Vasubandhu was a prominent Buddhist teacher and one of the most important figures in the development of Mahyna Buddhism in India. Though he is particularly admired by later Buddhists as co-founder of the Yogcra school along with his half brother Asanga, his pre-Yogcra works, such as the Abhidharmakosha and his auto-commentary (Abhidharmakoshabhshya) on it, are considered masterpieces. He wrote commentaries on many stras, works on logic, devotional poetry, works on Abhidharma classifications, as well as original and innovative philosophical treatises. Some of his writings have survived in their original Sanskrit form, but many others, particularly his commentaries, are extant only in their Chinese or Tibetan translations. Vasubandhu was a many-sided thinker, and his personality as it emerges from his works and his biographies shows him as a man who was not only a great genius and a philosopher, but also a human being who was filled with great compassion.
The most important and the only complete account of the life of Vasubandhu entitled Posou pandoufa shijuan (Biography of Master Vasubandhu) was compiled into Chinese by Paramartha (499-569 CE), one of the chief exponents of Yogacara doctrine in China. It is preserved in the Chinese Tripitaka and its English translation was published by J. Takakusu in T’oung Pao (1904: 269-296). Apart from this account, the Xiyuji of Xuanzang (600-664 CE) also provides important information about the life of Vasubandhu. Though Paramartha and Xuanzang are the two most credible authorities for Vasubandhu’s life, yet serious discrepancies exist between their accounts. Paramartha’s account not only contains legendary or even mythical elements, but the time sequence of events is also ambiguous and differs greatly in places from the account of Xuanzang’s the Xiyuji. The Tibetan historians, Taranatha and Bu-ston, also give some important information on Vasubandhu’s life, but their account further disagrees with Paramartha and Xuanzang in terms of certain names and events associated with the life of Vasubandhu. Scholars once suspected that more than one person bore the name Vasubandhu in the history of Indian Buddhism, although recent studies have eliminated this hypothesis.
He was born at Purusapura (identified with modern Peshawar, capital of North-West Frontier Province of Pakistan) in the state of Gandhara. Gandhara is best known today as one of the earliest regions to develop a distinctive form of Buddhist art noted for its Hellenistic influence. According to Taranatha, Vasubandhu was born one year after his older brother Asanga became a Buddhist monk. His father was a brahmanaof the Kaushika gotra. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan his mother’s name was Virinci. But Bu-ston and Taranatha mention the name of the mother of Asanga and Vasubandhu as Prasannashila. According to these two Tibetan historians, Asanga and Vasubandhu were half-brothers; Asanga’s father being a kshatriya, and Vasubandhu’s a brahmana. Vasubandhu also had a younger brother called Virincivatsa. Vasubandhu’s father was a court priest, and according to Taranatha was an authority on the Vedas. In all probability, he officiated at the court of the Shaka princes of the Shilada clan, who at that time ruled from Purusapura. During the formative years of his life, Vasubandhu may have been introduced by his father not only to the Brahmanical tradition but also to the postulates of classical Nyaya and Vaisheshika, both of which had influence on his logical thought.
As a young student, he amazed his teachers with his brilliance and ready wit. According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu’s teacher was called Buddhamitra. The Xiyuji, however, never mentions Buddhamitra and names Manoratha as the teacher of Vasubandhu. At Vasubandhu’s time the dominant Buddhist school in Gandhara was the Vaibhashika (also called Sarvastivada). Vasubandhu entered the Sarvastivada order, and studied primarily the scholastic system of the Vaibhashikas. Initially, he was quite impressed with the Mahavibhasha. In time, however, Vasubandhu began to have grave doubts about the validity and relevance of Vaibhashika metaphysics. At this time, perhaps through the brilliant teacher Manoratha, he came into contact with the theories of the Sautrantikas, the group of Buddhists who wished to reject everything that was not the express word of the Buddha, and who held the elaborate constructions of the Vibhasha up to ridicule. That there was a strong Sautrantika tradition in Purusapura is likely in view of the fact that it was the birthplace of that maverick philosopher of the second century, Dharmatrata. In fact, the most orthodox Vaibhashika seat of learning was not in Gandhara, but in Kashmir, whose masters looked down upon the Gandharans as quasi-heretics. Therefore, according to Xuanzang’s pupil Pu Kuang, Vasubandhu decided to go to Kashmir disguised as a lunatic to investigate the Vaibhashika teachings more deeply. Vasubandhu studied in Kashmir with different teachers for four years and then came back to Purusapura.
After having returned to his native place, Vasubandhu began to prepare for an enormous project that had been in his mind for some time. At this time he was unattached to any particular order, and lived in a small private house in the center of Purusapura. Vasubandhu supported himself by lecturing on Buddhism before the general public, which presumably remunerated him with gifts. According to tradition, during the day he would lecture on Vaibhashika doctrine and in the evening distill the day’s lectures into a verse. When collected together the six hundred plus verses (karikas) gave a thorough summary of the entire system. He entitled this work the Abhidharmakosha (Treasury of Abhidharma). According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu composed the Abhidharmakosha at Ayodhya, but according to Xuanzang, it was composed in the suburbs of Purusapura. In the Abhidharmakosha Vasubandhu analyzed and catalogued seventy-five dharmas, the basic factors of experience, for the purposes of attaining Bodhi. He divided them into various categories consisting of eleven types of rupani i.e., ‘material forms’ (the five sense organs, their corresponding objects, and avijnapti-rupa i.e., ‘gesture unrevealing of intent’); citta (mind); ten types of mahaabhumika i.e., ‘major groundings’ (volition, desire, mindfulness, attention etc.); ten types of kushala-mahabhumika i.e., ‘advantageous major groundings’ (faith, vigor, equanimity, ahimsa, serenity etc.); six types of klesha-mahabhumika i.e., ‘mental disturbance major groundings’ (confusion, carelessness, restlessness etc.); two types of akushala mahabhumika i.e., ‘nonadvantageous major groundings (shamelessness and non-embarrassment); ten types of paritta-klesha-mahabhumika i.e., ‘secondary mental disturbance major groundings’ (anger, enmity, envy, conceit etc.); eight types of aniyata-mahabhumika i.e., ‘indeterminate major groundings’ (remorse, arrigance, aversion, doubt, torpor etc.); fourteen types of citta-viprayukta-samskara-dharmah i.e. ‘embodied-conditioning disassociated from mind’ (life-force, birth, decay, impermanence etc.); and three types of asamskrita-dharmah i.e., ‘unconditioned dharmas (spatiality, cessation through understanding, and cessation without understanding). Not only were the definitions and interrelations of these seventy-five dharmas analyzed in the Abhidharmakosha, but their karmic qualities also examined. Besides, Vasubandhu also elaborated upon causal theories, cosmology, practices of meditation, theories of perception, karma, rebirth, and the characteristics of an Enlightened Being in this text.
As the Abhidharmakosha was an eloquent summary of the purport of the Mahavibhasha, the Kashmiri Sarvastivadins are reported to have rejoiced to see in it all their doctrines so well propounded. Accordingly, they requested Vasubandhu to write a prose commentary (bhashya) on it. However, it seems that after having written the Abhidharmakosha, Vasubandhu began to have second thoughts about the Vaibhashika teachings. As a consequence, it is said, Vasubandhu prepared the Abhidharmakoshabhashya. But as it contained a thoroughgoing critique of Vaibhashika dogmatics from a Sautrantika viewpoint, the Kashmiri Sarvastivadins soon realized, to their great disappointment, that the Abhidharmakoshabhashya in fact refuted many Sarvastivada theories and upheld the doctrines of the Sautrantika school. One major point that created bad blood between the Vaibhashikas and the Sautrantikas was concerning the status and nature of the dharmas. The Vaibhashikas held that the dharmas exist in the past and future as well as the present. On the other hand, the Sautrantikas held the view that they are discrete, particular moments only existing at the present moment in which they discharge causal efficacy. The Vaibhashikas wrote several treatises attempting to refute Vasubandhu’s critiques.
In the years directly following the composition of the Abhidharmakoshabhashya, Vasubandhu seems to have spent much time in travelling from place to place. Finally, after having spent some time at Shakala/ Shagala (modern Sialkot in Pakistan), he shifted along with his teachers Buddhamitra and Manoratha to Ayodhya (now located in Uttar Pradesh, northern India), a city far removed from Kashmir. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan, Vasubandhu, now proud of the fame he had acquired, clung faithfully to the Hinayana doctrine in which he was well-versed and, having no faith in the Mahayana, denied that it was the teaching of the Buddha. Vasubandhu had up to this time but little regard for the Yogacara treatises of his elder brother. He had perhaps seen the voluminous Yogacarabhumi compiled by Asanga, which may have simply repelled him by its bulk. According to Bu-ston, he is reported to have said, “Alas, Asanga, residing in the forest, has practised meditation for twelve years. Without having attained anything by this meditation, he has founded a system, so difficult and burdensome, that it can be carried only by an elephant.” Asanga heard about this attitude of his brother and feared that Vasubandhu would use his great intellectual gifts to undermine the Mahayana. By feigning illness he was able to summon his younger brother to Purusapura, where he lived. However, Xuanzang differs with some of these details and the place provided by Paramartha regarding Vasubandhu’s conversion. According to the Xiyuji the conversion of Vasubandhu took place at Ayodhya. At the rendezvous, Vasubandhu asked Asanga to explain the Mahayana teaching to him, whereupon he immediately realized the supremacy of Mahayana thought. After further study, we are told, the depth of his realization came to equal that of his brother. Deeply ashamed of his former abuse of the Mahayana, Vasubandhu wanted to cut out his tongue, but refrained from doing so when Asanga told him to use it for the cause of Mahayana. Vasubandhu regarded the study of the enormous Shatasahasrikaprajna-paramita-sutra as of utmost importance. In view of the fact that they were the texts that converted him to Mahayana, Vasubandhu’s commentaries on the Akshayamatinirdesha-sutra and the Dasha-bhumika may have been his earliest Mahayana works. These were followed by a series of commentaries on other Mahayana sutras and treatises, including the Avatamsakasutra, Nirvanasutra, Vimalakirtinirdeshasutra, and Shrimaladevisutra. He himself composed a treatise on vijnaptimatra (cognition only) theory and commented on the Mahayanasamgraha, Triratna-gotra, Amrita-mukha, and other Mahayana treatises. According to the Tibetan biographers, his favorite sutra was either the Shatasahasrikaprajna-paramita-sutra or the Ashtasahasrika. Considering that these texts reveal the most profound insights into Mahayana thinking, it is not surprising that Vasubandhu liked them. Since the output of Vasubandhu’s Mahayana works is huge, he was in all probability writing new treatises every year. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan Vasubandhu engaged in his literary activity on behalf of the Mahayana after Asanga’s death. Xuanzang, however, tells a strange story that suggests that Vasubandhu died before Asanga.
With the composition of the Abhidharmakosha, Vasubandhu came to enjoy the patronage and favor of two Gupta rulers, Vikramaditya and his heir Baladitya, who can be identified respectively, as Skandagupta (ruled circa 455-467 CE) and Narasimhagupta (ruled circa 467-473 CE). The first important intellectual debate which Vasubandhu had was with Vasurata. Vasurata was a grammarian and the husband of the younger sister of Baladitya. It was Baladitya who had challenged Vasubandhu to a debate. Vasubandhu was able to defeat him successfully. Another well-known intellectual encounter which Vasubandhu had was with Samkhyas. While Vasubandhu was away, his old master Buddhamitra was defeated in a debate at Ayodhya by Vindhyavasin. When Vasubandhu came to know of it, he was enraged and subsequently trounced the Samkhyas both in debate and in a treatise the Paramarthasaptatika. Candragupta II rewarded him with 300,000 gold coins for his victory over the Samkhyas. Vasubandhu made use of this money to build three monasteries, one for the Mahayanists, another one for his old colleagues the Sarvastivadins, and a third for nuns. Refutation of Vaisheshika and Samkhya theories had been presented by Vasubandhu already in the Abhidharmakosha, but it was perhaps from this point onward that Vasubandhu was regarded as a philosopher whose views could not be lightly challenged. Samghabhadra, a Sarvastivada scholar from Kashmir, also once challenged Vasubandhu regarding the Abhidharmakosha. He composed two treatises, one consisting of 10,000 verses and another of 120,000 verses. According to Xuanzang, it took twelve years for Samghabhadra to finish the two works. He challenged Vasubandhu to a debate, but Vasubandhu refused, saying, “I am already old, so I will let you say what you wish. Long ago, this work of mine destroyed the Vaibhashika (that is, the Sarvastivada) doctrines. There is no need now of confronting you… Wise men will know which of us is right and which one is wrong.”
The date of Vasubandhu has posed a problem for historians. According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu lived 900 years after the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha. At another place, Paramartha also mentions the figure of 1100. Xuanzang and his disciples respectively mention that Vasubandhu lived 1000 and 900 years after the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha. Now though it is generally believed that the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha took place within few years of 400 BCE, some scholars are still hesitant to accept this date. This has led to different scholars proposing different dates for Vasubandhu. Noul Pari and Shio Benkyoo give as Vasubandhu’s dates the years 270 to 350 CE. Steven Anacker proposes his date as 316-396 CE, Ui Hakuju places him in the fourth century (320-400 CE). Takakusu Junjiroo and Kimura Taiken gave 420 to 500, Wogihara Unrai gives 390 to 470 CE, and Hikata Ryushoo gives 400 to 480 CE. Erich Frauwallner suggests that there were two Vasubandhus and hence two different dates. According to him Vasubandhu the elder lived between about 320 and 380 CE and Vasubandhu the younger between around 400 and 480 CE. However, this hypothesis of two Vasubandhus is no longer tenable in current scholarship as many of the early Chinese documents used by Frauwallner are of spurious nature and thus, their testimony cannot be accepted.
Vasubandhu is said to have been the author of one thousand works, 500 in the Hinayana tradition and 500 Mahayana treatises. But only forty-seven works of Vasubandhu are extant, nine of which survive in the Sanskrit original, twenty-seven in Chinese translation, and thirty-three in Tibetan translation. The Abhidharmakosha is the most voluminous among Vasubandhu’s independent expositions. It attained the status of a primary textbook to be studied by all students of the tradition in the Northern Buddhist countries, including Tibet. As pointed out above, the Abhidharmakosha pictures the Buddhist Path to Enlightenment through the categorization and analysis of the seventy-five dharmas.
Vasubandhu’s Karmasiddhi (Establishing Karma) is a short, quasi-Hinayana treatise coloured, as is the Abhidharmakosha, by Sautrantika leanings. His Pancaskandhaprakarana (Exposition on the Five Aggregates) discusses most of the subjects taken up in the Abhidharmakosha. In cataloguing and categorization of dharmas in the Pancaskandhaprakarana the dharmas is a bit different than the Abhidharmakosha. Moreover, whereas the Abhidharmakosha talks about seventy five dharmas, not only have several dharmas been added, but many of the original seventy five have been dropped in the Pancaskandhaprakarana.
In his Karmasiddhiprakarana (Exposition on Establishing Karma), Vasubandhu challenged the views of those who held that dharmas are anything other than being momentary. The doctrine of momentariness (kshanikavada) perceived consciousness as a causal sequence of moments in which each moment is caused by its immediate predecessor. However, he felt that this theory could not explain certain categories of continuity. For instance, kshanikavada did not offer any satisfactory explanation for the re-emergence of a consciousness stream after having been interrupted in deep sleep. Similarly, continuity from one life to the next could not be explained satisfactorily by this theory. To solve such inconsistencies, Vasubandhu introduced the Yogacara notion of the alaya vijnana (storehouse consciousness). Through this concept he explained that the seed (bija) of a previous experience is stored subliminally and released into a new experience. In this way, Vasubandhu not only explained continuity between two separate moments of consciousness, but he also provided a quasi causal explanation for the functioning of karmic retribution. In other words, Vasubandhu’s alaya vijnana provided an explanation as to how an action performed at one time could produce its result at another time. This concept also did away with the necessity of a permanent atman as the doer and recipient of karma since, like a stream, it is continuously changing with new conditions from moment to moment.
From the Yogacara point of view the most important of Vasubandhu’s works are the Vimshatika (Twenty Verses), Trimshika (Thirty Verses), and Trisvabhavanirdesha (Exposition on the Three Natures). According to tradition, the Trisvabhavanirdesha was reputedly his last treatise, and his Vimshatika and Trimshika were written near the end of his life, though we have no actual evidence to support this order. Despite the fact that all these three texts are very concise and the Trisvabhavanirdesha was not even known in China (and is never read in Tibet despite being part of Tibetan canon), they form a kind of troika and represent Vasubandhu’s final accomplishment as a Yogacara-Vijnanavada teacher.
The Vimshatika is perhaps the most original and philosophically interesting treatise of Vasubandhu. Vasubandhu devotes a major portion of this text in dealing with the Realist objections against Yogacara. To the Realist position that external things must exist because they are consistently located in space as well as time, Vasubandhu responds by saying that objects also appear to have spatial and temporal qualities in dreams, whereas nothing ‘external’ is present in the dreams. This means that the appearance of cognitive objects does not require an actual object external to the consciousness cognizing it. Vasubandhu, however, points out that without the consciousness nothing whatsoever can be apprehended. Therefore, it is consciousness that is the necessary condition and not an external object. Vasubandhu does not deny that cognitive objects exist. However, what he denies is that such cognitive objects have external reference points. From the Yogacara point of view, what we believe to be external objects are actually nothing more than mental projections. Thus, whatever we think about, know, experience, or conceptualize, occurs to us only in our consciousness and nowhere else. In other words, according to Vasubandhu, cognition takes place only in consciousness and nowhere else. Thus, everything that we know is acquired through sensory experience. We are fooled by consciousness into believing that those things which we perceive and appropriate within consciousness are actually outside our cognitive sphere. To the Realist objection that subjective wishes do not determine objective realities, Vasubandhu replies that due to collective-karma groups give rise to common misperceptions. He pointed out that it is the result of a person’s own karma that determines the type of situation in which that person would be born. Thus, Vasubandhu points out that how we see things is shaped by previous experience, and since experience is inter-subjective, we gather in groups that see things the way we do. To another Realist objection that the objective world functions by determinate causal principles, Vasubandhu points out that the appearance of causal efficacy also occurs in dreams. Thus our conscious ‘dreams’ can have causal efficacy.
The Trimshika, which became the basic text of the Faxiang (Japanese Hossoo) school, is one of Vasubandhu’s most mature works. Through concise verses he sums up his doctrine of vijnapti matra (cognition only) by explaining Yogacara theories of eight-consciousnesses, three-natures and the five-step path to Enlightenment. The eight types of consciousness are the five sense consciousnesses, the empirical consciousness (mano-vijnana), a self-aggrandizing mentality (manas), and the alaya-vijnana. Vasubandhu describes and explains how each of these can be extinguished through ashraya-paravritti i.e., through the overturning of the very basis of these eight types of consciousness. This over-turning i.e., achievement of the Bodhi gradually takes place through the five-step path in a way that consciousness (vijnana) is transformed into unmediated cognition (jnana). According to the theory of three natures, there are three cognitive realms at play: the delusional cognitively constructed realm, which is intrinsically unreal; the realm of causal dependency; and the perfectional realm which is intrinsically ‘empty.’ To Vasubandhu, Buddhism is a method of cleansing the stream of consciousness from ‘contaminations’ and ‘defilements.’
The Foxinglun (Treatise on Buddha Nature) exerted great influence on Sino-Japanese Buddhism by propounding the concept of tathagata-garbha (Buddha Nature). The Vadavidhi (A Method for Argumentation) is another important text attributed to Vasubandhu. Though this text is not strictly speaking a ‘logic’ text and does not make any distinction between techniques of debate and logic as such, still its importance in the field of logic cannot be overlooked. It not only provides information on the state of Buddhist logic prior to Dignaga, but also paved the way for the revolutionary contribution of Dignaga and Dharmakirti in the field of logic. Though not many details on the meditative career of Vasubandhu are available, his Madhyantavibhagabhashya (Commentary on the Separation of the Middle from Extremes) points to his keen interest in the techniques of meditation.
Vasubandhu’s commentaries on sutras and shastras are by no means less important than the above-mentioned independent treatises. He wrote commentaries on three treatises: the Madhyantavibhaga (Discrimination between the Middle and the Extremes), Mahayanasutralamkara (Ornament of the Mahayana Sutras), and Dharmadharmatavibhaga/ Dharmadharmtavibhanga (Discrimination between Existence and Essence). All these three treatises are important texts of the Yogacara school and are ascribed to Asanga’s teacher Maitreya. Vasubandhu also composed a commentary on Asanga’s Mahayanasamgraha (Compendium of Mahayana). It is the first methodical presentation of the doctrines of Yogacara-Vijnanavada. Vasubandhu’s Sukhavativyuhasutranirdesha (Commentary on the Sukhavativyuha Sutra) is another important text. This text became a fundamental treatise of the Pure Land faith in China and Japan. The Indian Yogacara-Vijnanavada is represented in China by three schools, and the development of all these schools is credited to the works of Vasubandhu. The first of these schools, called the Dilun school (which was established in the first half of the sixth century CE), took his Dashabhumikasutranirdesha (Commentary on the Dashabhumika Sutra) as its basic text. The second, the Shelun school which originated in the second half of the sixth century CE, developed around a translation of the Mahayanasamgraha done by Paramartha. The third school, known as the Faxiang school (founded by Xuanzang and his disciple Kuiji in the seventh century), adopted the Trimshika as its basic text.
Later in life, Vasubandhu went so far ahead with his contemplative exercises that he even refused to engage in a debate with his worthy opponent Samghabhadra. He died at the age of eighty. Paramartha says that he died at Ayodhya, whereas Bu-ston says that his death took place in the northern frontier countries, which he calls ‘Nepal.’ In recognition of his contribution and achievements as a Mahayana teacher, he came to be reverently called a bodhisattva in various traditions from India to China. In fact, some go to the extent of even calling him the ‘second Buddha.’ As rightly pointed out in Bu-ston, he “was possessed of the wealth (vasu of the Highest wisdom and, having propagated the Doctrine out of mercy, had become the friend (bandhu) of the living beings.”
K. T. S. Sarao
Last updated: August 28, 2004 | Originally published: