Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Timon (fl. 279 B.C.E.)

TimonTimon was a disciple of Pyrrho and philosopher of the sect of the Skeptics, who flourished in the reign of Ptolemy Philadelphus, about 279 BCE. and onwards. The son of Timarchus of Phlius, Timon first studied philosophy at Megara, under Stilpo, and then returned home and married. He next went to Elis with his wife, and heard Pyrrho, whose tenets he adopted. Driven from Elis by straitened circumstances, he spent some time on the Hellespont and the Propontis, and taught at Chalcedon as a sophist with such success that he acquired a fortune. He then moved to Athens, where he passed the remainder of his life, with the exception of a short residence at Thebes. He died at the age of almost ninety. Timon appears to have had an active mind, and with a quick perception of the follies of people which betrays its possessor into a spirit of universal distrust both of men and truths, so as to make him a skeptic in philosophy and a satirist in everything. His agnosticism (to use a modern term) is shown by his saying that people need only know three things -- namely, what is the nature of things, how we are related to them, and what we can gain from them. But as our knowledge of things must always be subjective and unreal, we can only live in a state of suspended judgment. He wrote numerous works both in prose and poetry. The most celebrated of his poems were the satiric compositions called silli, a word of somewhat doubtful etymology, but which undoubtedly describes metrical compositions of a character at once ludicrous and sarcastic. The invention of this species of poetry is ascribed to Xenophones of Colophon. The Silli of Timon were in three books, in the first of which he spoke in his own person, and the other two are in the form of a dialogue between the author and Xenophanes of Colophon, in which Timon proposed questions to which Xenophanes replied at length. The subject was a sarcastic account of the tenets of all philosophers, living and dead -- an unbounded field for skepticism and satire. They were in hexameter verse, and from the way in which they are mentioned by the ancient writers, as well as from the few fragments of them which have come down to us, it is evident that they were admirable productions. (Diog. Laert. ix. 12, 109-155; Euseb. Praep. Ev. xiv. p. 761).

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