Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Nasir al-Din Tusi (1201—1274)

Nasir al-Din Tusi, by far the most celebrated scholar of the 13th century Islamic lands, was born in Tus, in 1201 and died in Baghdad in 1274. He was apparently born into a Twelver Shi‘i family. At the age of twenty-two or a while later, Tusi joined the court of Nasir al-Din Muhtashim, the Ismaili governor of Quhistan, Northeast Iran, where he was accepted into the Ismaili community as a novice.Around 634/1236, we find Tusi in Alamut, the centre of Nizari Ismaili government. He seems to have climbed the ranks of the Ismaili da‘wat ascending to the position of chief missionary (da‘i al-du‘at). The collapse of Ismaili political power and the massacre of the Ismaili population, during the Mongol invasion, left no choice for Tusi except the exhibition of some sort of affiliation to Twelver Shi‘ism and denouncing his Ismaili allegiances (taqiyya).

In the Mongol court, Tusi witnessed the fall of the ‘Abbasid caliphate and after a while, securing the trust of Hulegu, the Mongol chief, he was given the full authority of administering the finances of religious foundations (awqaf). The ensemble of Tusi’s writings amounts to approximately 165 titles on a wide variety of subjects (astronomy, ethics, history, jurisprudence, logic, mathematics, medicine, philosophy, theology, poetry and the popular sciences).

Nasir al-Din Tusi, Muhammad b. Muhammad b. Hasan, by far the most celebrated scholar of the 7th/13th century Islamic lands was born in Tus, in 597/1201 and died in Baghdad on 18 Dhu’l Hijja 672/25 June, 1274. Thomas Aquinas and Roger Bacon were his contemporaries in the West. Very little is known about his childhood and early education, apart from what he writes in his autobiography, Contemplation and Action (Sayr wa suluk).

He was apparently born into a Twelver Shi‘i family and lost his father at a young age. Fulfilling the wish of his father, the young Muhammad took learning and scholarship very seriously and travelled far and wide to attend the lectures of renowned scholars and ‘acquire the knowledge which guides people to the happiness of the next world.’ As a young boy, Tusi studied mathematics with Kamal al-Diin Hasib about whom we have no authentic knowledge. In Nishabur he met Farid al-Din ‘Attar, the legendary Sufi master who was later killed in the hand of Mongol invaders and attended the lectures of Qutb al-Din Misri and Farid al-Din Damad. In Mawsil he studied mathematics and astronomy with Kamal al-Din Yunus (d. 639/1242). Later on he corresponded with Qaysari, the son-in-law of Ibn al-‘Arabi, and it seems that mysticism, as propagated by Sufi masters of his time, was not appealing to his mind and once the occasion was suitable, he composed his own manual of philosophical Sufism in the form of a small booklet entitled The Attributes of the Illustrious (Awsaf al-ashraf).

His ability and talent in learning enabled Tusi to master a number disciplines in a relatively short period. At the time when educational priorities leaned towards the religious sciences, especially in his own family who were associated with the Twelver Shi‘i clergy, Tusi seems to have shown great interest for mathematics, astronomy and the intellectual sciences. At the age of twenty-two or a while later, Tusi joined the court of Nasir al-Din Muhtashim, the Ismaili governor of Quhistan, Northeast Iran, where he was accepted into the Ismaili community as a novice (mustajib). A sign of close personal relationship with Muhtashim’s family is to be seen in the dedication of a number of his scholarly works such as Akhlaq-i Nasiri and Akhlaq-i Muhtashimi to Nasir al-Din himself and Risala-yi Mu‘iniyya to his son Mu‘in al-Din.

Around 634/1236, we find Tusi in Alamut, the centre of Nizari Ismaili government. The scholarly achievements of Tusi in the compilation of Akhlaq-i Nasiri in 633/1235, seems to, amongst other factors, have paved the way for this move which was a great honour and opportunity for a scholar of his calibre, especially since Alamut was the seat of the Ismaili imam and housed the most important library in the Ismaili state.

In Alamut, apart from teaching, editing, dictating and compiling scholarly works, Tusi seems to have climbed the ranks of the Ismaili da‘wat ascending to the position of chief missionary (da‘i al-du‘at). Through constant visits with scholars and tireless correspondences, a practice which he developed from a very young age, Tusi kept his contact with the academic world outside Ismaili circles and was addressed as ‘the scholar’ (al-muhaqiq) from a very early period in his life.

The Mongol invasion and the turmoil they caused in the eastern Islamic territories hardly left the life of any of its citizens untouched. The collapse of Ismaili political power and the massacre of the Ismaili population, who were a serious threat to the Mongols, left no choice for Tusi except the exhibition of some sort of affiliation to Twelver Shi‘ism and denouncing his Ismaili allegiances.

Although under Mongol domination, Tusi’s allegiance to any particular community or persuasion could not have been of any particular importance, the process itself paved the ground for Tusi to write on various aspects of Shi‘ism, both from Ismaili and Twelver Shi‘i viewpoints, with scholarly vigour and enthusiasm. The most famous of his Ismaili compilations are Rawda-yi taslim, Sayr wa suluk, Tawalla wa tabarra, Akhlaq-i Muhtashimi and Matlub al-mu’minin. Tajrid al-i‘tiqad, al-Risala fi’l-imama and Fusul-i Nasiriyya are among his works dedicated to Twelver Shi‘ism.

In the Mongol court, Tusi witnessed the fall of the ‘Abbasid caliphate and after a while, securing the trust of Hulegu, the Mongol chief, he was given the full authority of administering the finances of religious foundations (awqaf). During this period of his life, Tusi’s main concern was combating Mongol savagery, saving the life of innocent scholars and the establishment of one of the most important centres of learning in Maragha, Northwest Iran. The compilation of Musari‘at al-musari;, the Awsaf al-ashraf and Talkis al-muhassal are the scholarly writings of Tusi in the final years of his life.

The ensemble of Tusi’s writings amounts to approximately 165 titles on a wide variety of subjects. Some of them are simply a page or even half a page, but the majority with few exceptions, are well prepared scholarly works on astronomy, ethics, history, jurisprudence, logic, mathematics, medicine, philosophy, theology, poetry and the popular sciences. Tusi’s fame in his own lifetime guaranteed the survival of almost all of his scholarly output. The adverse effect of his fame is also the attribution of a number of works which neither match his style nor has the quality of his writings.

Tusi’s major works: (1) Astronomy: al-Tadhkira fi ‘ilm al-hay’a; Zij Ilkhani; Risala-yi Mu‘iniyya and its commentary. (2) Ethics: Gushayish-nama; Akhlaq-i Muhtashami; Akhlaq-i Nasiri, ‘Deliberation 22’ in Rawda-yi taslim and a Persian translation of Ibn Muqaffa‘’s al-Adab al-wajiz. (3) History: Fath-i Baghdad which appears as an appendix to Tarikh-i Jahan-gushay of Juwayni (London, 1912-27), vol. 3, pp. 280-92. (4) Jurisprudence: Jawahir al-fara’id. (5) Logic: Asas al-iqtibas. (6) Mathematics: Revision of Ptolemy’s Almagest; the epistles of Theodosius, Hypsicles, Autolucus, Aristarchus, Archimedes, Menelaus, Thabit b. Qurra and Banu Musa. (7) Medicine: Ta‘liqa bar qunun-i Ibn Sina and his correspondences with Qutb al-Din Shirazi and Katiban Qazwini. (8) Philosophy: refutation of al-Shahrastani in Musara‘at al-musari‘; his commentary on Ibn Sina’s al-Isharat wa’l-tanbihat which took him almost 20 years to complete; his autobiography Sayr wa suluk; Rawda-yi taslim and Tawalla wa tabarra. (9) Theology: Aghaz wa anjam; Risala fi al-imama and Talkhis al-muhassal and (10) Poetry: Mi‘yar al-ash‘ar.

References and Further Reading

  • Badakhchani, S. J. Contemplation and Action: The Spiritual Autobiography of a Muslim Scholar (London, I. B. Tauris in association with The Institute of Ismaili Studies, 1998).
  • Mudarris Radawi, Muhammad. Ahwal wa athar-i Abu Ja‘far Muhammad b. Muhammad b. Hasan al-Tusi. Tehran, Intisharat-i Danishgah-i Tehran, 1345s/1975.
  • Mudarrisi Zanjani, Muhammad. Sargudhasht wa ‘aqa‘id-i falsafi-yi Khwaja Nasir al-Din Tusi. Tehran, Intisharat-i Danishgah-i Tehran, 1363s/1984.
  • Madelung, Wilferd. ‘Nasir al-Din Tusi’s Ethics Between Philosophy, Shi‘ism and Sufism,’ in Ethics in Islam, ed. R. G. Hovannisian, Malibu, CA, 1985, pp. 85-101.

Author Information

S. J. Badakhchani
Email: info@iis.ac.uk
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom




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