Tu Weiming (1940—)

Tu Weiming (pinyin: Du Weiming) is one of the most famous Chinese Confucian thinkers of the 20th and 21st centuries. As a prominent member of the third generation of “New Confucians,” Tu stressed the significance of religiosity within Confucianism. Inspired by his teacher Mou Zongsan as well as his decades of study and teaching at Princeton University, the University of California, and Harvard University, Tu aimed to renovate and enhance Confucianism through an encounter with Western (in particular American) social theory and Christian theology. His writings about Confucianism have served as critical links between Western philosophy and religious studies and the world of modern Confucian thought. Tu asserted that Confucianism can learn something from Western modernity without losing recognition of its own heritage. By engaging in such “civilizational dialogue,” Tu hoped that different religions and cultures can learn from each other in order to develop a global ethic. From Tu’s perspective, the Confucian ideas of ren (“humaneness” or “benevolence”) and what he calls “anthropocosmic unity” can make powerful contributions to the resolution of issues facing the contemporary world.

While Tu’s particular presentation of Confucian thought has proven to be both intelligible and popular among Westerners, his use of Western religious concepts and terminology to describe Confucianism has also generated controversy in the Chinese Confucian world. In particular, the cultural hybridity and explicit spirituality that are key elements of Tu’s Confucianism have been criticized by some other contemporary Chinese Confucian thinkers, who—like modern Chinese philosophy in general—have been more influenced by nationalism and secularism than Tu. Nonetheless, Tu’s influence on contemporary Confucian philosophy cannot be overestimated, especially where its reception in the West is concerned.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Confucianism as Religious Humanism
    1. Continuity of Being
    2. Anthropocosmic Unity
  3. Selfhood as Creative Transformation
    1. Ren
    2. Li
    3. The Junzi or Profound Person
    4. Fiduciary Community and Filial Piety
    5. Embodied Knowing
      1. Cheng
      2. Fourfold Human Nature
  4. Confucianism and Modernity
    1. Critique of Confucian Tradition
    2. Critique of Western Enlightenment Thought
    3. Civilizational Dialogue
  5. Influence and Criticism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Tu was born to well-educated parents in Kunming, Yunnan Province, China in 1940. He has described the nanny who helped to care for him as uneducated, yet expressive of Confucian values in her daily words and actions. Thus, although Tu did not study the Confucian classics during his childhood, he was brought up immersed within a Confucian cultural environment. In 1949, he moved with his family to Taiwan and studied at Taipei Municipal Jianguo High School. At that time, the Taiwan government was promoting national moral education, which included a heavy emphasis on Confucianism—a subject about which the young Tu became enthusiastic. Among his teachers was Zhou Wenjie, a student of the “New Confucian” philosopher Mou Zongsan. After completing high school, Tu enrolled in Taiwan’s Tunghai University, where he studied directly with Mou as well as Mou’s fellow “New Confucian” thinker, Xu Fuguan. Tu’s undergraduate studies with Mou and Xu led to his being awarded a Harvard-Yenching Institute scholarship to study at Harvard University in the United States. Here, he completed courses taught by luminaries of Western social thought, such as the sociologists Talcott Parsons and Robert N. Bellah, and the historian of religions Wilfred Cantwell Smith, earning both an M.A. (1963) and a Ph.D. (1968) in East Asian studies. Beginning in 1967, Tu served as a faculty member in a series of prestigious U.S. universities, initially at Princeton University and later at the University of California at Berkeley, from which he went on to become a professor at Harvard University (1981-2010). As of 2016, Tu held two academic positions, serving as both the Chair Professor of Humanities and Founding Director of the Institute for Advanced Humanistic Studies at Beijing University and as Research Professor and Senior Fellow of the Asia Center at Harvard University.

2. Confucianism as Religious Humanism

Tu’s understanding of selfhood is intertwined with his understanding of religiosity. Indeed, one of the distinctive features of Tu’s Confucianism is his emphasis on the religiousness of Confucianism. Many Confucian scholars stress that Confucianism is a cultural tradition or a philosophy rather than a religion. However, Tu insists that Confucianism also involves religiosity. Unlike other religions, Confucianism is not an institutional religion; however, similar to other religions, Confucianism has its ultimate concern, which is creative self-transformation of the self. According to Tu, ethics (norms for behavior), aesthetics (theory of value), and religiosity (commitment to engagement with an ultimate concern) are inseparable from one another for Confucianism, and Chinese traditional thought in general. Thus, for Tu, being religious is equivalent to learning to be fully human. It is an infinite developmental process and the ultimate ideal is to achieve the oneness of Heaven (or Tian—the cosmic source of ethical and aesthetic values for Confucians) and humanity—in Chinese, Tianren heyi. This transformational ideal of self-cultivation is at the heart of Tu’s understanding of Confucianism as a form of religious humanism.

According to Tu, Confucian self-cultivation is a long and strenuous process; it is also a process of ceaseless creative self-transformation. What is important is one’s conscious determination to do so. In a key early work, Centrality and Commonality: an Essay on Confucian Religiousness (1989; later republished in a bilingual Chinese/English edition as Zhongyong dongjian [An Insight into Zhongyong, 2008], Tu highlights the distinction between “learning for the sake of the self” and “learning for the sake of others.” From a Confucian perspective, one’s motivation of self-cultivation should be for the sake of the self—that is, it should be seen as an intrinsic good, not undertaken for reasons that are purely external to oneself. As Tu states, “A decision to turn our attention inward to come to terms with our inner self, the true self, is the precondition for embarking on the spiritual journey of ultimate self-transformation”. Learning only for the sake of others is an inauthentic motivation, because it is driven by consideration of others’ opinions, rather than a genuine desire to cultivate oneself. However, Tu does not argue that Confucianism aims at cultivating a private ego. Rather, for Tu, Confucianism emphasizes the cultivation of a true self critically. Here, Tu sees himself as making a claim similar to the classical Confucian thinker Mencius (Mengzi), for whom the aim of knowing the true self is to recognize the inner “great body” (dati) which signifies the true self that can form a unity with Heaven, Earth and numerous other things. Thus, the ultimate aim of self-cultivation is the unity of Heaven and humans.

One important approach to recognizing the great body is to identify one’s sense of commiseration, that is, the sense of sympathy and empathy, as the unique characteristic of human nature distinguishing us from animals. To recognize the great body, as Tu understands this, also means to establish the will (lizhi), to make decisions to act in accordance with the great body. We must deliberately transcend the temptation of learning for the sake of others in order to learn for ourselves. The willingness to do this would help us to would help us to access the inexhaustible inner resources of self-transformation and to achieve a state of being truly “self-possessed” (zide) (to use Mencius’ term)—that is, the authentic way of learning to be human.

With his study of Mencius and other neo-Confucians, Tu argues that Confucianism encourages “human perfectibility through self-effort.” It means that the source of self-actualization is in humans, rather than through the mediation of some supernatural agent. It assumes that everyone possesses sufficient internal resources for ultimate self-transformation. And this assumption is further based on a Chinese cosmology that, in his Confucian Thought: Selfhood as Creative Transformation (1985), Tu calls the “continuity of being.”

a. Continuity of Being

Tu believes that the aim of unity of Heaven and humans is perceivable and realizable through self-effort because of what Confucians assume is a kind of continuity between the self, others, and Heaven and Earth, in which humans, by nature, share a certain reality of Heaven. Therefore, we are obligated to cultivate ourselves to actualize this moral ideal. Thus, Tu argues that Chinese cosmology does not reject the idea of a Creator, but that Confucianism, unlike Christianity, does reject the dichotomy of creator and creature. For Confucianism, it is inconceivable that man can be alienated from Heaven in any essential way. For this reason, Tu’s Confucian religiosity possesses no equivalent to the Christian idea of original sin and divine grace.

According to Tu, within Chinese culture the cosmos is perceived as an unfolding of all-embracing continuous creativity in which all modalities are organically connected. It consists of a dynamic energy field in which all parts of the cosmos mutually interact in a “spontaneously self-generating life process.” While the nature of the cosmic is impersonal, it is not inhuman. It is impartial to all modalities of being, and rejects a kind of anthropocentrism. While human beings are part of this, our minds and consciousness make us unique in that we are able to probe “the transcendental anchorage of our nature,” and to achieve “sympathetic accord with the myriad things in nature.” This sense of continuity of being also gives a sense of deep awe towards nature and Heaven within Chinese culture, an aspiration to sustain harmony with nature. Thus, Tu argues, self-knowledge is both a necessary and sufficient condition of knowing the Way (Dao), that is, the way of actualization of authentic human nature. As humans are endowed by Heaven with the “centrality” of the universe—the most refined quality of the universe—Heaven sends humans on the mission of transforming the cosmos into its actualization.

It is important to note that here Tu is taking liberties with the English translation of the Chinese phrase zhongyong, the title of one of the “Four Books” of classical Confucianism, often rendered as “doctrine of the mean” in scholarship prior to Tu’s work on the text. Instead, Tu understands zhong as “centrality” and yong as “commonality.”

“Centrality” denotes the most refined and irreducible quality inherent in human beings. Therefore, the way that comes from “centrality” cannot be separated from us. It is an ontological condition of being, in which one’s mind is unperturbed by external forces. According to ancient Chinese thought, human beings have embodied the centrality of Heaven and Earth. Therefore, human beings are united with Heaven and Earth by inherent centrality. Centrality is a state of the self in which emotions are not yet aroused. When our emotions are aroused to the due measure, it is called harmony. Thus, while centrality is the great foundation of the universe, harmony is an appropriate, unfolding expression of the inner self. Tu reminds us that although the great foundation is inherent in human beings, it does not guarantee that everyone can attain the harmonious state. It is a heavy burden and a long road to attain centrality and harmony; one needs the determination of self-cultivation. By “commonality,” Tu means activities that are ordinary and common, such as eating and walking, which are deployed to describe the Way in Zhongyong. Thus, Tu emphasizes, human beings must accept their embeddedness in the world as the condition of self-transcendence. As the Way (Dao) is inseparable from our ordinary life, we must realize our humanity through our ordinary daily existence. It is tantamount to fulfilling our Heavenly-ordained mission.

b. Anthropocosmic Unity

For Tu, the Heaven-human relationship is not simply that of creator and creature, but “one of mutual fidelity; and the only way for man to know Heaven is to penetrate deeply into his own ground of being.” Thus, Tu argues, the ideal of the Heaven-human relationship is neither theocentric (God-centered or, in Confucian terms, Heaven-centered) nor anthropocentric (human-centered), but “anthropocosmic unity.” By this, Tu means that through a continuous interaction between the two, “the human way necessitates a transcendent anchorage for the existence of man and an immanent confirmation for the course of Heaven.” Because of the mutuality of Heaven and humans, the Confucian Heaven-human relationship is also a kind of “transcendent as immanent.”

From the above analysis, we can see that Confucian religiousness involves three interrelated dimensions: (1) the self-transformation of the person, (2) the communal act of community and (3) the dialogical response to the transcendent. Confucianism aims at forming a kind of organismic unity between humans and Heaven. Thus, Tu stresses that Confucianism is a kind of “inclusive humanism” with “an anthropocosmic idea.” Unlike secular humanism, Tu’s Confucian inclusive humanism is very much concerned with the transcendent. Indeed, Tu claims that if Confucianism wants to be continuously developed it must develop its spiritual tradition in a religious form, so that it can continuously contribute to society. This is because Tu considers religiosity as that which provides human beings with a sense of deep awe towards Heaven and nature; without this sense of transcendence, human life would be shallow. Moreover, for Tu, although human beings by nature are earthbound, they have an aspiration to transcend themselves and to join with Heaven.

Given Tu’s ideas about the “continuity of being” that properly leads to the development of “anthropocosmic unity,” we can see why Tu’s thesis of “learning for the sake of the self” is not a kind of ego-centrism. As there is continuity of being between the self, the others and the cosmos, learning for the sake of the self can be said to be also for the sake of others, as well as the whole world. Furthermore, in the following section, it is explained that Tu does not reject the motivation of self-cultivation driven by our sincere feeling towards our family members. Thus, what Tu really wants to reject seems to be the motivation of “learning for the recognition from others” rather than “learning for the sake of others.”

3. Selfhood as Creative Transformation

While Tu’s Confucianism emphasizes learning for the sake of the self, it does not mean that one can learn to be fully human separated from the community. Tu asserts that people generally establish a “fruitful communication with the transcendent through communal participation.” Apart from communal participation, humans must develop a “constant dialogical relationship with Heaven” and are transformed through “a faithful dialogical response to the transcendent” in self-cultivation. For Tu, implicit in Confucian thought is a “covenant” with Heaven, for our moral duty is to achieve the highest human aspirations of forming a “trinity with Heaven and Earth” through self-realization and community-perfecting. Thus, on Tu’s account, Confucian self-cultivation is a gradual process of combining all levels of the community in the process of self-transformation, from the family to the neighborhood, clan, race, nation, world, and finally to the universe and the cosmos.

Following the work of his teacher, Bellah, Tu argues that one of the perennial human problems in modernity is individualism. In order to respond to individualism, Tu investigates the possibility of “a new vision of the self which is rooted in the reality of a shared life together with other human beings and inseparable from the truth of transcendence” (CT, 8) and his answer is “Confucian selfhood as creative transformation” (CT, 7). Tu stresses that the main concern of Confucianism is how to become a sage or how to become fully realized as an authentic human being. Confucianism believes that man is perfectible by self-effort and one has to achieve self-realization through self-cultivation.

a. Ren

Tu understands the classical Confucian term ren (benevolence or humaneness) as the highest human achievement of self-cultivation and the fullest manifestation of humanity. A man of humanity (renren), who embodies love in his daily life, represents the most authentic realization of human beings from Tu’s Confucian perspective. However, in actual practice, there is a gradual process of extension of love, and ren is most exemplified in our caring toward our relatives (qinqin). This is further discussed in the following section. For Tu, ren is primarily concerned with the self, although human relations are also crucial to it. Tu conceives ren as a concept of personal morality, as a principle of the inward process of self-fulfilment. It is not simply a personal virtue, but also a metaphysical moral mind that is, at the same time, equivalent to the cosmic mind. Thus, ren is both the moral and metaphysical foundation of self-cultivation. While we are earthbound and limited, we can also participate in the communal and divine enterprise of self-transformation, that is, to enlarge one’s humanity so that humanity as a whole shared by every human being will be enriched. The driving force of such anthropological and cosmological assumptions enable Confucianism to function as an ethico-religious system in Chinese society despite its lack of institutional religious character.

b. Li

According to Tu, li (ritual) is the externalization of ren in a specific context. Li implies the existence of human relationships. For Tu as a Confucian, the self and sociality are not separable. Society is conceived as an extended self. Confucian self-transformation must be manifested in the context of sociality. And li points to a concrete manifestation by which one enters into proper relations with others. Tu conceives li as a dynamic process of humanization. It is a process of individual development from (1) cultivating personal life to (2) regulating familial relations, and then (3) ordering the social affairs, before finally (4) bringing peace to the world. It assumes forms of integration between personality, family, state, and the world. Thus, for Tu, Confucian self-cultivation is a gradual process of inclusion. Without li, there would be a lack of a concrete manifestation of ren. However, without ren as the internal basis, li could become coercive and distort human nature. While ren denotes metaphysical reality, li means the standard of this world. Thus, Tu argues, there is a creative tension about Confucian concepts of ren and li, and it is important to seek the balance between ren and li in a dynamic process.

c. The Junzi or Profound Person

Just as with the phrase zhongyong, in another case Tu uses license in translating a classical Confucian term. Junzi, which typically is rendered as “gentleman” or “superior person” in other English-language scholarship, becomes “profound person” in Tu’s usage of the term. This translation shows Tu’s particular concern regarding the inner nature of morally superior persons. Basically, junzi is the paradigmatic model of Confucian personality. For Tu, self-knowledge of the profound person is deeper than that of average people. As the Way (Dao) is inherited in human nature, the actualization of the Way very much depends on our self-knowledge. While the Way is deeply rooted in Heaven-endowed human nature, it is manifested in ordinary life. Thus, the profound person must be sensitive to one’s interiority through which true humanity is manifested as the Way. However, following Confucian tradition, Tu claims that only a few have the inner strength to fully actualize what is inherent in them.

To be a profound person means that one can be (1) sensitive to the outside world, (2) at ease with oneself and (3) courageous. The important way of self-cultivation to achieve self-knowledge is “vigilant solitariness” (shentu) or “self-watchfulness when alone,” that is, a kind of continuous vigilance on one’s own. It is “a process toward an ever-deepening subjectivity.” On the one hand, through continuous critical self-examination, one is sensitive to the subtle manifestation of one’s inner feelings. On the other hand, by such inner penetration of the self, one is able to reach the reality underlying common humanity and to realize the true nature of human-relatedness. Tu argues that in practising vigilant solitariness, one can hear one’s authentic self as expressing the quality of Heaven-ordained nature. As our innermost core is common to all human beings, our self-understanding of Heaven-ordained nature would help us to know the “great foundation” (tapen) of the cosmos.

The uniqueness of the profound person lies in how he integrates the Way with his daily life; therefore, the way of a profound person is also understood as the common way. However, such commonness cannot be defined in terms of an abstract formula by which everyone can learn to become a profound person. Thus, while the Way is common, it is also dynamic in nature. As Tu states, “its meaning can never be fully comprehended and its potential never exhausted. There is always something ‘hidden’ in its commonness.” In the face of constantly changing social situations, a profound person can still be at peace with themselves. This is because he “rectifies himself and seeks nothing from others”, and can recognize the possibilities in his fate and bring himself into harmony with the situation. Thus, it is a kind of creative transformation not only of the self, but also of the world in the spirit of Zhongyong. Therefore, in practising vigilant solitariness, one must also be courageous in order to be truthful to oneself and to resist the temptation of seeking recognition from others as a motivation for self-cultivation. One must possess an inner strength to continue the long and strenuous task of self-cultivation at one’s own pace, undisturbed by the changing environment.

d. Fiduciary Community and Filial Piety

As the Way (Dao) starts with human-relatedness, the idea of community is also an important concern for Confucianism. For Tu, the ideal Confucian society is conceived as “a fiduciary community based on mutual trust.” Thus, the goal of politics is not simply the establishment of law and social order, but also the development of a fiduciary community through moral persuasion by rectifying the ruler's moral character as a moral leader.

The self, in the process of creative transformation, embodies the network of continuous expanding and deepening human relationships. According to Tu, the network is “a series of concentric circles” which involves different kinds of structural limitations, such as gender, race, and social background. However, through self-cultivation, the structural limitations of each circle can be transformed into an instrument of self-transcendence, and we can extend ourselves continuously to achieve unity with Heaven and Earth and other numerous things. When we have achieved unity with the most generalized commonality, we also reconfirm the centrality of the self. Tu states, “This broadening and deepening of the self can be characterized, in Mencian terminology, as the manifestation of the ‘great self’ and the concomitant dissolution of the ‘small self’.”

In Confucianism, filial piety is considered the prime virtue of the community underlying the anthropocosmic vision. With most other Confucians, Tu defines filial piety in terms of “transmission and continuity.” He understands exercising filial piety as honoring one’s parents by transmitting the wisdom and values exemplified by their parents, and continuing their unfinished tasks. The underlying idea is that their developments are indebted to the tradition, that is, the origin of their existence; thus they are responsible for transmitting the wisdom of the old and honor their forefathers in their ancestral line. As Tu points out,

The centrality of filial piety in Confucian ethics is predicated on the belief that human beings become aware of themselves by responding naturally to the loving care of those around them. Such a reciprocal response, laden with rich symbolic significance for the transmission and continuity of humanity, is seen by the Confucians as the way to provide a solid basis for personal growth: filial piety and brotherly love are roots (pen) of humanity. (C&C, 140)

Tu states that Confucians reject the idea of identity formation through isolation, because our sincere feeling towards our family members can provide motivation for our self-transformation. When we have nurtured our mind/heart to be capable of regulating our family, we will then open ourselves and transcend our egocentrism. However, familialism may degenerate into nepotism and may become a kind of structural limitation. Thus, for Tu, we have to establish meaningful relationships with people outside our familial members and transcend the nepotism of familialism. Furthermore, in order to avoid being a narrow-minded nepotist, ren must go with righteousness (yi)—that is, a sense of judgment and honoring the worthy. Thus, li is not only the externalization of ren; it also signifies a structure of yi realized in the context of human relations. It is primarily concerned with establishing an authentic way of human-relatedness.

Indeed, Tu is thoroughly Confucian insofar as he considers filial piety to be the foundation of political virtue. Traditionally, a filial son is perceived as likely to be vigilant about his personal conduct, diligent about family affairs, compassionate in regard to social obligations and, therefore, qualified for political assignments. Historically, filial sons often end up becoming loyal ministers. According to Tu, Confucianism often uses family as a metaphor for country and the world, addressing the emperor as son of Heaven, and the magistrate as the “father-mother official,” because Confucianism perceives a kind of transcendent vision implicated by familial nomenclature. It implies that the self is not egoistic; rather the enrichment of the self is through cultivating one’s relationship with the family. The emphasis of family is not equivalent to nepotism; rather it is concerned with a developmental process towards organismic unity with the country and the world. Thus, Tu claims that Confucianism perceives self-cultivation and regulation of the family as the root, and governing the country and peace of the world as the branches. And “the dichotomy of root and branch conveys the sense of a dynamic transformation from self to family, to community, to state, and to the world as a whole.” (C&C, 148).

Rituals and ceremonies (li), as manifestations of the ethico-religiosity of community, are also important elements of moral education and social solidarity. In particular, through ancestral worship, the old are respected and the dead are honored for their past contributions; their yearning for the forefathers also establishes their communal identity. Indeed, with the anthropocosmic vision, we are not only responsible to our ancestors, but also to future generations, for they will also transmit our values and continue our tasks.

It is well-known that Confucianism is very much concerned about five cardinal human relationships. According to Tu, reciprocity (shu) is the fundamental principle of five cardinal human relationships and human-environmental relationships. Reciprocity helps us to harmonize social relationships, interact sympathetically with nature and establish a dialogical relationship with Heaven. “Through reciprocity, humanity becomes interfused with the cosmic transformation and thus, as a co-creator, forms a trinity with Heaven and Earth. Humanity, in this perspective, stands as the filial son and daughter of the cosmos.” (C&C, 134).

Another important virtue is reverence toward Heaven. Tu states that filial piety and reverence toward Heaven are “parallel principles in the Confucian anthropocosmic worldview.” Both do not simply serve political purposes, but fundamentally bear a cosmological concern, that is, a concern of “bringing peace and harmony to the universe.” Thus, these two virtues attempt to establish “a pattern of mutual dependence and organismic unity” between Heaven and humans.

e. Embodied Knowing

For Tu, moral reasoning is a kind of “embodied knowing” (tizhi). Following Neo­Confucianism, Tu argues that Confucian ontology rejects Kantian metaphysics which assumes the objectivity of the moral will, excluding any emotional dimension. Tu’s Confucianism also rejects the study of humanity by means of the scientific method. Following Zhang Zai, Tu argues for the distinction between moral knowledge and empirical knowledge. While empirical knowledge derives ideas from our detached observations, moral knowledge cannot be grasped in a disengaged way. Rather, moral knowledge is a kind of bodily experiential knowledge based on reflection on one’s bodily practice and experience. Crucial to Tu’s understanding of embodied knowing are his interpretations of two key classical Confucian concepts, cheng (sincerity) and the fourfold division of human nature into body (shen), heart/mind (xin), soul (ling) and spirit (shen).

i. Cheng

Unlike Christianity, Tu points out, Confucian thought does not regard revelation as the foundation of perceiving the moral order, but rather looks to “our common experience.” In order to perceive this ultimate reality and to attain our true humanity, people must learn to be cheng, that is, to be sincere, true, and real, to our common experience. According to Zhongyong, cheng leads to enlightenment (ming). Cheng also allows us to fully realize ourselves and to understand that Heaven is inherent in human nature. Tu stresses that the possibility of being cheng is not because of divine grace; rather it is based on the idea of heavenly endowed human nature, by which the identification of human nature with reality of Heaven becomes possible. According to Tu, cheng not only means sincerity, but also authenticity. To be cheng does not only signify what a person should be in an ultimate sense, but also signifies a process of actualizing the ultimate reality in ordinary life. The program of self-cultivation that leads to the development of cheng is “a process toward an ever-deepening subjectivity” which involves “a deep penetration into one's own ground of existence” and includes and embraces others as “an integral part of one's quest for self-realization.” For this reason, says Tu, Confucianism gives enormous value to the practice of vigilant solitariness.

Ontologically speaking, the expression of the moral subject is a priori true and sincere. However, in reality, if we do not maintain the exercise of self-cultivation, we cannot be cheng enough, and the moral knowledge of the subject would finally be exhausted. This is because our moral knowledge and action are intertwined. Our bodily experiential knowledge can lead to self-transformation, that is, the enhancement of moral knowledge and the renovation of one’s disposition. Thus, for Confucianism, embodied knowing must necessarily lead to the enhancement of moral practices. The highest human achievement by moral self-cultivation is to become an authentic moral person, which is what Tu calls “renren,” that is, a man who embodies ren; such embodiment must have a concrete manifestation by the observance of rites (li).

The ultimate concern of self-cultivation is not simply about the self, but also to manifest our humanity. As human nature shares the ultimate reality of Heaven, human nature is potentially a manifestation of the reality of Heaven. The manifestation of authentic humanity implies that human beings, as co-creators, participate in the creative process of the cosmos. Tu stresses that such a process is not creation ex nihilo (out of nothing). Rather, humans are “capable of assisting the transforming and nourishing process of heaven and earth.” In short, the creative transformation of sage is derived from human inner nature by focusing on our common human experience. As Tu states, “The way of the sage therefore is centered on the commonality of human nature.”

Moreover, Tu’s vision of Confucian embodied knowing and self-cultivation is to be realized through social practice in a complicated social network. The aim of Confucian self-cultivation is not only to establish oneself, but also to establish others. Thus, our moral knowledge is not simply derived through our own self-understanding, but also by knowing others. Knowing others is not through a kind of disengaged introspection, but rather though participating in a network of mutual trust, knowing others’ dispositions and characters through dialogue and interaction with them. Thus, embodied knowing is also a kind of empathic sensual perception; it rejects the objectification of others, things or humans. And it can accommodate and integrate everything in the world, letting all these things become something that is non-objectified in our minds. Finally, as there is continuity between the being of Heaven and that of humans, embodied knowing is also related to the framework of unity and harmony between humans and Heaven (Tianren heyi). Everyone can be connected to Heaven by embodied knowing of one’s own nature.

ii. Fourfold Human Nature

Tu’s idea of embodied knowing is based on his fourfold division of human nature, perhaps better understood as four levels of subjectivity. According to Tu, the foundation of Confucian morality is an embodied person with sensitivity and emotion. It includes body (shen), heart/mind (xin), soul (ling) and spirit (shen), that is, four different levels. Our embodied knowing is an experiential knowledge based on the integration of these four different levels.

Unlike self-cultivation in some religions which are concerned about nurturing the human soul only, Confucian self-cultivation very much concerns the human body. Tu reminds us that Confucian self-cultivation literally means “nourishing the body” (xiushen). As our body includes five sense organs, Confucian teaching traditionally emphasizes nourishing our bodily senses through the Six Arts (liuyi) – the six ancient disciplines of ritual, music, archery, charioteering, calligraphy, and mathematics, which were foundational to the classical Confucian curriculum. The aim is to aestheticize human life through the practice of rituals (li) and music (yue), to cultivate one’s disposition, to facilitate one’s thinking and emotion-controlling, and finally to achieve one’s embodiment of virtues (yishen tizhi).

While our body contains sense organs, our heart/mind is a rational faculty integrating our different sensual experiences. Here, Tu is building on the Neo­Confucian interpretation of Mencius’ anthropology as the study of heart/mind (xin). Our heart/mind includes spiritual resources endowed by Heaven as the defining feature of being human. It also provides theoretical and practical foundations of our self-cultivation. The spiritual resources are four germinations (siduan) and the power of the will for self-realization. Four germinations are four kinds of universal predispositions. They are shown in our sense of (1) commiseration, (2) shame, (3) reverence, and (4) rightness and wrongness. By cultivating these four germinations, we can acquire four Confucian virtues: benevolence (ren), propriety (yi), observance of rites (li), and wisdom (zhi). By doing our best with our mind, we can extend our virtuous sense not only towards another person, but it also “flows abroad, above and beneath, like that of Heaven and Earth” (Mencius 7A:13). The power of will is what Mencius calls, “vast, flowing qi” (haoranzhiqi). This power is great and strong; it can be forever latent, but is never totally lost. If one can nourish this power with uprightness, “it will fill the space between Heaven and earth” (Mencius 2A: 2). Thus, profound persons should focus on tapping their own internal energy in the process of realizing humanity.

Apart from body and mind, there are also soul and spirit in human beings. Tu claims that the soul is the extension of the mind, a kind of awareness in the existential situation. Spirit is the state of transcendence, the ultimate goal of self-cultivation. The relation between soul and spirit is just like that of body and mind, where the former is concrete, definite, and with fixed shape, and the latter is indefinite and hardly traceable. Tu argues that we can find Confucian stages of development of self-transcendence in the Mencius. The stage from goodness to realness belongs to the ascending level from body to mind. Beauty to greatness is at the rise from the mind to the soul. Sage-spirit is about the ascending status from the soul to the spirit. Thus, one self-elevating process inevitably involves one’s embodiment through ritual practice, in which one can learn about one’s mind, and then be aware of one’s soul, and finally rise to the level of spirit. By such Confucian self-cultivation, we can experience a kind of union with the cosmos; therefore, the embodiment of virtue and a ritual-musical cultivated harmonious world can finally be ratified. Here and throughout Tu’s presentation of Confucianism, the role of religiosity in the Confucian humanistic project remains central.

4. Confucianism and Modernity

In Confucian China and its Modern Fate (1958), Joseph R. Levenson argues that due to the degeneration of feudal society which nourished Confucianism, Confucianism inevitably faded into the background of modernity. However, Tu disagrees with Levenson and criticizes Levenson’s analysis for failing to distinguish between “Confucian China” and “Confucian tradition.” For Tu, “Confucian China” denotes the politicalized Confucian ideology of traditional Chinese feudal society. However, by “Confucian tradition,” Tu means the main spirit of Confucian Chinese culture by which Chinese people traditionally have governed their lives. To a certain extent, Confucian tradition is responsible for the problem of Confucian China. However, Tu believes that as long as we can eliminate the adverse influences of Confucian China, the Confucian tradition can be revived.

In order to refute Levenson’s claims for Confucianism’s demise, Tu explores the possibility of the “third epoch” of Confucianism. Tu considers Confucianism from earliest times through the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.) as the first epoch, Neo-Confucianism from the Song (960-1279 C.E.) through the Ming (1368-1644 C.E.) dynasties as the second epoch, and Confucian thought from the May Fourth New Cultural Movement (1919 C.E.) to the present as the third epoch. Historically, the development of Confucianism occurred through dialogue and debate with other traditions in China. For Tu, the challenges to Confucianism in its third epoch come not only from Western science, democracy, psychology, and religiosity, but also from the more universal question of how Confucianism as an inclusive humanism can address the perennial human problems of the world–that is, how Confucianism can be a new philosophical anthropology for humanity as a whole. Tu is not unique in formulating contemporary Confucianism’s intellectual and spiritual situation in such terms, as similar formulations can be found in the work of his teacher, Mou, as well as the writings of Mou’s associates, Tang Junyi and Xu Fuguan. Where Tu distinguishes himself from other “New Confucians” is in his insistence that contemporary Confucians must not only (1) reflect on the past problems of traditional Confucianism, but also (2) communicate with different civilizations so that Confucian thinkers can benefit from such dialogues and thus contribute to the global world.

a. Critique of Confucian Tradition

Regarding the controversies about traditional Confucianism as it existed prior to modernity, Tu thinks that one crucial problem was its political integration with despotic regimes. He calls this kind of politicized Confucianism “Confucian China,” by which he means a conservative political ideology used by the powerful to control and oppress people, including the internalized oppression whereby Chinese minds became accustomed to rejecting any proposals for cultural change or reform. Tu’s critique thus is very much in sympathy with the May Fourth New Cultural Movement, but he argues that some May Fourth intellectuals went too far in their criticisms of Confucianism by uncritically embracing Western Enlightenment thought, which had problems of its own. Pointing out that the West has its vices and China has its virtues, culturally and intellectually speaking, Tu suggests that Chinese interaction with Western culture should be grounded in a deep understanding of the Chinese cultural heritage and a realistic awareness of the pitfalls of Western-style modernity. Finally, Tu insists that there can be different kinds of modernity; Western modernity is not the only way, especially for China.

b. Critique of Western Enlightenment Thought

Tu is very much appreciative towards values and institutions of Western modernity brought to us by the Enlightenment, values such as reason, freedom, equality, individuality, rule of law, democracy, science, and capitalism. He thinks that China can learn from these in its modernization. However, Tu criticizes Enlightenment for inducing scientism, anthropocentrism, and individualism. Anthropocentrism and scientism bring to us a kind of disenchantment and finally lead to the exploitation of nature and destruction of the environment. Anthropocentrism with the rise of capitalism also leads to the marketization of the economy, politics, academia, and education, and, what is deemed as worse by Tu, the marketization of religions. Capitalist society has been dominated by the instrumental reason which, for Tu, is disembodied, unsympathetic, and even cruel. Individualism also caused the prevalence of egocentrism and the disintegration of community. Thus, Enlightenment has finally precipitated the antagonism among humans and antagonism between humans and nature. In these respects, Tu thinks that Confucian values, such as sympathy, distributive justice, strong sense of communal responsibility, propriety, and the sense of collectivism and emphasis of self-restraint, should also be universalized and be able to contribute to the modern world.

c. Civilizational Dialogue

In response to the many Western social theorists who regard Western modernity as the future trend of human development, Tu points out the fallacy of Eurocentric chauvinism present in their work. Inspired by the existentialist philosopher Karl Jaspers’ concept of the “Axial Age”—whereby modern civilizations have been shaped by different cultural and intellectual traditions that arose between the 700s and the 200s B.C.E., including Confucianism—Tu argues that the rise of East Asian industrialization has dispelled the myth of Westernization as the single model of modernization. In the case of Singapore, for example, Tu cites how Confucian virtues—such as frugality, industriousness, self-discipline, loyalty, and active participation in collective welfare—have proven to be constitutive to the success of the ethnically Chinese city-state. In Tu’s view, Singapore—and by extension all of industrialized East Asia—could not have proceeded to modernity by a route other than its own (Chinese) cultural traditions, and cannot be judged by the standards of other cultural traditions. Thus, for Tu, the development of modernity is a pluralistic phenomenon that proceeds by different cultural pathways.

Moreover, Tu identifies the twenty-first century cultural-historical moment as a kind of new “Axial Age,” in which conditions of cultural and religious pluralism can foster constructive dialogue between traditions and civilizations. Throughout this conversation, each civilization should open itself to learning from others, on the one hand, while at the same time maintaining a strong sense of self-recognition so that it will develop, rather than dissipate, as a result of dialogue. Tu’s hope is that such civilizational dialogue will aid in the search for a global ethic. In Way, Learning, and Politics: Essays on the Confucian Intellectual (1993, hereafter abbreviated as WLP), Tu writes: “If the well-being of humanity is its central concern, Confucian humanism in the third epoch cannot afford to be confined to East Asian culture. A global perspective is needed to universalize its concerns. Confucians can benefit from dialogue with Jewish, Christian, and Islamic theologians, with Buddhists, with Marxists, and with Freudian and post-Freudian psychologists.” (WLP, 158-9).

This emphasis on inter-cultural, inter-religious, inter-disciplinary, and inter-civilizational dialogue is one of the defining features of Tu’s Confucianism. It also represents a response to the theory of the “clash of civilizations” proposed by Samuel P. Huntington. Huntington argues that international conflict in the post-Cold War era was primarily caused by conflicts between people’s cultural and religious identities. Huntington anticipates that the conflict between the West and what he calls Confucian and Islamic civilizations will be the greatest conflict in the future. Tu does not deny the existence of a civilizational clash; nevertheless, Tu criticizes Huntington’s civilizational clash as one-sided and static in its assumptions about the structure of civilizations. In contrast, Tu finds that the development of civilizations is dynamic and mutually influential, and he argues that the trend of global development should be the promotion of civilizational dialogue rather than the anticipation of civilizational conflict. From Tu’s Confucian perspective, this posture reflects a distinctively Chinese faith that true harmony may be achieved by respecting differences, as stated in Lunyu (Analects) 13:23: “The superior man is conciliatory but does not identify himself with others.” Such civilizational dialogue is crucial for the future development of Confucianism as Tu envisions it, just as Confucianism in the past developed out of dialogue with Buddhism in China. If contemporary Confucians want their tradition to continue to grow, argues Tu, then they must face the challenge of Western civilization. Tu goes so far as to say that, without such civilizational dialogue, there can be no future for Confucianism as a living tradition.

But the value of civilizational dialogue does not lie only with its benefits to the Confucian tradition. In Tu’s mind, Confucianism is not simply for people in China or East Asia, but also for the whole world. Tu thinks that the third epoch of Confucianism must respond to four aspects of challenges from the West: (1) the spirit of scientific inquiry, (2) democracy, (3) Western religiosity and its sense of transcendence, and (4) the Freudian psychological exploration of human nature. Thus, Confucianism must open itself, reach out to the world, and learn from the West about the ideas of freedom, equality, science, democracy, human rights, and rule of the law, while rejecting the Western tendencies toward either radical individualism or radical collectivism. Confucianism must reject its own past elements of authoritarianism, hierarchalism, and androcentrism (male-centeredness) while conserving the value to be found in traditional Confucian aesthetics, morality and religiosity. Through such civilizational dialogue, Tu believes that Confucianism can both renew itself and become a valuable resource for the world.

5. Influence and Criticism

One of the important and influential contributions of Tu’s Confucianism is his ongoing dialogue with non-Confucian religions and social theories. Tu’s many years of living in the United States make such dialogue possible and have enabled him to become the foremost spokesperson for Confucian thought in the West. However, his prolonged expatriate status also renders him vulnerable to criticisms from Confucian thinkers in China and elsewhere outside of the West.

While Tu’s particular presentation of Confucian thought has proven to be both intelligible and popular among Westerners, his use of Western religious concepts and terminology to describe Confucianism also has generated controversy in the Chinese Confucian world. In particular, the cultural hybridity and explicit spirituality that are key elements of Tu’s Confucianism have been criticized by some other contemporary Chinese Confucian thinkers, who—like modern Chinese philosophy in general—have been more influenced by nationalism and secularism than a diaspora thinker such as Tu. For example, some Chinese Confucian thinkers have pointed out that the idea of a covenant with Heaven can scarcely be found in Confucian texts, even in implicit terms. Others have questioned whether Confucianism truly possesses a concept of dialogue between human beings and Heaven, given that Confucius is recorded as having taught that Heaven does not say anything (Analects 17:19). Finally, Tu’s philosophical anthropology—particularly his distinction between soul (ling) and spirit (shen), which is not always clear in his writings—has come under fire from some other Confucian critics.

Despite such controversies, however, Tu’s enormous impact and legacy as a modernizer of Confucian thought and champion of Confucian engagement with non-Confucian traditions must be acknowledged.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Hung, Andrew T. W. “Tu Wei-Ming and Charles Taylor on Embodied Moral Reasoning.” Philosophy, Culture, and Traditions 3 (2013): 199-216.
  • Huntington, Samuel P. “The Clash of Civilizations?” Foreign Affairs 72/3 (Summer 1993): 22-49.
  • Levenson, Joseph R. Confucian China and its Modern Fate: The Problem of Intellectual Continuity, Volume 1. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1958.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Neo-Confucian Thought in Action: Wang Yang-ming's Youth (1472-1509). Berkeley: University of California Press, 1976.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Humanity and Self-Cultivation: Essays in Confucian Thought. Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1978.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Confucian Ethics Today: The Singapore Challenge. Singapore: Federal Publications, 1984.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Confucian Thought: Selfhood as Creative Transformation. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1985.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Centrality and Commonality: an Essay on Confucian Religiousness, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989. Later published as Zhongyong dongjian (An Insight into Zhongyong), bilingual (Chinese and English) edition, trans. Duan Dezhi (Beijing: People's Publishing House, 2008).
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Way, Learning, and Politics: Essays on the Confucian Intellectual. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1993.
  • Tu, Wei-ming, and Mary Evelyn Tucker, eds. Confucian Spirituality. 2 vols. New York: The Crossroad Publishing Company, 2003-04.

 

Author Information

Hung Tsz Wan Andrew
Email: ccandrew@hkcc-polyu.edu.hk
Hong Kong Community College, The Hong Kong Polytechnic University
China