Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Gianni Vattimo (1936− )

Gianni Vattimo is an Italian philosopher and cultural commentator. He studied in Turin, Italy with Luigi Pareyson, and in Heidelberg under Hans-Georg Gadamer. Central to Vattimo’s philosophy are the existentialist and proto-postmodernist influences of Nietzsche, Heidegger, Gadamer and Kuhn. He has also become prominent outside of philosophical circles through his political activism in supporting gay rights and from his position as a Member of the European Parliament. His ideas have had a wide-ranging influence across disciplines such as feminism, theology, sexuality studies, and globalisation.

In his philosophy Vattimo explores the relationship between postmodernism and nihilism, treating nihilism affirmatively rather than as something to be overcome. Vattimo draws upon both the theoretical work of Nietzsche and Heidegger, and the ‘signs of the times’. By the latter Vattimo refers to the social and political pluralism and the absence of metaphysical foundations that he believes characterise late modernity, a term Vattimo uses to refer to advanced societies in their present state to show their connection to modernity; the term ‘postmodern’ implies more discontinuity than Vattimo would like. Vattimo thinks that in developed societies there is a ‘plurality of interpretations’ because through the media and ever-increasing movement of peoples it is no longer possible to believe in one dominant way of seeing the world. The freeing-up of these interpretations is possible, Vattimo thinks, because one can no longer plausibly conceive Being as a foundation, that is, of the universe as a rational metaphysically-ordered system of causes and effects. In turn, the lack of plausibility in foundationalism is due to the ‘event’ of the death of God (both the idea of Being as foundation and the event of the death of God shall be explained in due course).  A significant portion of Vattimo’s work is devoted to explaining how the only plausible late-modern, Western philosophical outlook is ‘hermeneutical nihilism’. Broadly, this is the view that ‘there are no facts, only interpretations’, to use a phrase from Nietzsche’s unpublished notebooks (Colli and Montinari, 1967, VIII.1, 323, 7 [60]). Vattimo also investigates the implications of this position for religion, politics, ethics, art, technology, and the media.

Vattimo is well known for his philosophical style of ‘weak thought’ (pensiero debole). ‘Weak thought’ is an attempt to understand and re-configure traces from the history of thought in ways that accord with postmodern conditions. In doing so, the aim of ‘weak thought’ is to create an ethic of ‘weakness’. Vattimo’s efforts to create a postmodern ethic are closely related to his return to religion from the late 1980s onwards, a significant point in his own intellectual development. His renewed interest in religion has also acted as a blueprint for a return to philosophical engagement with, and commitment to, Communism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The End of History
  3. Hermeneutical Nihilism
    1. The End of History, Nihilism, and Nietzsche’s ‘Death of God’
    2. Heidegger: Being, Technology and Nihilism
    3. Ontology, ‘Exchange Value’ as Language, and Verwindung as Resignation
    4. ‘Weak Thought,’ Hermeneutics and Verwindung as Convalescence-Alteration
  4. Return to Religion
    1. Reasons behind Vattimo’s Return to Religion
    2. The Philosophical Importance of the Christian Message in Vattimo’s Thought
  5. Ethics
  6. Political Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Vattimo
    2. Works on Vattimo
    3. Other Works Cited

1. Life

Gianni Vattimo was born on January 4, 1936, in Turin, Italy. He was sent to an oratory school as a child. This strongly Catholic environment led to him becoming involved with Catholic youth groups such as Azione Cattolica. After completing his schooling, Vattimo studied at the University of Turin under Luigi Pareyson. He graduated in 1959 with a thesis on Aristotle that was published in 1961. To fund his studies Vattimo found employment as a television host and at a local high school. At the same time, Vattimo was working increasingly closely with Pareyson. Throughout this period Vattimo was also involved in activism, including protests against South African apartheid.

Vattimo has stated that he stopped being a Catholic when, after having gone to study in Germany, he ‘no longer read the Italian newspapers’ (Vattimo and Paterlini, 2009: 27). By this remark, he sought to imply that Catholicism and Italian culture were closely linked at the time. In 1963, Vattimo had taken up a two-year Humboldt Fellowship and was living in Heidelberg, Germany, studying under Karl Löwith and Hans-Georg Gadamer. Returning to Turin after his fellowship ended, Vattimo took up a position as adjunct professor at the university in 1964 to teach aesthetics, especially those of Heidegger. In 1968 Vattimo became a full professor of aesthetics at the University of Turin. In 1969, Vattimo finished his translation of Gadamer’s Truth and Method into Italian (it was published in 1970). During the 1970s Vattimo published many books, including his personal favourite, the 1974 work Il soggetto e la maschera (‘The subject and the mask’).

To Pareyson’s dismay, Vattimo became a Maoist after reading Mao’s works while in hospital in 1968. However, Vattimo was not seen as revolutionary enough by some groups. In 1978, the Red Brigades threatened Vattimo, spreading information to the media about Vattimo’s homosexuality. Moreover, some of Vattimo’s students were involved in terrorism around this time. When Vattimo received letters from some of his imprisoned students, he realised that they were attempting to justify their actions on metaphysical grounds. These events contributed to Vattimo reconsidering his own theoretical position. The fruit of this reflection was Vattimo’s notion of ‘weak thought’: that the history of Western metaphysics is a history of the weakening of strong structures (epistemic structures that purport to provide thinking with firm principles and criteria for judgement), and that philosophy should be an ‘adventure of difference’. Through these claims, Vattimo attempts to express the view that one should not aim for fixed philosophical solutions or for certainty with regard to knowledge. Rather, one should embrace the endless play of interpretations constitutive of late modernity. During this period Vattimo wrote some of his most well-known books, such as The End of Modernity and The Transparent Society.

There are recurrent themes and beliefs in Vattimo’s life, especially the philosophies of Nietzsche and Heidegger, Communism, and religion. The latter has come back into Vattimo’s life in a significant way since the late 1980s and 1990s. His faith is difficult to categorise, being a non-dogmatic and highly idiosyncratic form of the Catholicism with which he was brought up. Vattimo ‘thanks God’ that he is an atheist, says that he ‘believes that he believes’, and has closely related his faith to his philosophy of weak thought. He has also returned to the Communism of his younger years, albeit in a manner similarly ‘weakened’. Aside from his theoretical output, Vattimo has been active politically and was elected as a Member of the European Parliament in 1999. Since retiring from his university post in Turin in 2008 he has continued to publish prolifically.

2. The End of History

Vattimo contends that the Western postmodern experience is that of the end of history. By this he means that the way we can view the past can no longer be as if it had a unilinear character. By ‘unilinear character’, Vattimo means a way of writing and viewing history that sees it as a single train of events, often working towards a goal and privileging one interpretation of the past. Vattimo argues that there is no longer a coherent narrative which is accepted in the West. The typical modern narrative was one of progress, whether this concerned scientific and technological innovation, increasing freedom, or even a Marxist interpretation of history. For this narrative to be coherent it must view the past in terms of cause and effect. It must see that which has happened before as determining the present, and therefore determining the future. According to Vattimo, history loses its unilinear character in three principal ways: theoretically, demographically, and through the rise of the society of generalised communication. For the first way, Vattimo turns to Walter Benjamin’s essay ‘Theses on the Philosophy of History’ (1938), in which Benjamin argues that unilinear history is a product of class conflict. The powerful — kings, emperors, nobles — make history in a manner denied to the poor. Vattimo acknowledges that Benjamin was speaking from a nascent tradition, already begun by Marx and Nietzsche, of seeing history as constructed and not impartial. Given the selective, power-laden nature of unilinear history, Vattimo surmises that it would be mistaken to think there is only one true history. Such a realisation has profound consequences for the idea of progress. If there is not one unique history but many histories, then there is no one clear goal throughout historical development. This implication applies equally to sacred eschatology as to secular Marxist hopes of world revolution and of the realisation of a classless society. In modern Europe, where the unilinear conception of history had flourished, demographic effects have acted to undermine this very notion. In particular, mass immigration has led to a greater prominence of alternative histories.

Furthermore, the rebellion of previously ruled peoples is a common theme in history. However, such rebellion becomes postmodern in the context of the age of mass communication and the after-effects of the two World Wars. Of course, a hallmark of the Reformation was the importance of the printed word. Nevertheless, it did not facilitate the en masse expression and preservation of alternative viewpoints as do radio, television and — mostly significantly — the internet. Hence for Vattimo the advent of the society of mass communication is the third major component of the ‘end of history’ and the start of postmodernity. Vattimo proposes:

(a) that the mass media play a decisive role in the birth of a postmodern society; (b) that they do not make this postmodern more ‘transparent’, but more complex, even chaotic; and finally (c) that it is in precisely this relative ‘chaos’ that our hopes for emancipation lie (Vattimo, 1992: 4).

The Transparent Society, in which Vattimo most clearly outlined his ideas on the end of history, was written shortly before the mass uptake of the internet by Western consumers. Nevertheless, Vattimo’s analysis of mass communication applies even more strongly in light of the effects of widespread internet use. While alternative television and radio stations gave voices to more groups, Twitter, Facebook, blogs and web forums go further by allowing anyone with minimal access to technology to express their worldview. Vattimo acknowledges that this view of the effect of the culture of mass communication is in contrast to the positions of Adorno, Horkheimer, and Orwell. These thinkers predicted that a homogenisation of society would be the result of such communications technology. Additionally, following his reading of Nietzsche, Vattimo only believes in the possibility of interpretations, rather than facts. Nevertheless, he takes great pains to show that his diagnosis of the situation of late modernity is a cogent interpretation. In particular, he claims that it makes the best possible sense of the interpretative plurality he sees around him.

For Vattimo, freedom of information and media multiplicity eliminate the possibility of conceiving of a single reality. This has epistemological consequences, since the plurality of histories and voices in the age of mass communication brings multiple rationalities and anthropologies to the fore. This undermines the possibility of constructing knowledge on certain foundations. Thus, the tendency to universalise and impose a single view of how the world is ordered on others is weakened. As a result, Vattimo sees in late modernity the realisation of Nietzsche’s prophecy of the world becoming a fable. That is, Vattimo considers it impossible to find objective reality among images received from the media: there is no way to step outside, or be an impartial spectator, of these images. The dissolution of the unilinear conception of history, and its implications for modern views on knowledge and reality, liberates differences by allowing local rationalities to come to the fore.

3. Hermeneutical Nihilism

a. The End of History, Nihilism, and Nietzsche’s ‘Death of God’

Vattimo argues that the implications for philosophy of the end of history, and therefore of modernity, are profound. The postmodern experience is fragmented, whereas modernity, with its coherent narrative, is unified. Thinking within a unified, coherent narrative is oriented towards a foundation or origin. It sees history as moving forward from this origin through a logical progression. By lacking this sense of progress, postmodern experience for Vattimo thus coincides with nihilism. In searching for an anchor for the self, the postmodern person finds no centre and no certain foundations. As such, Vattimo views the notion of nihilism as the expression of the dislocation humans feel in the postmodern age. Nihilism is encapsulated by a Nietzschean phrase that Vattimo uses in his work The End of Modernity: that man ‘rolls “from the centre toward X”…because, to use a Heideggerian expression for nihilism, “there is nothing left of Being as such’’’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 20). Not only is a foundation for knowledge undesirable in the fragmentation of experience characteristic of the postmodern age, but it is also impossible. Nietzsche’s term for this experience of nihilism is the ‘death of God’. This is not meant in a metaphysical sense, but rather as the loss of the highest values of which God is the highest of all. It is impossible to find a centre, a universally-accessible metaphysical foundation amidst all the images and messages delivered in a society of mass communication. As a result, nihilism entails that there is no clear point of origin, no accessible epistemic foundation, and no universally-shared sense of where we are going. Rather than seeing this in a negative light, Vattimo sees nihilism as our ‘sole opportunity’ for emancipation from the violence of metaphysics, as will be explicated below.

b. Heidegger: Being, Technology and Nihilism

While Heidegger is not conventionally seen as a nihilist, by reading him through Nietzsche, Vattimo is able to draw upon many of Heidegger’s ideas to enrich and deepen his own concept of nihilism. Heidegger thought that metaphysics was the history of the forgetting of Being, of how things are. Heidegger viewed philosophy from Plato to Nietzsche as a history of metaphysics. Since Plato, the question of Being had been pushed aside by metaphysics in favour of the question of truth, and of the relationship between subject and object. Yet the question of truth ignores the prior ontological question, for both subject and object exist. Metaphysics, through the use of reason, establishes foundations upon which truth is made objective and to which one ‘must give one’s assent or conform’ (Vattimo, 1999: 43).  Heidegger undercuts this establishment of foundations through his notion of the human being as ‘Dasein’. The term ‘Dasein’ refers to the human being as that which always has a pre-ontological interpretation of the world. This itself is given by the contingencies of how one is ‘thrown’ into the world, such as where, when and in what kind of environment one is brought up. In Vattimo’s reading of Heidegger, the end of metaphysics entails the same consequence as the death of God: nihilism and the emancipation of different interpretations, the latter no longer held to account by rationalistic metaphysics.

In his reading of Heidegger, Vattimo sees metaphysics reaching its point of culmination in modern technology. Before looking at Vattimo’s specifically nihilistic reading of Heidegger on technology, it is necessary to outline Heidegger’s thoughts on the issue. In ‘The Question Concerning Technology’ and Identity and Difference, Heidegger states that the essence of technology is not something technological: it is not merely instrumental, but also a way of revealing. The idea of ‘revealing’ comes from Heidegger’s phenomenological rejection of Kant divorcing how things appear to us from how they really are; Heidegger thought they are connected, and the appearance of something in our consciousness is how it is revealed to us, how it is brought into unconcealment. Every unconcealment also conceals, however, as our knowledge of beings is always fragmentary; there is always more to the essence of a thing than is revealed to us. Technology’s role in unconcealment for Heidegger is evident in the interest he pays to the ancient Greek etymology of techné, which emphasises technology’s role in ‘opening up’ and ‘revealing’. Techné is a form of poeisis, a Greek term for a poetic revealing that is a bringing-forth from unconcealment, whether an artisan brings-forth a chalice which was previously a potential chalice, or whether blossom brings itself into bloom. Primitive technology allowed nature to reveal itself ‘poetically’, such as a farmer watching crops grow and harvesting them or a windmill converting the energy generated by the wind when it blew. Industrial technology, on the other hand, ‘challenges’ nature by placing an unreasonable demand on it, forcing it to produce what is required of it by humans. For example, with man-made hydroelectricity dams the mode of revealing is a ‘challenging forth’, the way in which the river reveals itself is no longer the same. Rather than the Rhine appearing poetically as water flowing as a feature of a larger landscape, modern technology has made it become an energy resource. Equally, tourism cannot see the Rhine as an object of nature, but rather merely as a source of income. All nature is challenged in this way. Humans are also challenged, for they are reduced to the level of objects used for production. For example, human resources departments can be viewed as regarding humans as resources for production. A Humans waiting to go to work is, in this industrial society, like an aeroplane on a runway, having little value being brought-forth themselves, but only for something else; essentially both are ‘standing reserve’, valuable only when employed and at the mercy of a system which uses and manipulates them as and when required. The term for this type of revealing which is a challenging on a global scale is Ge-Stell (enframing). Ge-Stell is the culmination of metaphysics because it involves the total planning of everything in perfectly ordered relationships of cause and effect, all capable of unlimited manipulation.

Heidegger had a negative view of technology because of its nihilistic conclusion as the culmination of metaphysics. While Vattimo agrees with Heidegger’s critique of technology, he also sees liberating opportunities provided by it. These arise principally through drawing upon Heidegger’s later work: the notion of ‘the first flashing up of Ereignis’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 26), where Vattimo references Heidegger’s Identity and Difference. In Vattimo’s reading of this quotation, time spent considering Ge-Stell leads to an understanding of the event-like nature of Being through the Ereignis, the event of transpropriation. Heidegger’s later work is less interested in Dasein as the home or determining site of Being. Rather, Being is a horizon in which things appear, ‘the aperture within which alone man and the world, subject and object, can enter into relationship’ (Vattimo, 2004: 6). For the later Heidegger, Being is a series of irruptions, or ‘events’. There is a Selbst (same) which ‘sends’, or ‘destines’ (Geschick) these events, although it is wrong to think of the Selbst as a being, for this would be to repeat metaphysics. Demonstrating the influence of both Heidegger and Gadamer, Vattimo thinks that Being is nothing other than language. Therefore, the way Being appears to us is in a series of historical announcements (events) that colour our interpretation of the traces of Being from previous epochs (the sendings of Being). The traces of Being are transmitted through linguistic traditions into which we – as Dasein – are always already thrown.

Vattimo extends Heidegger’s understanding of technology to take into account contemporary communications technology. In the play of images and messages attained through media such as television, radio and the internet, the difference between subject and object dissolves. For instance, one may doubt that someone’s online profile is ‘real’. Moreover, how could one ever verify its claim to representing reality? In the Ereignis which results from Ge-Stell, metaphysical designations such as ‘subject’ and ‘object’ disappear as everything is challenged-forth. In the Enlightenment era, the rational Cartesian ‘thinking thing’ is not only the subject, but also the foundation of knowledge.  This anthropocentrism continued in different ways through the construction of unilinear narratives surrounding progress and science. As Ge-Stell challenges the distinction between humans and things as they are all reduced to causal determined standing-reserve, capable of manipulation, the Ereignis is the ‘event of appropriation’ that Vattimo considers a ‘trans-propriation’. In the Ereignis, humanity and Being (traditionally considered as that which grounds the rule of reason) lose their metaphysical properties of subject and object. As a result, Being is shown not as a foundation or a thing, but as an ‘exchange value’: as ‘language and… the tradition constituted by the transmission and interpretation of messages’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 26).

c. Ontology, ‘Exchange Value’ as Language, and Verwindung as Resignation

Before discussing exactly how language and tradition function within Vattimo’s philosophy, it is worth examining why he concerns himself with ontology at all. Some philosophers take the end of metaphysics to constitute a total departure from ontology, for they feel it is too closely associated with metaphysical foundationalism. Vattimo’s problem with this view is that a non-ontological approach to knowledge once again locates the origin of knowledge in beings, and in a manner that pertains to their own realms. Yet beings will plan and organise their realms such that an authority akin to the one previously associated with metaphysical Being is postulated of beings. This could lead to a relativism in which local epistemologies or groups are incapable of external criticism. Moreover, relativism may itself take on the appearance of a metaphysical principle.

Rather than approaching the end of metaphysics from a relativistic standpoint or retreating into a local epistemology, Vattimo looks at the postmodern experience through a nihilistic ontology. The postmodern experience is fragmented, since the ‘death of God’ means that there is an irreducible plurality of perspectives on the world. This fragmentation is exacerbated by the society of mass communication. Nevertheless, for Vattimo there are traces of traditions by which we can – and must – orient ourselves. It is in this sense that Vattimo contends that Being is reduced to ‘exchange value’. Our experience of existence is absorbed into the language we use. This language is taken from traces of traditions from past epochs. What Vattimo considers to be potentially liberating – our ‘sole opportunity’ and ‘nihilistic vocation’ – is how we approach, consider, and re-use the traces of Being from past traditions. This process involves the Heideggerian concept Verwindung.

Verwindung has multiple meanings for Vattimo, such as being resigned to tradition, yet also distorting or ‘twisting’ it and as a result getting better from it as a form of ‘convalescence’ from the ‘metaphysical malady’ (Vattimo, 2006: 151); metaphysics cannot be overcome by standing it ‘on its head’ (Vattimo, 2006: 151), for this would be to lay another foundation. Rather, Vattimo thinks that metaphysics can only be overcome by a long convalescence. To this end, Vattimo contrasts Verwindung with an Überwindung (overcoming) of modernity or an Aufhebung (dialectical overcoming in the Hegelian sense). If one were to overcome modernity, to leave metaphysics behind altogether, it would be to create a new foundation; whether locally, in the relativist sense described above, or as a new global epistemological foundation, one would be repeating the metaphysical tendency to create foundations. Moreover, in modernity Being was reduced to the value of the new. After the ‘death of God’, the geschick (the epoch of history of Being) in which we are living is one of dislocation where the narrative of progress has been demythologised.

If metaphysics is not to be overcome, but ‘twisted’, what does this involve and how does it happen? Lexically, Verwindung

is a convalescence (in the sense of ‘ein Krankheit verwinden’: to heal, to be cured of an illness) and a distorting (although this is a rather marginal meaning linked to ‘winden’, meaning ‘to twist’, and to the sense of a deviant alteration which the prefix ‘ver—‘ also possesses). The notion of ‘convalescence’ is linked to another meaning as well, that of ‘resignation’…Besides these meanings of the term, there is that of ‘distortion’ to consider as well (Vattimo, 1988a: 172-173).

This notion of Verwindung is related to Vattimo’s view of nihilism as our sole opportunity. He follows Nietzsche in referring to an ‘accomplished nihilism’, one which aims at creating one’s own values after the highest values have been dissolved. The opportunity of accomplished nihilism is limited by language, and this is where Verwindung comes into play:

Tradition is the transmitting of linguistic messages that constitute the horizon within which Dasein is thrown as an historically determined project: and tradition derives its importance from the fact that Being, as a horizon of disclosure in which things appear, can arise only as a trace of past words (Vattimo, 1988a: 120).

The exchange value of Being is like that of a common currency in the community. Another phrase Vattimo uses to show the inescapable influence of the metaphysical tradition is ‘the ontology of decline’: that we are living in ‘the Occident’ which is ‘the land of sunset (and hence, of Being)’. This nostalgia is a form of resignation, since one cannot escape metaphysics without creating a new foundation. Yet in doing so, one would succumb to the sort of authoritarianism one wishes to escape.

d. ‘Weak Thought,’ Hermeneutics and Verwindung as Convalescence-Alteration

In the postmodern experience, Dasein is thrown into an existence in which experience is fragmented. Furthermore, in this existence thought is limited by the common currency of Being as a collection of linguistic traces mediated by tradition. One cannot overcome metaphysics as a history of Being without falling into authoritarianism. However, in recognising the flaws of authoritarianism, one tacitly realises nihilism as the sole opportunity to find liberation. Such liberation occurs through weakening the traces of the tradition into which one is thrown. Nostalgic resignation, according to Vattimo, is not mere acceptance. The Being of Dasein is interpretative, and therefore the reception of traces of tradition is active, rather than passive. This is the active nihilism of Nietzsche’s ‘philosophy of the morning’. In Vattimo’s work, it is what came to be known in the early 1980s as the philosophical style of ‘weak thought’. Through Andenken and Sorge (care) one recollects the traces of Being handed down though the linguistic tradition. In receiving these traces, however, one interprets them in accordance with the sending of Being – the horizon – into which one is thrown. Nostalgia is also a recovery in that it involves a rewriting of the tradition. The sending of Being is an event rather than an unchanging essence, as it would be on a Platonic conception of Being.

If Being is the experience of existence, and Being is linguistic, then the issue of interpretation will come into play when expressing one’s existence. During the event of the sending of Being, one cannot conceive of traces of Being as simply true when recollecting them, that they are not ‘facts’ to be remembered. Therefore, although Vattimo sees Verwindung as a resignation to Being, it is an ironic remembrance rather than a total acceptance of it. Through recollecting and twisting traces of Being in light of the event of the sending of Being, one weakens strong truth claims. As a result, one is ‘healed’ from what Vattimo considers to be the violence of metaphysics. This ‘convalescent’ aspect of Verwindung occurs through the hermeneutical event of the act of interpretation. Determined in this manner, Vattimo’s philosophy of ‘weak thought’ involves a withdrawal from metaphysics by avoiding new foundations or complete assent to any position.

4. Return to Religion

a. Reasons behind Vattimo’s Return to Religion

On the face of it, Vattimo’s philosophy does not appear to be integrally connected to religion. Nevertheless, a significant proportion of Vattimo’s writings in the last twenty years have been devoted to religion and religious themes. Vattimo’s return to writing on religion was gradual, comprising only brief mentions in his works in the late 1980s, but appearing prominently in the 1990s. While personal factors, including old age and the death of loved ones, brought him back to his faith, Vattimo is first and foremost a theorist. During that period, the profile of religion in society was growing through the Iranian Revolution and the role of Pope John Paul II in the breakdown of Communism. Vattimo developed his ideas on religion as an extension of his philosophies of hermeneutical nihilism, ‘weak thought’, and the relation of metaphysics to ontology. This largely entailed a reading of Heidegger through which the gradual weakening of metaphysics, rather than its return, is anticipated. Nevertheless, metaphysics cannot simply be overcome; it must be worked through in the forms of life we have inherited and are developing. The forms of life and traditions we inherit are the limits of our thought and language. Being is disclosed within language, so it is disclosed within cultural horizons. Hermeneutical nihilism leaves room for faith by dissolving the authoritarianism of reason.

Vattimo feels compelled to ascertain the implications of hermeneutical nihilism and ‘weak thought’ for Christianity. He sees Christianity as a set of beliefs and practices synonymous with Europe, and an inalienable facet in the formation of his character and personal life. Vattimo goes beyond merely applying his idea of ‘weak thought’ to Christianity. He twists Christianity in accordance with Verwindung, yet views the message of Christianity as a stimulus. This stimulus explains the sending of Being in late modernity as an irreducible plurality of interpretations. In part, this conception is the result of Vattimo’s acquaintance with the work of René Girard, whose notion of the ‘natural sacred’ he sees as a transcription of Heidegger’s attitude to Being.

b. The Philosophical Importance of the Christian Message in Vattimo’s Thought

René Girard’s theological anthropology has focussed on the importance of Christ’s death and resurrection in revealing the mechanisms that underpin society. On Girard’s view, natural religions are founded upon the need to create victims to keep order in society. The mimetic drive in humans to desire what the other has escalates until violence threatens to consume society. A sacrificial scapegoat is killed to prevent the society’s destruction. Over time this becomes ever more ritualised and assumes a sacral and divine character. Girard sees the Old and New Testaments as intended to reveal this victim-based mechanism. Jesus’ purpose was not, as Christian theology proposes, to be the perfect sacrifice for his father. Instead, Girard thinks that Jesus was put on the cross due to his revelation of this mechanism. Vattimo, who likewise considers the sacred to involve violence, saw the potential for adaptation of Girard’s notion of the natural sacred. Unlike Girard, Vattimo does not see Jesus as revealing an anthropological truth (the victim-based mechanism). Vattimo instead sees Jesus as the instigator of the desacralising weakening that has come to fruition in modernity. This weakening occurs through the exposition of the tendency of religions to be authoritarian and violent, particularly in demanding sacrifice.

Vattimo sees Heidegger’s philosophy ‘as an active…revelation of the same victimary mechanism that Girard makes us discover in the Judeo-Christian Scripture’ (Vattimo, 2010: 80). Vattimo thinks that Heidegger’s philosophy is a transcription of the Judeo-Christian revelation, especially as the latter is interpreted by Girard. For Girard, this is ‘the basic victimary structure of all human culture; for Heidegger, it exposes the “secret” of metaphysics, which is the forgetting of Being and the identification of it with beings, objectivity etc.’ (Vattimo, 2010: 81). The meaning of history for both Girard and Heidegger, as Vattimo reads them, is emancipation from violence. Vattimo sees in Girard a link between the ‘violent’ God of metaphysics and the violence he sees in metaphysics, broadly following Heidegger’s understanding of it. The notion of God referred to here is the onto-theological, maximising concept of God containing the attributes of omnipotence, omniscience, and judgment. In his introduction to Vattimo and Girard’s Christianity, Truth and Weakening Faith, Pierpaolo Antonello makes clear the link between Girard and Vattimo:

The rupture of the sacrificial circle, accomplished by the Judeo-Christian revelation (in Girard’s terms) or the kenosis of God through the incarnation (in Vattimo’s), launched a historical development that culminates in the present age (Antonello, 2010: 9).

For Girard, the culmination is the present age in which humans have a decision to continue with mimetic rivalry and the sacrifice of scapegoats even when it has become fully exposed. The exposition has taken place at an apocalyptic level, that of the brink of a global nuclear holocaust, and through Jesus’ call for charity. For Vattimo, the culmination is the realisation of the process of secularisation in hermeneutics.

Reading Girard helped Vattimo to reappraise Christianity, and to see faith in Christ as faith in the weakening of strong structures. Vattimo began to connect Girard’s theological anthropology to Heidegger’s attitude to Being. The violence of the natural sacred is akin, in Vattimo’s eyes, to the violence of metaphysics. Girard also impressed on Vattimo the importance of Christ for explaining the current situation of hermeneutical nihilism. While Girard focussed on his notions of mimesis and the natural sacred, Vattimo translated these ideas into terms borrowed from the language of theology. Vattimo draws upon the ‘incarnation’ in a variety of ways, principally through the closely related notion of kenosis, a term often used in the Bible to refer to the ‘self-emptying’ of Christ (Philippians 2:7). In line with this association, Vattimo refers to a variety of Biblical passages in support of his understanding of kenosis. He quotes Hebrews 1:1-2 in Beyond Interpretation, one of the earlier extended pieces of writing in his return to religion. In that text Vattimo used kenosis to refer to the archetype of hermeneutic plurality in the West, comparing and contrasting it with other, less suitable (that is, in Vattimo’s view, metaphysical) candidates such as Aristotle’s claim that ‘Being is said in many ways’. For Vattimo, Aristotle’s contention remains a metaphysical statement, and hence is less suitable than Paul’s ‘prophetic’ alternative from Hebrews. The latter, Vattimo thinks, is a statement of weakening and of the message revealed in the incarnation of the Son of God. This message referred back to the prophets in the Old Testament, but also pointed forward to the Spirit speaking in many tongues at and after Pentecost (Acts 2). Vattimo uses this prophetic understanding of kenosis to challenge the idea of Wilhelm Dilthey’s that hermeneutics is a ‘general philosophy’ which grew out of the move away from metaphysical dogmatism. Instead, Vattimo uses kenosis to ground hermeneutics more fundamentally as a longstanding, archetypal tradition of the West. For Vattimo, ‘kenosis’ and ‘incarnation’ also reconfigure the relationship of the late-modern person to dogmatic thought, without overcoming it completely; it is a Verwindung rather than an Überwindung.

In other writings where Vattimo renews his focus on religion, Vattimo uses kenosis to refer to a process he calls ‘secularisation’. Through it, a message of weakening is passed down and weakens strong structures, including both the essence and the fulfilment of the Christian message. Vattimo invokes the notion of secularisation in Beyond Interpretation and in earlier writings, but without the precision he gives to the concept in Belief and After Christianity. In these later works, kenosis is the abasement of God. This can be understood as Him emptying himself of power and of otherness (Philippians 2:7), or as Christ calling humans to be friends rather than servants (John 15:15). Again utilising theological terms, Vattimo regards ‘salvation’ as reinterpreting Jesus’ words, and that we now feel free to reinterpret his words is evidence of salvation manifesting through history; the inauguration of the process of secularisation as weakening that occurred with kenosis has dissolved the strong structures (metaphysical, political, religious) that had restricted the possibilities of scriptural interpretation. Further weakening (for it is a process that never ends), Vattimo believes, occurs by weakening strong structures, living charitably and being open to others.

Vattimo draws upon the ideas of 12th century theologian Joachim of Fiore in this regard. Joachim saw history as divided into stages corresponding to the Trinity and the canon. The stage of the ‘Father’ pertained to the Old Testament, and this was about discipline. The stage of the ‘Son’ corresponded to the New Testament, and this was about the rise of the Church. Finally, the stage of the Spirit would eventually be a spiritual reading of scripture (one that rejects literalism and claims to objectivity) and greater interpretative freedom. Although Vattimo rejects literal prophecy as archaic, he is interested in a spiritual reading of scripture and doctrine. He sees the hermeneutics of the late-modern period as having a relationship to scripture and doctrine similar to the one Jesus has to the Old Testament: ‘you heard it was said…but I tell you…’ (Antitheses, Matthew 5). Indeed, Vattimo sees the hermeneutical nihilism of the postmodern era as the result of secularisation. That is, as the result of the kenosis of God that gradually liberates humanity from the myth of objectivity. On this issue, Vattimo relies heavily on the link between Jesus in Girard’s writing and the weakening of Being in Heidegger’s thought.

5. Ethics

Vattimo sees his philosophy of hermeneutical nihilism as having important ethical ramifications. As Vattimo claims that there are no facts, only interpretations, he opposes moral realism and any claim to objectivity in morals. Instead, Vattimo argues for an ‘ethics of finiteness’ which can be best summarised in the following passage from his recent work, A Farewell to Truth

[An ethic of finiteness should be] understood neither as the compulsion to leap into the void (much twentieth-century religious thought argues this line: acknowledgement of finiteness prepares the leap into faith, hence only a God can save us) nor as the definitive assumption of the alternatives concretely presented by the situation. An ethic of finiteness is one that strives to keep faith with the discovery of the always insuperable finite situatedness of one’s own provenance, while not forgetting the pluralistic implications of this discovery (Vattimo, 2011: 96).

Thus, in the face of nihilism, one should seek safety in the Other as expressed in the philosophies of Levinas or Derrida. On Vattimo’s view, these philosophers conceive of secularisation ‘as the fall in which God’s transcendence as the wholly other can be revealed through dialectical reversal’ (Vattimo, 2002: 37). Vattimo instead contends that one should acknowledge one’s situatedness, that of being a thrown project (we are born in a specific time, place, and with a particular background). The effect of this realisation should guard against strong thought. As he concedes in recent works, strong thought has in fact re-emerged in the late 20th and early 21st centuries. Vattimo’s ethics are therefore not normative in the conventional sense, but focus instead on encouraging the recognition of both one’s situatedness and the provisionality of one’s worldview.  Ethically, one should take a step backwards from one’s immediate situation. Although one’s cultural horizon constitutes the limit of thought, this does not entail outright moral relativism. One should be able to refrain from following the ethnic, cultural, religious or political principles local to one’s identity, since a lack of objective first principles does not warrant an immediate retreat into local rationalities. What is required is a disposition in accordance with the event of Being of the late modern, an the ability to step back from one’s immediate situation in order to take other people and their beliefs, values, and traditions into account.

In addition to stepping back from one’s immediate situation, the other main element of Vattimo’s ethics is the weakening of strong structures. Operating here is the influence of the traditionally Christian virtue of caritas (‘charity’), although Vattimo interprets this concept though his theory of ‘weak thought’. Vattimo sees caritas as the force driving secularisation, the application of the message of the kenosis of God through the interpretative act. Kenosis itself is an act of God showing his love for his creatures by emptying himself of his power and authority, and by calling us to be friends rather than servants. Indeed, it is possible to see caritas and kenosis as identical; kenosis is the message of the weakening of God, and caritas is the message of weakening as a formal principle. Imitating God is listening to the message of kenosis, of his weakening, and following it as if following a formal principle. In Vattimo’s case, the principle is of reducing violence by dissolving strong structures by interpreting and questioning them. As to whether caritas is itself metaphysical, Vattimo states that it ‘is not really ultimate and does not possess the peremptoriness of the metaphysical principle, which cannot be transcended’ (Vattimo, 1999: 64). Lacking the quality of being ‘ultimate’ is due paradoxically to caritas itself, since it is a principle of weakening. Its status as the kernel of revelation is guaranteed through Vattimo’s reading of kenosis as the heart of the New Testament, and his understanding of ‘love’ as God’s love shown through the message of his weakening.

For Vattimo caritas is the limit of secularisation. It is that which cannot be secularised and is the standard by which beliefs and practices should be judged when entering the secular public space. For instance, wearing the cross is not, Vattimo judges, offensive any longer because it has been secularised and is part of the cultural furniture of the West. However, the mindset involved in wearing the chador does not exhibit caritas as it is an example of strong thought. Those who wear or endorse the wearing of Islamic dress have not ‘read the signs of the times’, since the wearing of the chador is ‘an affirmation of a strong identity’ (Vattimo, 2002: 101). This mindset does not recognise the provisional nature and situatedness of its own provenance, nor does it accept the plurality of other views in the secular space of modern Europe. Therefore, Vattimo argues, it should not be legally permitted to express itself through such dress codes. Hence caritas prevents one from retreating into and cementing local identities in the absence of objective reality and objective values. However, Vattimo does not explore the possibility that the chador could be worn out of choice in a ‘weak’ sense.

Caritas rules out both specific normative positions and broader meta-ethical approaches. Concerning the latter, Vattimo is against anything that flouts ‘Hume’s law’ that one cannot derive an ‘ought’ from an ‘is’. The claim ‘torture is wrong’ can lead to ‘one should not torture’ only with the bridging statements ‘torture causes pain’ and ‘pain is wrong’. However, one must then explain why pain is wrong. Vattimo may well agree that one should minimise pain, but he would not do so on naturalistic grounds. This is because he does not believe that one can derive normative ethical prescriptions from rational observance of nature or eternal forms. Such a move would always entail that some people — such as Plato’s ‘philosopher kings’ — will claim authoritative knowledge of the link between nature and normativity. Vattimo justifies his approach in two ways. Firstly, he critiques the metaphysical nature of naturalistic meta-ethics. Secondly, he claims that the abuse of naturalistic ethics by elites is manifest in the position of the Catholic Church on sexual ethics (prohibition of homosexual acts and the use of artificial contraception) and medical or bio-ethics (prohibitions against euthanasia).

6. Political Philosophy

Vattimo was a Marxist during his youth. He eventually moved away from Marxism when he realised that some of his students’ metaphysical commitments were leading them to violent acts. This pushed him to develop his hermeneutics in the direction of weakening metaphysical strong structures of all forms, including Marxist commitments. Drawing upon the implications of hermeneutics for politics, Vattimo warns against specialists, technocrats, and any kind of leadership that presumes exclusive knowledge of the truth by which to lead a country. Likening these kinds of individuals to Plato’s philosopher kings, Vattimo sees any such form of governance as falling prey to the myth about objective truth. Rather, Vattimo argues, politics should be bounded by the cultural horizon of its time and place. In this sense, Vattimo consciously limits politics and politicians in the way Thomas Kuhn limited the claims of scientists with his ‘paradigm’ concept. Eternal forms and objective truths are replaced with provisional judgements. These are based on forms of life limited and constituted by cultural horizons and re-interpreted linguistic traditions.

Plato’s philosopher kings — the specialists, experts, and technocrats — can lead to totalitarianism, which Vattimo is keen to avoid. If the laws that run society were objective, Vattimo thinks that democracy would be an irrational choice. However, a ‘weak ontology’ or a ‘philosophy of weakening’ can provide reasons for preferring liberal democracy over totalitarianism. Vattimo relates totalitarian government to Heidegger’s ‘Ge-Stell’, and claims that within the Ge-Stell there is the first flashing-up of Ereignis. This aperture enables one to see that truth is not found in ‘presence’. Rather, it is based in historical events and the consensus formed within cultural horizons. Individuals can liberate themselves from facilitating government agendas through this realisation. Governments themselves can change through acknowledging the provisional and culturally-bound nature of thought. Although Vattimo aimed to move away from revolutionary violence, his justification of democracy over totalitarianism is particularly timely given the Arab Spring.

In recent years Vattimo has returned to a weakened Marxism, a form of Communism deeply informed by his philosophy of ‘weak thought’. Attempting to distance himself from the kind of Communism put into practice in the Soviet era, Vattimo claims that the problem with the traditional understanding of Marx is that his ideas have been framed metaphysically. Vattimo therefore looks to create a post-metaphysical Marxism. As with Catholicism, Vattimo realises one cannot overcome Marxism, but that it should be twisted. ‘Hermeneutic Communism’ is presented by Vattimo and his collaborator Santiago Zabala as an alternative to forms of liberal capitalism that aim to keep the status quo in favour of those benefitting from the system. Equally, they see it as an alternative to forms of Marxism that involve unilinear historicism.

7. References and Further Reading

The list of works by Vattimo is a non-exhaustive list, covering his major works in translation. Literature on Vattimo is growing. For works about Vattimo, the Benso and Zabala edited volumes are good places to start, covering a range of his work.

a. Works by Vattimo

  • The End of Modernity: Nihilism and Hermeneutics in Postmodern Culture. Trans. J. R. Snyder. Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press 1988a.
  • “Metaphysics, Violence, Secularisation.” Trans. B. Spackman. In Recoding Metaphysics: The New Italian Philosophy. Edited by G. Borradori. Evanston: Northwestern University Press 1988b, 45-61.
  • “Toward an Ontology of Decline Recoding Metaphysics.” Trans. B. Spackman. In Recoding Metaphysics: The New Italian Philosophy. Edited by G. Borradori. Evanston: Northwestern University Press 1988c.
  • The Transparent Society. Trans. D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press 1992.
  • The Adventure of Difference: Philosophy after Nietzsche and Heidegger. Trans. C. P. Blamires and T. Harrison. Cambridge: Polity Press 1993.
  • Beyond Interpretation: The Meaning of Hermeneutics for Philosophy. Trans. D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1997.
  • With J. Derrida. Religion. Stanford: Stanford University Press 1998.
  • Belief. Trans. L. D’Isanto and D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press 1999.
  • Nietzsche: An Introduction. Trans. N. Martin. Stanford: Stanford University Press 2002.
  • After Christianity. Trans. L. D’Isanto. New York: Columbia University Press 2002.
  • Nihilism and Emancipation: Ethics, Politics, and Law. Foreword by Richard Rorty. Edited by Santiago Zabala and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2004.
  • With R. Rorty. The Future of Religion. Edited by Santiago Zabala. New York: Columbia University Press 2005.
  • Dialogue with Nietzsche. Trans. William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2006.
  • With John D. Caputo. After the Death of God. Edited by Jeffrey W. Robbins. New York: Columbia University Press 2007.
  • With Piergiorgio Paterlini. Not Being God: A Collaborative Autobiography. Trans. William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2009.
  • With René Girard. Christianity, Truth and Weakening Faith: A Dialogue. Edited by Pierpaolo Antonello. New York: Columbia University Press 2010.
  • The Responsibility of the Philosopher. Edited by Franca D’Agostini and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2010.
  • A Farewell to Truth. Trans. William McCuaig, with a foreword by Robert T. Valgenti. New York: Columbia University Press 2011.
  • With Santiago Zabala. Hermeneutic Communism: From Heidegger to Marx. New York and Chichester, West Sussex: Columbia University Press, 2011.

b. Works on Vattimo

  • Benso, S., Schroeder, B, eds. Between Nihilism and Politics: The Hermeneutics of Gianni Vattimo. New York: SUNY 2010.
  • Borradori, G. ““Weak Thought” and Postmodernism: The Italian Departure from Deconstruction.” Social Text 18 (Winter, 1987-1988), 39-49.
  • Depoortere, F. Christ in Postmodern Philosophy. London: T&T Clark 2008.
  • Guarino, T. Vattimo and Theology. New York: Continuum 2009.
  • Pireddu, Nicoletta. “Gianni Vattimo.” In Postmodernism, edited by Johannes Willem Bertene and Joseph P. Natoli. Boston: Blackwell 2002, 302-9.
  • Woodward, Ashley. “Nihilism and the Postmodern in Vattimo’s Nietzsche.” Minerva 6 (2002), 51-67.
  • Zabala, Santiago, ed. Weakening Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Gianni Vattimo. Montreal and Kingston, London, Ithaca: McGill-Queen’s University Press 2007.

c. Other Works Cited

  • Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, eds. Nietzsche: Werke. Kritische Gesamtausgabe. Berlin and New York, 1967ff.


Author Information

Matthew Edward Harris
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom

Last updated: May 1, 2013 | Originally published: