we imagine that someone in the stationary frame of reference could peek at a clock in your frame of reference, they would see your clock run very slowly. So in Special Relativity, we can find a kind of natural time travel. An example of Special Relativity time travel is of an astronaut who travels some distance in the universe at a velocity near the speed of light. The astronaut’s personal time elapses at the same rate it always has. He travels to his destination and then returns home to find that external time has passed there quite differently. Everyone he knew has aged more than he, or perhaps has even been dead for hundreds or thousands of years.
Such stories are physically consistent with the Einsteinian universe of Special Relativity, but of course they remain technologically beyond our present capability. Nevertheless, they are an example of a natural time travel story—adhering to the known laws of physics—which do not require exceptions to fundamental scientific principles (for example, the invariant and inviolable speed of light). But as a time travel story, they require that the time traveler also be an ordinary traveler, too, that is, that he travel some distance through space at extraordinary speeds. Furthermore, this sort of natural time traveler can only time travel into the future. (Conversely, from the perspective of those in the originating frame of reference, when the astronaut returns, they witness the effects of time travel to the past perhaps because they have a person present among them who was alive in their distant past.) So natural time travel according to Special Relativity is perhaps too limited for what we normally mean by time travel since it requires (considerable) spatial travel in order to work.
In addition, there are other limitations, not least of which is mass-energy equivalence. This principle was published by Einstein in his second paper of 1905, entitled “Does the Inertia of a Body Depend Upon Its Energy Content?” Mass-energy equivalence was implied by certain consequences of Special Relativity (other theorists later discovered that it was suggested by Maxwell’s electromagnetism theory). Mass-energy equivalence is expressed by the famous formula, E = mc2. It means that there is an energy equivalent to the mass of a particle at rest. When we harmonize mass-energy equivalence with the conservation law of energy, we find that if a mass ceases to exist, its equivalent amount of energy must appear in some form. Mass is interchangeable with energy. Now only mass-less objects, like photons, can actually move at the speed of light. They have kinetic energy but no mass energy. Indeed, all objects with mass at rest, like people and spaceships cannot, in principle, attain the speed of light. They would require an infinite amount of energy.
In Special Relativity, all inertial frames are equivalent, and while this is a useful approximation, it does not yet suggest how inertial frames are to be explained. Mach had stated that the distribution of matter determines space and time. But how? This was the question answered by Einstein in his theory of General Relativity (1916). Special Relativity is actually a subset of General Relativity. General Relativity takes into account accelerating frames of reference (that is, non-inertial frames) and thus, the phenomenon of gravity. The topography of spacetime is created by the distribution of mass. Spacetime is dynamic, it curves, and matter “tells” a region of spacetime how to curve. Likewise, the resultant geometry of a spacetime region determines the motion of matter in it.
The fundamental principle in General Relativity is the equivalence principle, which states that gravity and acceleration are two names designating the same phenomenon. If you are accelerating upwards at a rate g in an elevator located in a region of spacetime without a gravitational field, the force you would feel and the motion of objects in the elevator with you would be indistinguishable from an elevator that is stationary within a downward uniform gravitational field of magnitude g. To be more precise, there is no “force” of gravity. When we observe astronauts who are in orbit over the Earth, it is not true to say that they are in an environment with no gravity. Rather, they are in free fall within the Earth’s gravitational field. They are in a local inertial frame and thus do not feel the weight of their own mass.
One curious effect of General Relativity is that light bends when it travels near objects. This may seem strange when we remember that light has no mass. How can light be affected by gravity? Light always travels in straight lines. Light bends because the geometry of spacetime is non-Euclidean in the vicinity of any mass. The curved path of light around a massive body is only apparent; it is simply traveling a geodesic straight line. If we draw the path of an airplane traveling the shortest international route in only two dimensions (like on a flat map), the path appears curved; however, because the earth itself is curved and not flat, the shortest distance, a straight line, must always follow a geodesic path. Light travels along the straight path through the various contours of spacetime. Another curious effect of General Relativity is that gravity affects time. Imagine a uniformly accelerating frame, like a rocket during an engine burn. General Relativity predicts that, depending on one’s location in the rocket, one will measure time differently. To an observer at the bottom or back of the rocket (depending on how you want to visualize its motion), a clock at the top or front of the rocket will appear to run faster. According to the principle of equivalence, then, a clock at sea level on the Earth runs a little slower than a clock at the top of Mount Everest because the strength of the field is weaker the further you are from the center of mass.
Are natural time travel stories possible in General Relativity? Yes, they are, and some of them are quite curious. While most of spacetime seems to be flat or gently rolling contours, physicists are aware of spacetime regions with unusual and severe topologies such as rotating black holes. Black holes are entities that remain from the complete collapse of stars. Black holes are the triumph of gravity over all other forces and are predicted by a solution to Einstein’s General Relativity equations (Kerr, 1963). When they rotate, the singularity of the black hole creates a ring or torus, which might be traversable (unlike the static black hole, whose singularity would be an impenetrable point). If an intrepid astronaut were to position herself near the horizon of the rapidly spinning center of a black hole (without falling into its center and possibly being annihilated), she would be treated to a most remarkable form of time travel. In a brief period of her personal time she would witness an immensely long time span in the universe beyond the black hole horizon; her spacetime region would be so far removed from the external time of the surrounding cosmos that she conceivably could witness thousands, millions, or billions of years elapse. This is a kind of natural time travel; however, it severely restricts the activity of the astronaut/time traveler and she is limited to “travel” into the future. Are there solutions to General Relativity that allow natural time travel into the past? Yes, but unlike rotating black holes, they remain only theoretical possibilities.
Einstein’s neighbor in Princeton, Kurt Gödel, developed one such solution. In 1949, Gödel discovered that some worldlines in closed spacetime could curve so severely that they curved back onto themselves, forming a loop in spacetime. These loops are known as closed timelike curves (CTCs). If you were an object on a CTC worldline, you would eventually arrive at the same spacetime position from which you started, that is, your older self would appear at one of its own earlier spacetime points. Gödel’s CTC spacetime describes a rotating universe; thus, it is an extreme case for a CTC because it is globally intrinsic to the structure of the universe. It is not considered a realistic solution since current cosmological theory states that the universe is expanding, not rotating.
One type of spacetime region that a natural time traveler might exploit is a wormhole: two black holes whose throats are linked by a tunnel. Wormholes would connect two regions of space and two regions of time as well. Physicist Kip Thorne speculated that if one could trap one of the black holes that comprise the mouths of the wormhole it would be conceivable to transport it, preferably at speeds near the speed of light. The moving black hole would age more slowly than the stationary black hole at the other end of the wormhole because of time dilation. Eventually, the two black holes would become unsynchronized and exist in different external times. The natural time traveler could then enter the stationary black hole and emerge from the wormhole some years earlier than when he departed. Unfortunately for our time traveler, if wormholes exist naturally many scientists think that they are probably quite unstable (particularly if quantum effects are taken into account). So, any natural wormhole would require augmentation from exotic phenomena like negative energy in order to be useful as a time machine.
Another type of CTC suggested by Gott (1991) employs two infinitely long and very fast moving cosmic “strings” of extremely dense material. The atom-width strings would have to travel parallel to one another in opposite directions. As they rush past one another, they would create severely curved spacetime such that spacetime curved back on itself. The natural time traveler would be prepared to exploit these conditions at just the right moment and fly her spaceship around the two strings. If executed properly, she would return to her starting point in space but at an earlier time.
One common feature of all CTCs, whether it is the global Gödelian rotating universe or the local regions of rolled-up spacetime around a wormhole or cosmic strings, is that they are solutions to General Relativity that would describe CTCs as already built into the universe. The natural time traveler would have to seek out these structures through ordinary travel and then exploit them. So far, we are not aware of any solution to General Relativity that describes the evolution of a CTC in a spacetime region where time travel had not been possible previously; however, it is usually assumed that there are such solutions to the equations. These solutions would entail particular physical constraints. One constraint would be the creation of a singularity in a finite region of spacetime. To enter the region where time travel might be possible, one would have to cross the Cauchy horizon, the hourglass-shaped (for two crossing cosmic strings) boundary of the singularity in which the laws of physics are unknown. Were such a CTC constructed, a second constraint would limit the external time that would be accessible to the time traveler. You could not travel to a time prior to the inception date of the CTC. (For more on this sort of time travel, see Earman, Smeenk, and Wüthrich, 2002.)
Natural time travel according to General Relativity faces daunting technological challenges especially if you want to have some control over the trajectory of your worldline. One problem already mentioned is that of stability. But equally imposing is the problem of energy. Fantastic amounts of exotic matter (or structures and conditions similar to the early moments of the Big Bang, like membranes with negative tension boundary layers, or gravitational vacuum polarization) would be needed to construct and manage a usable wormhole; infinitely long tubes of hyperdense matter would be needed for cosmic strings. Despite these technological challenges, it should be pointed out that the possibility of natural time travel into the past is consistent with General Relativity. But Hawking and other physicists recognize another problem with actual time travel into the past along CTCs: maintaining a physically consistent history within causal loops (see Causation below). One advantage of some interpretations of relativistic quantum theory is that the logical requirement for a consistent history in a time travel story is seemingly avoided by postulating alternative histories (or worlds) instead of one history of the universe.
Certain aspects of quantum theory are relevant to time travel, in particular the field of quantum gravity. The fundamental forces of nature (strong nuclear force, electromagnetic force, weak nuclear force, and gravitation) have relativistic quantum descriptions; however, attempts to incorporate gravity in quantum theory have been unsuccessful to date. On the current standard model of the atom, all forces are carried by “virtual” particles called gauge bosons (corresponding to the order given above for the forces: mesons and gluons, photons, massive W and Z particles, and the hypothetical graviton). A physicist might say that the photon “carries” electromagnetic force between “real” particles. The graviton, which has eluded attempts to detect it, “carries” gravity. This particle-characterization of gravity in quantum theory is very different from Einstein’s geometrical characterization in General Relativity. Reconciling these two descriptions is a robust area of research and many hope that gravity can be understood in the same way as the other fundamental forces. This might eventually lead to the formulation of a “theory of everything.”
Scientists have proposed several interpretations of quantum theory. The central issue in interpretations of quantum theory is entanglement. When two quantum systems enter into temporary physical interaction, mutually influencing one another through known forces, and then separate, the two systems cannot be described again in the same way as when they were first brought together. Microstate and macrostate entanglement occurs when an observer measures some physical property, like spin, with some instrumentation. The rule, according to the orthodox (or Copenhagen) interpretation, is that when observed the state vector (the equation describing the entangled system) reduces or jumps from a state of superposition to one of the actually observed states. But what happens when an entangled state “collapses?” The orthodox interpretation states that we don’t know; all we can say about it is to describe the observed effects, which is what the wave equation or state vector does.
Other interpretations claim that that the state vector does not “collapse” at all. Instead, some no-collapse interpretations claim that all possible outcomes of the superposition of states become real outcomes in one way or another. In the many-worlds version of this interpretation (Everett, 1957), at each such event the universe that involves the entangled state exfoliates into identical copies of the universe, save for the values of the properties included in the formerly entangled state vector. Thus, at any given moment of “collapse” there exist two or more nearly identical universes, mutually unobservable yet equally real, that then each divide further as more and more entangled events evolve. On this view, it is conceivable that you were both born and not born, depending on which world we’re referring to; indeed, the meaning of ‘world’ becomes problematic. The many universes are collectively designated as the multiverse. There are other variations on the many-worlds interpretation, including the many minds version (Albert and Loewer, 1988) and the many histories version (Gell-Mann and Hartle, 1989); however, they all share the central claim that the state vector does not “collapse.”
Many natural time travel stories make use of these many-worlds conceptions. Some scientists and storytellers speculate that if we were able to travel through a wormhole that we would not be traversing a spacetime interval in our own universe, but instead we would be hopping from “our” universe to an alternative universe. A natural time traveler in a many-worlds universe would, upon their return trip, enter a different world history. This possibility has become quite common in Wellsian time travel stories, for example, in Back to the Future and Terminator. These types of stories suggest that through time travel we can change the outcome of historical events in our world. The idea that the history of the universe can be changed is why many of the inconsistencies with causation and personal identity arise. We now turn to these topics to examine the philosophical implications of time travel stories.
Inconsistencies and incoherence in time travel stories often result from spurious applications of causation. Causation describes the connected continuity of events that change. The nature of this relation between events, for example, whether it is objective or subjective, is a subject of debate in philosophy. But for our purposes, we need only notice that events generally appear to have causes. The distinction made between external and personal time is crucial now for the difficulties of causation in some time travel stories.
Imagine Heloise is a time traveler who travels 80 years in the past to visit Harold. They have a fight and Heloise knocks out one of Harold’s teeth. If we follow the progression of Heloise’s personal time (or of Harold’s), the story is consistent; indeed, time travel seems to have little effect upon the events described. The difficulty arises when we test the consistency of the story in external time, because it involves an earlier event being affected by a later event. The ordinary forward progress of events related to Harold 80 years ago requires a schism in the connectivity and continuity of those events to allow the entry of a later event, namely, Heloise’s time travel journey. The activity of Heloise is causally continuous with respect to her personal time but not with respect to external time (assuming that the continuity of her personal identity is not in question, as we shall discuss in the next section). With respect to external time, this story describes reversed causation, for later events produce changes in earlier events. How does the story change if Heloise is homicidal and encounters her own grandfather 80 years ago? This is a scenario many think show that time travel into the past is inconsistent and thus impossible.
Heloise despises her paternal grandfather. Heloise is homicidal and has been trained in various lethal combat techniques. Despite her relish at the thought of murdering her grandfather, time has conspired against her, for her grandfather has been dead for 30 years. As a crime investigator might say, she has motive and means, but lacks the opportunity; that is, until she fortuitously comes into the possession of a time machine. Now Heloise has the opportunity to fulfill her desire. She makes the necessary settings on the machine and plunges back into time 80 years. She emerges from the machine and begins to stalk her grandfather. He suspects nothing. She waits for the perfect moment and place to strike so that she can enjoy the full satisfaction of her hatred. At this point, we might pause to observe: “If Heloise murders her grandfather, she will have prevented him from fathering any children. That means that Heloise’s own father will not be born. And that means that Heloise will not be born. But if she never comes into existence, then how is she able to return…?” And so we have the infamous grandfather paradox. Before we examine what happens next, let’s consider the possible outcomes of her impending action.
First, let’s assume that the many-worlds hypothesis correctly describes the universe. If so, then we avoid the paradox. If Heloise succeeds in killing her grandfather before her father is conceived, then the state of the world includes quantum entanglement of the events involved in Heloise’s mind, body, surrounding objects, etc., such that when she succeeds in killing her grandfather (or willing his death just prior to the physical accomplishment of it), the universe at that moment divides into one universe in which she succeeded and a second universe in which she did not. So the paradox of causal continuity in external time does not arise; causation presumably connects events in the different universes without any inconsistency. But as we shall see in the next section this quantum interpretation trades-off a causation paradox for a personal identity paradox.
Next, let’s assume that we do not have the many-worlds quantum interpretation available to us, nor for that matter, any theory of different worlds. Can Heloise murder her grandfather? As David Lewis famously remarked, in one sense she can, and in another sense she can’t. The sense in which she can murder her grandfather refers to her ability, her willingness, and her opportunity to do so. But the sense in which she cannot murder her grandfather trumps the sense in which she can. In fact, she does not murder her grandfather because the moments of external time that have already passed are no longer separable. Assuming that events 80 years ago did not include Heloise murdering her grandfather, she cannot create another moment 80 years ago that does. A set of facts is arranged such that it is perfectly appropriate to say that, in one sense, Heloise can murder her grandfather. However, this set of facts is enclosed by the larger set of facts that include the survival of her grandfather. Were Heloise to actually succeed in carrying out her murderous desire, this larger set of facts would contain a contradiction (that her grandfather both is murdered and is not murdered 80 years ago), which is impossible. History remains consistent.
This is also related to Stephen Hawking’s view (1992). According to his so-called Chronology Protection Conjecture, he claims that the laws of physics conspire to prevent macroscopic inconsistencies like the grandfather paradox. A “Chronology Protection Agency” works through events like vacuum fluctuations or virtual particles to prevent closed trajectories of spacetime curvature in the negative direction (CTCs). If Hawking is right and many-worlds quantum interpretations are not available, then is time travel to the past still possible? Hawking’s view about consistent history then takes us to the special case of causation paradoxes: the causal loop.
A causal loop is a chain of causes that closes back on itself. A causes B, which causes C,…which causes X, which causes A, which causes B…and so on ad infinitum. This sequence of events is exploited in some natural and Wellsian time travel stories. It is a point of debate whether all time travel stories involving travel to the past include causal loops. As we have seen, causal loops can occur when extraordinary cosmic structures curve spacetime in a negative direction. Wellsian time travel stories with causal loops describe scenarios like the following one by Keller and Nelson (2001).
Jennifer, a young teenager, is visited by an old woman who materializes in her bedroom. The old woman describes intimate details that only Jennifer would know and thus convinces Jennifer to pursue a professional tennis career. Jennifer does exactly as the old woman suggested and eventually retires, successful and happy. One day she comes into the possession of a time machine and decides to use it to travel back in time so that she might try to make her teenage years happier. Jennifer travels back into the past and stands before a person she recognizes as her younger self. Jennifer begins to talk to the teenager about her hidden talents and the bright future before her as a tennis professional. At the end of their conversation, Jennifer activates the time machine and returns to her original time. We can describe the causal loop in Keller and Nelson’s story as follows. The story contained within in the causal loop is presented on the left side. At event C, the story splits, with the causal loop continuing along C1, and the exit from the loop beginning at C2. At C2, the worldline of Jennifer continues outside the causal loop events. Thus:
The events of Jennifer’s life include a causal loop: some of those events have no beginning and no end. What is the problem with the story? Each moment of the causal sequence is explicable in terms of the prior events. But where (or when) did the crucial information that Jennifer would have a successful tennis career come from originally? While each part of the causal sequence makes sense, the causal loop as a whole is surprising because it includes information ex nihilo. It is controversial whether such uncaused causes are possible. Some philosophers (for example, Mellor, 1998) think that causal loop time travel stories are impossible because causal loops are themselves impossible. They argue that time and causality must progress in the same direction. Other philosophers (for example, Horwich, 1987) argue that while causal loops are not impossible, they are highly implausible, and thus spacetime does not permit time travel into the “local” past (like one’s own life) because fantastic amounts of energy would be required. Still other philosophers (for example, Lewis) think that causal loops are possible because at least some events, like the Big Bang, appear to be events without causes, introducing information ex nihilo.
According to Hawking, causal loop stories that employ CTCs are like grandfather paradox stories. While backwards causation might be logically possible, it is not physically possible. The “Chronology Protection Agency” actively prevents them from occurring. The laws of physics conspire such that natural time travel into the past thwarts backwards or reverse causation. In closed spacetime, the Cauchy horizon of a CTC acts as an impenetrable barrier to a timelike worldline for objects. If a time traveler could travel to the past, whether or not that past included their younger self, they are prevented from interacting with the events of the past.
If causal loops are possible, then the objects may interact with the events of the past, but only in a consistent way, that is, only in a way that preserves the already established events of the past. Perhaps we could call it the CTC prime directive (see Ray Bradbury’s short story “A Sound of Thunder”). Causal loops, like any other aporia of uncaused causes, occupy the inexplicable perimeter of philosophical thought about causation. Nevertheless, causal loop stories like that of Jennifer raise another issue: personal identity.
The old Jennifer travels back in time to talk with her younger self. Are there two Jennifers or just one Jennifer at event A? At the same moment in external time, a young Jennifer and an old Jennifer are separated by a distance of a few feet. At that moment, is there one person or two? Identity theory involves the relationships between the mind and the body that attempts to show the connection between mental states and physical states (see the entry Personal Identity). It tries, for example, to describe and explain the connection (if any) between mind and the brain. For Lewis, the mental/physical distinction is crucial for explaining how a time traveler like Jennifer is one person, even when she travels back to talk with her younger self. Our cognitions change according to the requirement of causal continuity. These mental states occur in personal time. For everyday purposes, we can ignore the distinction between personal time and external time; personal time and external time coincide. But for a time traveler like Jennifer, identity is maintained only by virtue of the traveler’s personal time; their mental states continue like anyone else’s and at any given point in personal time, later mental states do not cause earlier ones.
In the case of Jennifer, it is therefore proper to say that at event A in her life, there is only one person, even though it is also true to say from an external perspective, that she has two different bodies present at event A. Lewis’s distinction between the sense in which you can and the sense in which you can’t has its coda in the subject of personal identity. In the sense of personal time, Jennifer is one person who is perceiving another person (from either Jennifer’s perspective). The older Jennifer’s materialization into the presence of the younger Jennifer is strange, to be sure, but in a time travel story, it is explicable. Regardless, in her personal time, the causal continuity of her perception (and thus mental states) is consistent. In the sense of external time, from the perspective of their surrounding world, there are two Jennifers at event A. The mental state of the younger Jennifer is not identical to the mental state of the older Jennifer. But these mental states, these stages of Jennifer’s life are not duplicates of the same stage; rather, two moments of personal time overlap at one moment of external time. So is it still proper to say that there are two of her? Lewis argues no, it is not. In the strange case of a time traveler like Jennifer, her stages are scattered in such a way that they do not connect in a continuously forward direction through external time, but they do connect continuously forward through her personal time. The time traveler who meets up with her younger self gives the appearance to an outside observer that she is two different people, but in reality, there is only one person.
The question of how objects persist through time is the subject of the endurance and perdurance debate in philosophy. An endurantist is someone who thinks that objects are wholly present at each moment of an interval of time. A perdurantist is someone who thinks that objects only have a temporal part present at each moment of an interval of time. The perdurantist claims that the identity of the whole object is identified as the sum of these temporal parts over the lifetime of the object. It seems that it is impossible for an endurantist to believe the story about Jennifer because she would have to be wholly present in two different spatial locations at the same time. The endurantist can avoid this problem by appealing to the distinction between personal time and external time. If Jennifer is wholly present at different locations “at the same time,” which kind of time do we mean? We mean external time. The endurantist can claim that two different temporal stages in her personal time just so happen to coincide because she is a time traveler at different locations at a single moment of external time. For those of us who are not time travelers, our different temporal stages are also distinct moments in external time. But in either case, whether time traveler or not, a person is wholly present at any moment of their personal time.
The perdurantist seems to have an easier way with the problem of personal identity in time travel stories. Since a person is only partially present at each moment of external time, it is readily conceivable that different temporal parts might coincide, but we still need to appeal to the distinction between personal time and external time. The two temporal parts of Jennifer’s life that occur when the young and old Jennifer meet and have a conversation are each elements among many others that in toto form the whole person.
Personal identity is especially problematic in a many-worlds hypothesis. Consider the case of Heloise and her desire to murder her grandfather. According to the many-worlds hypothesis, she travels back in time but by doing so also skips into another universe. Heloise is free to kill her grandfather because she would not be killing “her” grandfather, that is, the same grandfather that she knew about before her time travel journey. Indeed, Heloise herself may have split into two different persons. Whatever she does after she travels into the past would be consistent with the history of the alternative universe. But the question of who exactly Heloise or her grandfather is becomes problematic, especially if we assume that her actions in the different universes are physically distinct. Is Heloise the sum of her appearances in the many worlds? Or is each appearance of Heloise a unique person?
Also, see the related article Time in this Encyclopedia.
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