Giambattista Vico is often credited with the invention of the philosophy of history. Specifically, he was the first to take seriously the possibility that people had fundamentally different schema of thought in different historical eras. Thus, Vico became the first to chart a course of history that depended on the way the structure of thought changed over time.
To illustrate the difference between modern thought and ancient thought, Vico developed a remarkable theory of the imagination. This theory led to an account of myth based on ritual and imitation that would resemble some twentieth century anthropological theories. He also developed an account of the development of human institutions that contrasts sharply with his contemporaries in social contract theory. Vico's account centered on the class struggle that prefigures nineteenth and twentieth century discussions.
Vico did not achieve much fame during his lifetime or after. Nevertheless, a wide variety of important thinkers were influenced by Vico’s writings. Some of the more notable names on this list are Johann Gottfried von Herder, Karl Marx, Samuel Taylor Coleridge, James Joyce, Benedetto Croce, R. G. Collingwood and Max Horkheimer. References to Vico’s works can be found in the more contemporary writings of Jürgen Habermas, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Alasdair MacIntyre and many others.
There is no question that his work is difficult to grasp. Vico’s style is challenging. Further, he is heavily influenced by a number of traditions that many philosophers may find unfamiliar: the natural law tradition of thinkers like Grotius; the Roman rhetorical tradition of authors like Quintillian; and the current science and anthropology of his day. Nevertheless, Vico’s theories on culture, language, politics and religion are deeply insightful and have excited the imaginations of those who have read him.
Giambattista Vico was born in a small room above his father’s bookshop on the Via San Biagio dei Librai in the old center of Naples on June 23rd, 1668 . His family was poor, and Giambattista was the sixth of eight children (Auto 215-6). Vico recounts that at the age of seven he fell from the top of a ladder, probably in his father’s bookshop, and seriously injured his head. He had to spend three years recovering from the injury (Auto 111), and for most of his life he complained of bouts of ill health.
Upon his recovery, Vico studied scholastic philosophy and jurisprudence. He worked with a number of Jesuit tutors, but as he grew older he taught himself these traditions (Auto 118). From 1686 to 1695, Vico worked as a tutor for the Rocca family in Vatolla, approximately 100 kilometers from Naples. During this time, he gave up his study of scholastic philosophy, and concentrated on the study of Plato and poets such as Virgil, Dante and Petrarch (Auto 120-2). Vico depicts these years as a time when he lived in isolation and during which Naples was overrun by Cartesian scientists (Auto 132). However, Vico was in contact with Naples during this period, and he completed his law degree during this time.
In 1699, Vico became a professor of rhetoric at the University of Naples, a position he held until 1741. He also married and later had three children. In 1709, Vico published his first major work On the Study Methods of Our Time which was a defense of humanistic education. This was followed in 1710 by his work on metaphysics: On the Ancient Wisdom of the Italians Unearthed From the Origins of the Latin Language. This was intended to be the first part of a trilogy including a volume on physics and a volume on moral philosophy. However, he never completed the remaining volumes. During this period, Vico recognized four authors as his most important influences: Plato, Tacitus, Grotius and Bacon.
Vico’s job as a professor of rhetoric was primarily to prepare students for law school; however, he desired to be promoted to the superior position of professor of law. To achieve this goal, he published his longest work, in three volumes, from 1720 to 1722, generally referred to as Universal Law (Il Diritto Universale). However, due to political circumstances, he was defeated in the contest for the chair, despite having superior credentials and doing better in the oral competition for the job (Auto 163-4).
Vico then abandoned his search for a chair of law and dedicated himself to explicating his own philosophy. To reach a wider audience, he began to write in Italian instead of Latin. In 1725 he published the first edition of his major work, New Science. Vico was dissatisfied with that text, however, and in 1730 published a radically different second edition. He continued to revise that text throughout his later years and the variation that was published in 1744 is considered his definitive work.
Vico sent copies of his works to influential thinkers in other parts of Europe. While he had little success achieving fame in the north, he did make a large impact in Venice. In 1725, Vico was contacted by a Venetian journal that was going to publish a series of essays written by scholars about their lives; he was the first and only contributor to the series. He updated his essay a few times and had it published as his Autobiography.
Vico did have some political influence in his later years. In 1734 Naples was retaken by the Spanish from the Austrians who had ruled it from 1704. The new viceroy named Vico the Royal Historiographer of Naples. Due to failing health, Vico’s son Gennaro took his chair of rhetoric in 1741 and Giambattista Vico died in 1744.
Vico is rightfully cast as a counter-Enlightenment thinker. In the face of the Enlightenment emphasis on doing natural science through the search for clear and distinct ideas, Vico saw himself as a defender of rhetoric and humanism. Many of Vico’s ideas are most easily grasped through a contrast with Cartesian rationalism and specifically Descartes’ emphasis on the geometric method. However, it is unclear exactly the extent to which Vico disagreed with the overall project of the Enlightenment. In a number of respects, Vico engaged in the same type of philosophical investigations as other eighteenth-century thinkers. He calls his main work a 'science', and claims Bacon as a major influence. Vico searched for a universal mental dictionary, and his science may be seen as its own type of encyclopedia. Further, recent scholarship suggests that Vico was heavily influenced by Malebranche. So while there is absolutely no question that Vico remains a staunch defender of ancient rhetoric, how much of the rest of the Enlightenment he rejects is a question.
The main debate between Vico and Descartes is over the value of the imagination and of rhetoric. In the opening of the Discourse on Method, Descartes rejects rhetoric and culture as sources of certainty. This implies, for Descartes, that there really is no value for these institutions. If one can state an idea clearly, then there is no need for rhetoric to defend it. While Descartes’ view was probably more subtle than this, as Cartesian science swept into Naples people began teaching children math and critique at the expense of training imagination.
Vico would devote most of his writings to stemming this tide by defending the importance of rhetoric. Vico began this defense in the Study Methods by claiming that children should develop their imaginations when they are young. This defense would continue in different forms until the New Science when Vico articulated the poetic wisdom which is an entire way of thinking based on the imagination and rhetoric. These points will be articulated below.
As professor of rhetoric, Vico was required to give inaugural orations each academic year. His first six orations are an extended defense of the study of virtue and the liberal arts; these orations have been translated and given the title On Humanistic Education. The seventh oration was expanded by Vico and published by him as a small book entitled On the Study Methods of Our Time. The subject of the work was to determine the best method by which to educate people: the Ancient method that emphasizes rhetoric and imagination; or the Cartesian method that emphasizes conceptual thought. His conclusion is that both methods are important (SM 6). However, because Vico actually defends the value of the Ancient method against the Cartesian method (which rejects the value of the ancient tradition), this work is seen as a cornerstone of Vico’s counter-Enlightenment stance.
Vico defines a study method as having three parts. The instruments are the systematic order by which the course of study progresses. The aids are the tools one would use along the course of study such as the books to read. The aims are the goals of the study (SM 6-8).
Vico spends the majority of the work criticizing the modern instruments of learning in favor of the ancient ones. The modern Cartesian method teaches the method of philosophical critique which concentrates on teaching students how to find error and falsity in one’s thinking. The emphasis is on critiquing ideas by finding weaknesses in their foundation (SM 13).
The ancient instrument is the art of topics. This is the art by which one uses the imagination to find connections between ideas. This art shows students how to make new arguments rather than critiquing the arguments of other people. In Aristotelean logic, it emphasizes finding middle terms in order to create persuasive syllogisms. Further, it shows how a speaker can find a connection with an audience that will make a speech persuasive (SM 14-16).
For Vico, the argumentis over whether to teach children to find faults with arguments or to create arguments imaginatively; he argues that both are necessary. However, it is essential to teach children the art of topics first. This is because children have naturally strong imaginations. This needs to be developed early. After the children have developed these strong imaginations, then they can learn Cartesian critique (SM 13-14).
Vico suggests it is vital to develop the imagination of children because imagination is essential for doing ethics. The Cartesian method is effective in those instances where geometric certainty may be found. However, in most ethical situations, this certainty will not be possible. In these cases, the art of topics is vital because it allows one to recognize the best course of action and persuade others to pursue that course. Prudent individuals are those who can use their imaginations to uncover new ways of looking at a situation rather than critiquing a pre-existing belief. So the imagination and the art of topics are vital for prudence in a way that the Cartesian method cannot satisfy (SM 33-34). This is Vico’s first attempt to defend the power of rhetoric against Descartes.
Perhaps the greatest significance of the Ancient Wisdom lies in its presentation of the verum-factum principle. This and the ideal eternal history are Vico’s two most famous ideas. The verum-factum principle holds that one can know the truth in what one makes. Vico writes, “For the Latins, verum (the true) and factum (what is made) are interchangeable, or to use the customary language of the Schools, they are convertible (Ancient Wisdom 45).”
This presents a serious challenge to Cartesian science. The Cartesians had always assumed that the natural world provided certain ideas while the human world -- the world of culture -- was uncertain. This principle turns that around. Because God made the natural world, only God can know it. Humans can understand the human world because humans made it. This provides the foundation for the New Science since it suggests that the true focus of science should be the human world not the natural world.
While Vico couches this in an etymology, he does provide another justification for it. Descartes famously used "I think therefore I am" to provide a first principle that refutes skepticism. Vico claims that this does not work because it does not entirely address the challenge of the skeptics. The skeptic knows that he or she exists. The skeptic does not, however, know anything significant about that existence because the skeptic cannot know the cause of his or her ideas (AW 55). The verum-factum principle solves the skeptic’s problem by explaining that since we are the cause of what we make, we can know what was made. Since humans have made the civil world, they can understand the cause of the civil world and know the truth about it. Thus the skeptic, who claims knowledge is impossible, is incorrect because it is possible to know the truth about what humans have made. For Vico, making something becomes the criteria for knowing the truth about it (AW 56).
It is important to note that Vico does not appear to hold that the only truth humans can know is of what humans make. Especially in his later writings, Vico holds that through the world humans make, humans can witness eternal truths such as the ideal eternal history and the verum-factum principle itself. The verum-factum principle ought to be read in conjunction with the verum/certum principle outlined in the Universal Law and discussed below (Verene, 1981, 56-7).
The majority of the Ancient Wisdom is spent on a metaphysics that culminates in Vico’s idea of metaphysical points. Vico regarded Descartes as a stoic who held a mechanistic view of the universe. Descartes himself was a dualist; however, Vico is looking at the Cartesian scientists who followed Descartes and saw in them an abandonment of any ultimate truth as well as a reduction of existence to the motion of bodies. Vico links this metaphysical view to the ethical stoic view that deemphasizes both freedom and the hope of finding transcendent wisdom. He argues for a dualistic view that establishes a strong separation between the physical and eternal. This allows for a Platonic ethics which calls for philosophers to move from the physical to witnessing a higher realm.
In the Ancient Wisdom, Vico tries to justify this separation by arguing that the physical world cannot move itself. The only source of motion is not found in the physical but in the infinite. The infinite lacks motion but can provide motion to the world through metaphysical points, those places in which the infinite provides motion (conatus) to the physical. Vico again provides a fanciful etymology for this, claiming that the Latin words for point and momentum were synonymous since both refer to indivisible entities (AW 69). While Vico attacks Descartes’ stoicism throughout his writings, it is unclear to what extent Vico retains to this particular metaphysical view.
The Ancient Wisdom is one of Vico’s first major attempts to use etymology as a philosophical tool. Vico claims that by understanding the origin of words, it is possible to understand an ancient wisdom that has valuable insight. In the Ancient Wisdom, this insight is into metaphysical truth. In the later works, these etymologies reveal the nature of human laws and customs. He often takes the names of mythological gods or Roman legal terms and uses them to derive lessons from the origins of these words. This use of etymology is consistent with Vico’s overriding goal of demonstrating that ancient wisdom is valuable and requires careful attention on the part of the reader.
These etymologies are almost always extremely problematic given later research that has been done on the origin of languages, which undercuts Vico’s interpretation. This presents a serious problem for people trying to find philosophical merit in Vico’s texts. However, two things are worth keeping in mind when looking at Vico’s etymologies and his later analysis of myth. First, Vico usually provides other forms of demonstration to make his points rather than just relying on etymology. Their failure rarely represents a serious undermining of the entire system. Second, Vico is trying to do philosophy in a new way that involves making connections rather than making Cartesian distinctions. It may be worth engaging these etymologies to see how Vico imaginatively constructs these connections without worrying as much about the validity of the etymologies. One does not want to be too apologetic for Vico; however, there are reasons for not dismissing his system entirely solely on the basis of the etymologies.
The Universal Law has been neglected in Vico scholarship because of its complexity and because it has only recently been translated into English. However, its three volumes taken together represent Vico’s longest work: On the One Principle and one End of Universal Law, On the Constancy of the Jurisprudent and Dissertations. It is often referred to as Il diritto universale. This is because the term diritto signifies a universal structure of law as opposed to legge which refers to particular laws made by particular individuals. English does not make this distinction.
The goal of this work is to show that all truth and all law (diritto) comes from God (On the One Principle 50, 54). Hence, he wants to demonstrate that there is truly one universal law in history. To do this, he needs to show that while there are different manifestations of the one law, they are all reducible to the one eternal law. He is not concerned with how one particular law (legge) may or may not fit the system, because there will be instances where bad judges make bad decisions. However, this does not mean that all law (diritto) is arbitrary. Indeed, Vico holds that there is still a consistency to history that reveals how God’s divine providence orchestrates the enactment of the natural law through the civil law.
The majority of the work consists in trying to understand the ways in which different societies in history enacted the eternal law differently. He does this through fanciful etymologies and extended interpretations of Roman law. This work has many of the same characteristics of the New Science but lacks a full explanation of the poetic wisdom underlying ancient myths.
The essential companion to the verum-factum principle is the verum/certum principle. Vico writes, “The certain is part of the true (On the One Principle 90).” This, as much as the verum-factum principle, represents Vico’s attitude toward history. By certain, Vico means the particular facts of history. So the principle is saying that by looking at particular facts of history, it is possible to discover universal truth. This principle justifies Vico’s use of philological and historical evidence to make metaphysical claims.
Not all certa are part of the true, however. Because humans are free, they can make bad choices. So legislators are capable of passing bad laws as well as good laws. When a choice is made contrary to reason, a certum occurs that does not connect with universal truth (On the One Principle 90). At other times, these laws are rational and therefore part of the true. So when the philosopher tries to deduce the verum from the certum, the primary difficulty is in establishing which certa represent rational and true choices and which are bad certa and ought to be disregarded.
Vico sees laws as being rational when they are in accord with public utility (On the One Principle 91). A legislator’s laws are certain not because of a direct insight into the mind of God; rather, divine providence orchestrates history such that when legislators make decisions they find useful, they are unknowingly doing the work of divine providence (On the One Principle 65). In order to understand the eternal law, then, one has to first understand the necessity that different legislators faced through history. By understanding their responses one can see the motion of divine providence. So Vico does not grasp universal truth through a direct analysis of God’s will but rather by analyzing the way in which necessity led legislators to produce the institutions of history.
Vico defines the natural law by writing “the natural law proceeds from choosing the good that you know to be equitable (On the One Principle 66).” This law does not change; however, the way in which utility constitutes what it means to be equitable does change. Early in human history it is more equitable to give the rulers more power and more wealth to control the weak. As the need for this control lessens, wealth becomes distributed more evenly.
At the origin of humanity, there were families in which the fathers used violence and religious ritual to control their children. While the private law of the fathers was harsh, it gave stability to the families. These fathers were independent of each other and had no reason to fight. All the violence was directed internally in order to control their children.
Eventually, wandering people who did not have their own families and did not have anything checking their passions, wanted to benefit from the protection of the fathers. This created a practical problem for the fathers because they wanted to use the stragglers for their own ends but were afraid of revolution. Fathers from different families banded together to create the law of the greater gentes -- clans or tribes -- as a way of suppressing the newcomers (On the One Principle 97). Again, the fathers, who now constitute an aristocracy of nobles or heroes, are not particularly worried about fighting each other; they were worried primarily about controlling this new lower class of people.
Two things are of immediate significance in Vico’s account. First, Vico makes a strong connection between public law and private law. Indeed, the private law of the families leads to the public law of the nobles. Second, Vico is making an important case against social contract theory. Rather than society forming by an agreement of all its members, society is formed by the aristocrats who then, out of a sense of utility, impose a violent rule. Social contract theory does not make sense for Vico because it would take humans a long time to develop the ability to reason through such an agreement.
Much of the rest of Vico’s Universal Law explains history as an extended class struggle between the heroes who descended from the first fathers and the plebeians who descended from those who wandered into the gentes. Vico examines at length both ancient Roman myths and ancient Roman jurisprudence to show how utility, generated through the work of divine providence, directed this struggle. The detail with which Vico engages in this project is extraordinary. It is significant that Vico is unclear as to how this class struggle ends. He praises the Romans for their sense of virtue and the Law of the XII Tables (On the Constancy 257-276). However, what this means for the course of history is left unclear. Vico would not present his answer to this until he wrote the New Science.
The main problem Vico saw with the Universal Law is that it failed to portray clearly the origin of society. To grasp that origin, Vico developed a new critical art to reveal how the most ancient humans thought. This art rested on recognizing two conceits. Both of these conceits can be traced to a principle which Vico finds in Tacitus: “Because of the indefinite nature of the human mind, whenever it is lost in ignorance man makes himself the measure of all things (NS 120).” This axiom not only serves as a basis for these conceits but also the whole of poetic wisdom.
The conceit of nations holds that every nation thinks it is the oldest in the world and that all other nations derived their wisdom from them (NS 125). Because one nation does not understand the origin of others, it assumes all other nations learned from it. This conceit prevents nations from realizing that every nation actually had its own independent origin. Thus, they fail to realize that similarities between cultures do not indicate a common origin but instead indicate universal institutions that are necessary for all cultures.
The conceit of scholars is that scholars tend to assume that everyone thinks in the same way that contemporary scholars do (NS 127). This conceit has kept scholars from understanding both ancient mythology and ancient jurisprudence. By assuming the ancients thought the same way as moderns do, the scholars assume that ancient mythology is simply bad science and superstition. What the modern scholars fail to grasp is that the ancients actually were solving different problems in a radically different mental framework. The ancients were doing what they found to be useful; however, their way of thinking indicated radically different ideas of what was necessary and how to get it.
It is the conceit of scholars that thus provides the basis for the claim that Vico was the first true philosopher of history and an anticipation of Hegel. He was the first to try to explain how people thought differently in different eras. Further, he tries to show how one form of thinking led into another, thereby creating a cycle of history.
In order to overcome the prejudice of the conceit of scholars, Vico created a new “metaphysical art of criticism (NS348).” This art goes beyond the philological art of criticism which simply verifies the authenticity of particular facts. This new art distinguishes the truth in history from the accidental -- as dictated by the verum-certum principle -- by grasping the manner in which the first humans thought. This will allow the philosopher to witness the universal truth of the ideal eternal history, described below. While Vico does not clearly define this critical art, it is marked by elements he has always been working with: using rhetoric, creative etymologies and seeing connections rather than making distinctions.
The art reveals the way the first humans thought, which Vico calls 'poetic wisdom'. Vico uses the term wisdom to emphasize that this way of thinking has its own truth or validity that contemporary conceptual thinkers do not recognize. It is poetic because it is marked by imaginative creativity rather than discursive analysis.
Vico holds that poetic wisdom is fundamentally different from modern wisdom. The fundamental difference between the two is that modern wisdom uses reflection to create concepts while the poetic wisdom does not reflect but spontaneously generates imaginative universals which are described below. The poetic wisdom generates a common sense that is shared by an entire peoples (NS 142).
Vico places his new critical art in the context of a more general method for his New Science. The section of the New Science entitled ‘Method’ is a sharp departure from any sort of Cartesian science. It in no way involves the rigorous and clear movement from premises to conclusions advocated by Descartes. Instead, Vico describes three different types of proofs that will be employed by the science: 1) theological proofs which witness the movement of divine providence; 2) philosophical proofs which are based on the uniformity of poetic wisdom; and 3) philological proofs which recognize certain elements of history. These proofs rely more on recognizing the way in which ideas have to fit together to reveal hidden or divine patterns. The method of the science is to bring all these proofs together in a way that produces a coherent and true narrative. Vico writes, “We make bold to affirm that he who meditates this Science narrates to himself this ideal eternal history so far as he himself makes it for himself by that proof ‘it had, has, and will have to be’ (NS 348).” Rather than a Cartesian conceptual scheme, Vico’s science is one in which truth is attained by imaginatively linking different elements together to reveal the order of history.
An important example of the method of the New Science is revealed in Vico’s use of axioms (degnità). Traditionally, axioms have a fixed place in the order of geometric proofs following directly from definitions and proofs. Vico intends his axioms to be weaved imaginatively throughout all the ideas of the text (Goetsch). Vico describes this with this analogy, “just as the blood does in animate bodies, so will these elements (degnità) course through our Science and animate it (NS 199).”
While the conceit of scholars may be what is at the core of Vico’s significance, the ideal eternal history is, along with the verum-factum principle, Vico’s most famous concept. The ideal eternal history can be thought of loosely as a Platonic ideal. Stated in the abstract, the ideal eternal history is the perfect course through which all nations pass. In practice, each nation travels through it slightly differently.
Vico describes this ideal eternal history most colorfully when he gives this axiom: “Men first felt necessity, then look for utility, next attend to comfort, still later amuse themselves with pleasure, thence grow dissolute in luxury, and finally go mad and waste their substance (NS 241).” It is possible in the quote to see the same emphasis on utility that Vico had in the Universal Law. However, what changes is that this history is now presented clearly as a circular motion in which nations rise and fall. Nations eternally course and recourse through this cycle passing through these eras over and over again.
Vico divides the ideal eternal history into three ages which he adopts from Varro. Vico first used these three ages in the Universal Law but now he presents it with more clarity. Indeed, Book IV of the New Science is a comparison of how different human institutions existed differently in the three ages of history. Clearly the history of Rome is again Vico’s primary model for the ideal eternal history.
The first age is the age of gods. In this age, poetic wisdom is very strong. Again, there is an aristocracy of fathers who know how to control themselves and others through religion. These fathers, which Vico calls theological poets, rule over small asylums and the famuli who are wandering outsiders who come to them seeking protection. The famuli is the term Vico now uses for those who wandered into the lands of the fathers in the Universal Law.
The second age is the age of heroes. In this age, the famuli transform from being simple slaves to plebeians who want some of the privileges of the rulers. The theological poets transform into heroes. These heroes show their strength by fighting each other as illustrated in Homer. However, for Vico, the most important conflict is not between the heroes but between the heroes and the plebeians fighting for their own privileges.
The third age is the age of humans. Divine providence orchestrates the class wars so that the heroes inadvertently undermine themselves by conceding certain powers to the plebeians. The plebeians are able to build these concessions in order to advance a new way of thinking. In the previous ages, society was ruled by poetic wisdom which controlled all actions through ritual. In order to undermine the power of these rituals, the plebeians slowly found ways to assert the power of conceptual wisdom, which is the ability to think scientifically and rationally. This way of thinking gives the plebeians more power and removes the stranglehold of poetic wisdom on humanity.
Unfortunately, while this conceptual wisdom gives the plebeians their freedom, it undermines the cultural unity provided by poetic wisdom. While all in society become free and equal, the religious inspiration to work for the common good rather than the individual becomes lost. Society eventually splinters into a barbarism of reflection in which civil wars are fought solely for personal gain. This is the barbarism of reflection which returns society to its origin.
One of the major debates about the ideal eternal history is whether it is a circle or a spiral. Those who suggest that it is a spiral hold that each time a nation goes through the ideal eternal history, it improves. Those who suggest it is a circle hold that each cycle of the ideal eternal history really does reduce it back to its beginning. Unfortunately, this appears to be an instance where Vico had to remain silent because, had he tried to resolve the issue, he would have had to make some sort of comment on the relation of the church to society which he was not prepared to do. As a result, the debate about how best to read the ideal eternal history continues.
It is helpful to note that during Vico’s life and especially during the production of the New Science, the Inquisition was quite active in Naples. The Inquisition put some Neapolitain works on the Index and tried close friends of Vico (Bedani, 7-21).
What this means for Vico’s faith is unclear; however, it seemed to cause Vico to make a very important and awkward decision. Vico claims that while the ideal eternal history applies to all gentile nations, it does not apply to the Hebrews. This is because the Hebrews always had the revealed wisdom of God and did not need the pattern of the ideal eternal history to develop (NS 369). Hence, Vico leaves out any discussion of the Bible or any evidence about early Judaism as he constructs his science. As illustrated by The Universal Law, Vico clearly held that God existed and that it is God’s order that history passes through. So there is good reason to think Vico had a theistic foundation. It is unclear, however, whether Vico really held that the Hebrews were exempt from the Ideal Eternal History or if this was just a way of avoiding the Index.
Vico uses his new critical art to provide a better account of the origin of society than provided in The Universal Law. Vico explains the three principles of history: religion, marriage and burial. These are principles both in the sense that they are the first things in society and in that they lie at the core of social existence.
Vico posits that before human society there were giants roaming the earth who had no ability to check their violent passions. Eventually, a thunder strike occurred that was so violent it caused some of the giants to stop their passionate wanderings. These giants felt a fear that was unique because unlike a natural danger, it was produced by a cause the giants did not recognize (NS 377, 504). Since the giants did not understand the cause of the fear, other than the sky, they took what they knew (which was their own passion) and attributed it to a giant who lived in the sky. This gave birth to Jove, the first imaginative universal, which is discussed below.
Out of this terror, giants felt shame for the first time. Specifically, they were ashamed about copulating randomly and out in the open. Vico writes, “So it came about that each of them would drag one woman into his cave and would keep her there in perpetual company for the rest of their lives (NS 504).” This created the second imaginative universal, Juno. It also caused the giants to settle down in a particular area. They saw the need to keep this area clean so they began to bury their dead.
There is no question that this account of the origin of humanity is peculiar. Nevertheless, Vico finds the account satisfying because it does not place any rational decision making at the origin of society. Society does not develop in a social contract but in the spontaneous checking of passions that produces poetic wisdom.
The bulk of the New Science is the description of Poetic Wisdom. This is the way of mythic thinkers at the origin of society. It is also the manner of thinking that dominated society until the plebeians gained control of society through the class struggle. Vico goes into detail explaining things such as the poetic metaphysics, poetic logic, poetic economics and poetic geography. Throughout this section, Vico spells out the details of the development of the age of gods and then the breakdown of the age of heroes into the age of humans.
In this section, Vico explains his perhaps most controversial notion: what he calls the imaginative universals or the poetic characters. Some scholars, most notably Benedetto Croce, hold that this notion is a tragic problem on Vico’s part and is best ignored. Other scholars use the imaginative universal as a way to defend Vico as a champion of the philosophical need to use imagination and rhetoric. Vico himself saw the imaginative universal as the ‘master key’ to his New Science which seems to make the topic worth investigating (NS 34).
The imaginative universals are tricky to grasp, but two fairly non-contentious axioms can help provide a background. The first is that first language would be a combination of mute gestures and rudimentary, monosyllabic words (NS 225, 231). The second is that “Children excel in imitation; we observe that they generally amuse themselves by imitating whatever they are able to apprehend (NS 215).” This is connected to Vico’s notion that people grasp what they do not understand by relating it to something familiar. In the case of children, they use their powerful imaginations to understand things by copying their movements.
Vico speculates that the first humans must have had minds that resembled children. So, when they first started to use language, rather than naming objects conceptually, they imitated those objects with mute gestures and monosyllabic cries. Thus, when the thunder struck, the first people imitated the shaking of the sky and shouted the interjection pa (father) thereby creating the first word (NS 448).
This makes imaginative universals quite distinct from intelligible universals. An intelligible universal would be constructed through an act similar to what we would ordinarily think of as 'naming'. An imaginative universal is created through the repeated imitation of an event. Words are merely the associated sound that goes with that imitation. So, for Vico, the first words were actually rituals that served as metaphors for events.
A helpful passage for understanding this is found in Axiom XLVII. Vico writes, “Thence springs this important consideration in poetic theory: the true war chief, for example, is the Godfrey that Torquato Tasso imagines; and all the chiefs who do not conform throughout to Godfrey are not true chiefs of war (NS 205).” The imaginative universal, Godfrey, is the name used for anyone who performs the rituals of the true war chief. All true war chiefs actually become Godfrey through their actions. Vico applies this principle to the gods of the Roman pantheon. For example, anyone getting married becomes Juno and anyone practicing divination becomes Apollo. The bulk of the section on the poetic wisdom in the New Science endeavors to demonstrate how the first societies managed to create institutions solely through the use of these imaginative universals.
Many readers find Vico’s account of the imaginative universal utterly baffling. Vico’s challenging writing style, combined with the fanciful way in which he interprets ancient myths, make this section of the New Science a mystery for first-time readers. However, in approaching this section, it is helpful to remember that Vico holds that this type of thinking is by definition distinct from our more common way of reflective thought. Further, there are contemporary anthropologists who see Vico as a precursor to their discoveries. Ultimately, Vico’s idea may not really be so far-fetched.
Book III of the New Science contains one of Vico’s most remarkable insights. Vico was among the first, if not the first, to hold that Homer was not one individual writing poems but was a conglomeration of different poets who expressed the will of the entire people. His arguments for this are a combination of philological claims which show that there are many disparate elements in the work, as well as philosophical claims that when the work was composed, people could not have been using modern wisdom to write it as a modern epic.
Vico’s motivation for this reading of Homer is his quest to find a metaphysical truth to history. If the works of Homer were written by one person, then the truths held in it would be arbitrary. However, Vico argues that Homer’s poems spring from the common sense of all the Greek people. Therefore, the poems represent institutions universal to a culture that can then be used to justify universal truths. Whereas in the Universal Law, where Vico examined Roman law to see its universality, he has now replaced that idea with Homer’s poems since those poems date back earlier than the law.
The brief conclusion of the New Science largely pays homage to the glory of divine providence. Within it, Vico gives a brief statement about the barbarism of reflection. As indicated in the section on the Ideal Eternal History, Vico sees that history is cyclical. Vico claims that history begins in a barbarism of sense and ends in a barbarism of reflection. The barbarism of reflection is a returned barbarism in which the common sense established by religion through poetic wisdom holding a society together has been broken down by individual interests. The interests are spurred because individuals each think according to their own conceptual scheme without concern for the society, which makes it barbaric.
Vico describes the returned barbarism this way, “such peoples [in the barbarism], like so many beasts, have fallen into the custom of each man thinking only of his own private interests and have reached the extreme delicacy, or better of pride, in which like wild animals they bristle and lash out at the slightest displeasure (NS 1106).” These private interests lead into a civil war in which everyone betrays everyone else. This takes humanity back to where it started -- individual giants acting solely on their own individual passions.
Unfortunately, Vico does not give a clear ethical position on what to do in the face of the barbarism of reflection. He wrote a section of the New Science called a Practic but decided not to include it. Clearly, Vico wants his readers to recognize universal truth and appreciate a rhetorical approach to philosophy. But, what this means in particular for an ethical theory is a matter of some debate.
Vico’s Autobiography is worthy of philosophical investigation. It was written by the invitation of a journal which was going to publish a series of essays by scholars describing their lives. Vico was the only one to contribute to the series. The journal was published in 1725 and he updated it in 1728 and 1731.
On one level, the Autobiography contains the basic facts of his life recounted above. However, it seems clear that Vico does have an important philosophical agenda that goes beyond any attempt to recount simply the facts of his life. The most immediate piece of evidence for this is that on the first line Vico gets the year of his birth wrong. He gives it as 1670 rather than 1668. Given how easy it would be to access his baptism records in Naples, it is entirely possible that Vico intended his audience to know he was being imprecise, and perhaps imaginative, when he composed his Autobiography.
One way of reading the Autobiography is as a further attack on Descartes. The Autobiography itself highlights his conflict with the Cartesians of Naples. Further, rather than using the first person, as Descartes does in the Discourse on Method, Vico refers to himself in the third person. The fact that Vico willfully gets his birth date wrong could be an indication that he dismisses Descartes’ calls for certainty.
Beyond that, there appear to be strong parallels between Vico’s task in the Autobiography and in the New Science. Returning to the verum-factum principle, Vico claims that the task of the New Science is not simply to retell the facts of history. Instead, it is to understand the workings of divine providence in this history by remaking it. As quoted above in the section on Method, Vico emphasizes that to witness the ideal eternal history, the reader must make it for oneself (NS 349). In saying this, Vico turns the entire New Science into a text that could be thought of as a type of fable. In the Autobiography, Vico, rather than giving a strictly accurate account of his life, makes a fable which actually parallels some elements of the ideal eternal history. For example, Vico’s fall in the bookstore may parallel the thunderstrike of Jove. Regardless of how strict this parallel is, Vico appears to be consciously applying some of his philosophical principles to his Autobiography (Verene 1990).
The Marquis of Villarosa wrote a conclusion to the Autobiography in 1818. He relates an odd story about Vico’s funeral. When Vico died, two groups, the professors at the University of Naples and the Confraternity of Santa Sophia, both wanted to carry the coffin to its resting place. A dispute broke out which could not be resolved. As a result, both sides abandoned the coffin and left. Vico was buried by officers of the Cathedral the next day (Auto 207-8).
Italian Editions of Vico
The standard Italian edition of Vico is: Opere di G. B. Vico, ed. Fausto Nicolini, 8 vols. (Bari: Laterza, 1911-1941). However, two other editions are being used more regularly. The first is: Vico, Giambattista. Opere, ed. Andrea Battistini, 2 vols. (Milan: Arnoldo Mondadori Editore, 1990). The second is a multi-volume edition edited by Paolo Cristofolini and published by Alfredo Guida under the auspices of the Instituto per la Storia del Pensiero Filosofico e Scientifico Moderno and the Centro di Studi Vichiani. This is an effort to systematically release all the works of Vico.
English Editions of Vico
Other Works Cited
Bibliographies on Vico
Benedetto Croce published a bibliography of works on Vico in 1904. This was updated by Fausto Nicolini in 1948. This bibliography was further updated: Donzelli, Maria. Contributo alla bibliografia vichiana (1948-1970). Naples: Guida Editori, 1973. And updated again: Battistini, Andrea. Nuovo contributo alla bibliografia vichiana (1971-1980). Studi vichiani 14. Naples: Guida 1983. Updates to this bibliography have been published as supplements to the Bolletino del Centro di Studi Vichiani.
For works in English, this volume compiles works on Vico as well as works citing Vico: Verene, Molly Black. Vico: A Bibliography of Works in English from 1884 to 1994. Bowling Green, OH: Philosophy Documentation Center, 1994. Supplements to this bibliography which update it from 1994 to the present have been appearing in New Vico Studies.
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