Virtue ethics is a broad term for theories that emphasize the role of character and virtue in moral philosophy rather than either doing one’s duty or acting in order to bring about good consequences. A virtue ethicist is likely to give you this kind of moral advice: “Act as a virtuous person would act in your situation.”
Most virtue ethics theories take their inspiration from Aristotle who declared that a virtuous person is someone who has ideal character traits. These traits derive from natural internal tendencies, but need to be nurtured; however, once established, they will become stable. For example, a virtuous person is someone who is kind across many situations over a lifetime because that is her character and not because she wants to maximize utility or gain favors or simply do her duty. Unlike deontological and consequentialist theories, theories of virtue ethics do not aim primarily to identify universal principles that can be applied in any moral situation. And virtue ethics theories deal with wider questions—“How should I live?” and “What is the good life?” and “What are proper family and social values?”
Since its revival in the twentieth century, virtue ethics has been developed in three main directions: Eudaimonism, agent-based theories, and the ethics of care. Eudaimonism bases virtues in human flourishing, where flourishing is equated with performing one’s distinctive function well. In the case of humans, Aristotle argued that our distinctive function is reasoning, and so the life “worth living” is one which we reason well. An agent-based theory emphasizes that virtues are determined by common-sense intuitions that we as observers judge to be admirable traits in other people. The third branch of virtue ethics, the ethics of care, was proposed predominately by feminist thinkers. It challenges the idea that ethics should focus solely on justice and autonomy; it argues that more feminine traits, such as caring and nurturing, should also be considered.
Here are some common objections to virtue ethics. Its theories provide a self-centered conception of ethics because human flourishing is seen as an end in itself and does not sufficiently consider the extent to which our actions affect other people. Virtue ethics also does not provide guidance on how we should act, as there are no clear principles for guiding action other than “act as a virtuous person would act given the situation.” Lastly, the ability to cultivate the right virtues will be affected by a number of different factors beyond a person’s control due to education, society, friends and family. If moral character is so reliant on luck, what role does this leave for appropriate praise and blame of the person?
This article looks at how virtue ethics originally defined itself by calling for a change from the dominant normative theories of deontology and consequentialism. It goes on to examine some common objections raised against virtue ethics and then looks at a sample of fully developed accounts of virtue ethics and responses.
In 1958 Elisabeth Anscombe published a paper titled “Modern Moral Philosophy” that changed the way we think about normative theories. She criticized modern moral philosophy’s pre-occupation with a law conception of ethics. A law conception of ethics deals exclusively with obligation and duty. Among the theories she criticized for their reliance on universally applicable principles were J. S. Mill‘s utilitarianism and Kant‘s deontology. These theories rely on rules of morality that were claimed to be applicable to any moral situation (that is, Mill’s Greatest Happiness Principle and Kant’s Categorical Imperative). This approach to ethics relies on universal principles and results in a rigid moral code. Further, these rigid rules are based on a notion of obligation that is meaningless in modern, secular society because they make no sense without assuming the existence of a lawgiver—an assumption we no longer make.
In its place, Anscombe called for a return to a different way of doing philosophy. Taking her inspiration from Aristotle, she called for a return to concepts such as character, virtue and flourishing. She also emphasized the importance of the emotions and understanding moral psychology. With the exception of this emphasis on moral psychology, Anscombe’s recommendations that we place virtue more centrally in our understanding of morality were taken up by a number of philosophers. The resulting body of theories and ideas has come to be known as virtue ethics.
Anscombe’s critical and confrontational approach set the scene for how virtue ethics was to develop in its first few years. The philosophers who took up Anscombe’s call for a return to virtue saw their task as being to define virtue ethics in terms of what it is not—that is, how it differs from and avoids the mistakes made by the other normative theories. Before we go on to consider this in detail, we need to take a brief look at two other philosophers, Bernard Williams and Alasdair MacIntyre, whose call for theories of virtue was also instrumental in changing our understanding of moral philosophy.
Bernard Williams’ philosophical work has always been characterized by its ability to draw our attention to a previously unnoticed but now impressively fruitful area for philosophical discussion. Williams criticized how moral philosophy had developed. He drew a distinction between morality and ethics. Morality is characterized mainly by the work of Kant and notions such as duty and obligation. Crucially associated with the notion of obligation is the notion of blame. Blame is appropriate because we are obliged to behave in a certain way and if we are capable of conforming our conduct and fail to, we have violated our duty.
Williams was also concerned that such a conception for morality rejects the possibility of luck. If morality is about what we are obliged to do, then there is no room for what is outside of our control. But sometimes attainment of the good life is dependant on things outside of our control.
In response, Williams takes a wider concept, ethics, and rejects the narrow and restricting concept of morality. Ethics encompasses many emotions that are rejected by morality as irrelevant. Ethical concerns are wider, encompassing friends, family and society and make room for ideals such as social justice. This view of ethics is compatible with the Ancient Greek interpretation of the good life as found in Aristotle and Plato.
Finally, the ideas of Alasdair MacIntyre acted as a stimulus for the increased interest in virtue. MacIntyre’s project is as deeply critical of many of the same notions, like ought, as Anscombe and Williams. However, he also attempts to give an account of virtue. MacIntyre looks at a large number of historical accounts of virtue that differ in their lists of the virtues and have incompatible theories of the virtues. He concludes that these differences are attributable to different practices that generate different conceptions of the virtues. Each account of virtue requires a prior account of social and moral features in order to be understood. Thus, in order to understand Homeric virtue you need to look its social role in Greek society. Virtues, then, are exercised within practices that are coherent, social forms of activity and seek to realize goods internal to the activity. The virtues enable us to achieve these goods. There is an end (or telos) that transcends all particular practices and it constitutes the good of a whole human life. That end is the virtue of integrity or constancy.
These three writers have all, in their own way, argued for a radical change in the way we think about morality. Whether they call for a change of emphasis from obligation, a return to a broad understanding of ethics, or a unifying tradition of practices that generate virtues, their dissatisfaction with the state of modern moral philosophy lay the foundation for change.
There are a number of different accounts of virtue ethics. It is an emerging concept and was initially defined by what it is not rather than what it is. The next section examines claims virtue ethicists initially made that set the theory up as a rival to deontology and consequentialism.
Moral theories are concerned with right and wrong behavior. This subject area of philosophy is unavoidably tied up with practical concerns about the right behavior. However, virtue ethics changes the kind of question we ask about ethics. Where deontology and consequentialism concern themselves with the right action, virtue ethics is concerned with the good life and what kinds of persons we should be. “What is the right action?” is a significantly different question to ask from “How should I live? What kind of person should I be?” Where the first type of question deals with specific dilemmas, the second is a question about an entire life. Instead of asking what is the right action here and now, virtue ethics asks what kind of person should one be in order to get it right all the time.
Whereas deontology and consequentialism are based on rules that try to give us the right action, virtue ethics makes central use of the concept of character. The answer to “How should one live?” is that one should live virtuously, that is, have a virtuous character.
Modern virtue ethics takes its inspiration from the Aristotelian understanding of character and virtue. Aristotelian character is, importantly, about a state of being. It’s about having the appropriate inner states. For example, the virtue of kindness involves the right sort of emotions and inner states with respect to our feelings towards others. Character is also about doing. Aristotelian theory is a theory of action, since having the virtuous inner dispositions will also involve being moved to act in accordance with them. Realizing that kindness is the appropriate response to a situation and feeling appropriately kindly disposed will also lead to a corresponding attempt to act kindly.
Another distinguishing feature of virtue ethics is that character traits are stable, fixed, and reliable dispositions. If an agent possesses the character trait of kindness, we would expect him or her to act kindly in all sorts of situations, towards all kinds of people, and over a long period of time, even when it is difficult to do so. A person with a certain character can be relied upon to act consistently over a time.
It is important to recognize that moral character develops over a long period of time. People are born with all sorts of natural tendencies. Some of these natural tendencies will be positive, such as a placid and friendly nature, and some will be negative, such as an irascible and jealous nature. These natural tendencies can be encouraged and developed or discouraged and thwarted by the influences one is exposed to when growing up. There are a number of factors that may affect one’s character development, such as one’s parents, teachers, peer group, role-models, the degree of encouragement and attention one receives, and exposure to different situations. Our natural tendencies, the raw material we are born with, are shaped and developed through a long and gradual process of education and habituation.
Moral education and development is a major part of virtue ethics. Moral development, at least in its early stages, relies on the availability of good role models. The virtuous agent acts as a role model and the student of virtue emulates his or her example. Initially this is a process of habituating oneself in right action. Aristotle advises us to perform just acts because this way we become just. The student of virtue must develop the right habits, so that he tends to perform virtuous acts. Virtue is not itself a habit. Habituation is merely an aid to the development of virtue, but true virtue requires choice, understanding, and knowledge. The virtuous agent doesn’t act justly merely out of an unreflective response, but has come to recognize the value of virtue and why it is the appropriate response. Virtue is chosen knowingly for its own sake.
The development of moral character may take a whole lifetime. But once it is firmly established, one will act consistently, predictably and appropriately in a variety of situations.
Aristotelian virtue is defined in Book II of the Nicomachean Ethics as a purposive disposition, lying in a mean and being determined by the right reason. As discussed above, virtue is a settled disposition. It is also a purposive disposition. A virtuous actor chooses virtuous action knowingly and for its own sake. It is not enough to act kindly by accident, unthinkingly, or because everyone else is doing so; you must act kindly because you recognize that this is the right way to behave. Note here that although habituation is a tool for character development it is not equivalent to virtue; virtue requires conscious choice and affirmation.
Virtue “lies in a mean” because the right response to each situation is neither too much nor too little. Virtue is the appropriate response to different situations and different agents. The virtues are associated with feelings. For example: courage is associated with fear, modesty is associated with the feeling of shame, and friendliness associated with feelings about social conduct. The virtue lies in a mean because it involves displaying the mean amount of emotion, where mean stands for appropriate. (This does not imply that the right amount is a modest amount. Sometimes quite a lot may be the appropriate amount of emotion to display, as in the case of righteous indignation). The mean amount is neither too much nor too little and is sensitive to the requirements of the person and the situation.
Finally, virtue is determined by the right reason. Virtue requires the right desire and the right reason. To act from the wrong reason is to act viciously. On the other hand, the agent can try to act from the right reason, but fail because he or she has the wrong desire. The virtuous agent acts effortlessly, perceives the right reason, has the harmonious right desire, and has an inner state of virtue that flows smoothly into action. The virtuous agent can act as an exemplar of virtue to others.
It is important to recognize that this is a perfunctory account of ideas that are developed in great detail in Aristotle. They are related briefly here as they have been central to virtue ethics’ claim to put forward a unique and rival account to other normative theories. Modern virtue ethicists have developed their theories around a central role for character and virtue and claim that this gives them a unique understanding of morality. The emphasis on character development and the role of the emotions allows virtue ethics to have a plausible account of moral psychology—which is lacking in deontology and consequentialism. Virtue ethics can avoid the problematic concepts of duty and obligation in favor of the rich concept of virtue. Judgments of virtue are judgments of a whole life rather than of one isolated action.
In the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle warns us that the study of ethics is imprecise. Virtue ethicists have challenged consequentialist and deontological theories because they fail to accommodate this insight. Both deontological and consequentialist type of theories rely on one rule or principle that is expected to apply to all situations. Because their principles are inflexible, they cannot accommodate the complexity of all the moral situations that we are likely to encounter.
We are constantly faced with moral problems. For example: Should I tell my friend the truth about her lying boyfriend? Should I cheat in my exams? Should I have an abortion? Should I save the drowning baby? Should we separate the Siamese twins? Should I join the fuel protests? All these problems are different and it seems unlikely that we will find the solution to all of them by applying the same rule. If the problems are varied, we should not expect to find their solution in one rigid and inflexible rule that does not admit exception. If the nature of the thing we are studying is diverse and changing, then the answer cannot be any good if it is inflexible and unyielding. The answer to “how should I live?” cannot be found in one rule. At best, for virtue ethics, there can be rules of thumb—rules that are true for the most part, but may not always be the appropriate response.
The doctrine of the mean captures exactly this idea. The virtuous response cannot be captured in a rule or principle, which an agent can learn and then act virtuously. Knowing virtue is a matter of experience, sensitivity, ability to perceive, ability to reason practically, etc. and takes a long time to develop. The idea that ethics cannot be captured in one rule or principle is the “uncodifiability of ethics thesis.” Ethics is too diverse and imprecise to be captured in a rigid code, so we must approach morality with a theory that is as flexible and as situation-responsive as the subject matter itself. As a result some virtue ethicists see themselves as anti-theorists, rejecting theories that systematically attempt to capture and organize all matters of practical or ethical importance.
Virtue ethics initially emerged as a rival account to deontology and consequentialism. It developed from dissatisfaction with the notions of duty and obligation and their central roles in understanding morality. It also grew out of an objection to the use of rigid moral rules and principles and their application to diverse and different moral situations. Characteristically, virtue ethics makes a claim about the central role of virtue and character in its understanding of moral life and uses it to answer the questions “How should I live? What kind of person should I be?” Consequentialist theories are outcome-based and Kantian theories are agent-based. Virtue ethics is character-based.
Raising objections to other normative theories and defining itself in opposition to the claims of others, was the first stage in the development of virtue ethics. Virtue ethicists then took up the challenge of developing full fledged accounts of virtue that could stand on their own merits rather than simply criticize consequentialism and deontology. These accounts have been predominantly influenced by the Aristotelian understanding of virtue. While some virtue ethics take inspiration from Plato’s, the Stoics’, Aquinas’, Hume’s and Nietzsche’s accounts of virtue and ethics, Aristotelian conceptions of virtue ethics still dominate the field. There are three main strands of development for virtue ethics: Eudaimonism, agent-based theories and the ethics of care.
“Eudaimonia” is an Aristotelian term loosely (and inadequately) translated as happiness. To understand its role in virtue ethics we look to Aristotle’s function argument. Aristotle recognizes that actions are not pointless because they have an aim. Every action aims at some good. For example, the doctor’s vaccination of the baby aims at the baby’s health, the English tennis player Tim Henman works on his serve so that he can win Wimbledon, and so on. Furthermore, some things are done for their own sake (ends in themselves) and some things are done for the sake of other things (means to other ends). Aristotle claims that all the things that are ends in themselves also contribute to a wider end, an end that is the greatest good of all. That good is eudaimonia. Eudaimonia is happiness, contentment, and fulfillment; it’s the name of the best kind of life, which is an end in itself and a means to live and fare well.
Aristotle then observes that where a thing has a function the good of the thing is when it performs its function well. For example, the knife has a function, to cut, and it performs its function well when it cuts well. This argument is applied to man: man has a function and the good man is the man who performs his function well. Man’s function is what is peculiar to him and sets him aside from other beings—reason. Therefore, the function of man is reason and the life that is distinctive of humans is the life in accordance with reason. If the function of man is reason, then the good man is the man who reasons well. This is the life of excellence or of eudaimonia. Eudaimonia is the life of virtue—activity in accordance with reason, man’s highest function.
The importance of this point of eudaimonistic virtue ethics is that it reverses the relationship between virtue and rightness. A utilitarian could accept the value of the virtue of kindness, but only because someone with a kind disposition is likely to bring about consequences that will maximize utility. So the virtue is only justified because of the consequences it brings about. In eudaimonist virtue ethics the virtues are justified because they are constitutive elements of eudaimonia (that is, human flourishing and wellbeing), which is good in itself.
Rosalind Hursthouse developed one detailed account of eudaimonist virtue ethics. Hursthouse argues that the virtues make their possessor a good human being. All living things can be evaluated qua specimens of their natural kind. Like Aristotle, Hursthouse argues that the characteristic way of human beings is the rational way: by their very nature human beings act rationally, a characteristic that allows us to make decisions and to change our character and allows others to hold us responsible for those decisions. Acting virtuously—that is, acting in accordance with reason—is acting in the way characteristic of the nature of human beings and this will lead to eudaimonia. This means that the virtues benefit their possessor. One might think that the demands of morality conflict with our self-interest, as morality is other-regarding, but eudaimonist virtue ethics presents a different picture. Human nature is such that virtue is not exercised in opposition to self-interest, but rather is the quintessential component of human flourishing. The good life for humans is the life of virtue and therefore it is in our interest to be virtuous. It is not just that the virtues lead to the good life (e.g. if you are good, you will be rewarded), but rather a virtuous life is the good life because the exercise of our rational capacities and virtue is its own reward.
It is important to note, however, that there have been many different ways of developing this idea of the good life and virtue within virtue ethics. Philippa Foot, for example, grounds the virtues in what is good for human beings. The virtues are beneficial to their possessor or to the community (note that this is similar to MacIntyre’s argument that the virtues enable us to achieve goods within human practices). Rather than being constitutive of the good life, the virtues are valuable because they contribute to it.
Another account is given by perfectionists such as Thomas Hurka, who derive the virtues from the characteristics that most fully develop our essential properties as human beings. Individuals are judged against a standard of perfection that reflects very rare or ideal levels of human achievement. The virtues realize our capacity for rationality and therefore contribute to our well-being and perfection in that sense.
Not all accounts of virtue ethics are eudaimonist. Michael Slote has developed an account of virtue based on our common-sense intuitions about which character traits are admirable. Slote makes a distinction between agent-focused and agent-based theories. Agent-focused theories understand the moral life in terms of what it is to be a virtuous individual, where the virtues are inner dispositions. Aristotelian theory is an example of an agent-focused theory. By contrast, agent-based theories are more radical in that their evaluation of actions is dependent on ethical judgments about the inner life of the agents who perform those actions. There are a variety of human traits that we find admirable, such as benevolence, kindness, compassion, etc. and we can identify these by looking at the people we admire, our moral exemplars.
Finally, the Ethics of Care is another influential version of virtue ethics. Developed mainly by feminist writers, such as Annette Baier, this account of virtue ethics is motivated by the thought that men think in masculine terms such as justice and autonomy, whereas woman think in feminine terms such as caring. These theorists call for a change in how we view morality and the virtues, shifting towards virtues exemplified by women, such as taking care of others, patience, the ability to nurture, self-sacrifice, etc. These virtues have been marginalized because society has not adequately valued the contributions of women. Writings in this area do not always explicitly make a connection with virtue ethics. There is much in their discussions, however, of specific virtues and their relation to social practices and moral education, etc., which is central to virtue ethics.
There are many different accounts of virtue ethics. The three types discussed above are representative of the field. There is a large field, however, of diverse writers developing other theories of virtue. For example, Christine Swanton has developed a pluralist account of virtue ethics with connections to Nietzsche. Nietzsche’s theory emphasizes the inner self and provides a possible response to the call for a better understanding of moral psychology. Swanton develops an account of self-love that allows her to distinguish true virtue from closely related vices, e.g. self-confidence from vanity or ostentation, virtuous and vicious forms of perfectionism, etc. She also makes use of the Nietzschean ideas of creativity and expression to show how different modes of acknowledgement are appropriate to the virtues.
Historically, accounts of virtue have varied widely. Homeric virtue should be understood within the society within which it occurred. The standard of excellence was determined from within the particular society and accountability was determined by one’s role within society. Also, one’s worth was comparative to others and competition was crucial in determining one’s worth.
Other accounts of virtue ethics are inspired from Christian writers such as Aquinas and Augustine (see the work of David Oderberg). Aquinas’ account of the virtues is distinctive because it allows a role for the will. One’s will can be directed by the virtues and we are subject to the natural law, because we have the potential to grasp the truth of practical judgments. To possess a virtue is to have the will to apply it and the knowledge of how to do so. Humans are susceptible to evil and acknowledging this allows us to be receptive to the virtues of faith, hope and charity—virtues of love that are significantly different from Aristotle’s virtues.
The three types of theories covered above developed over long periods, answering many questions and often changed in response to criticisms. For example, Michael Slote has moved away from agent-based virtue ethics to a more Humean-inspired sentimentalist account of virtue ethics. Humean accounts of virtue ethics rely on the motive of benevolence and the idea that actions should be evaluated by the sentiments they express. Admirable sentiments are those that express a concern for humanity. The interested reader must seek out the work of these writers in the original to get a full appreciation of the depth and detail of their theories.
Much of what has been written on virtue ethics has been in response to criticisms of the theory. The following section presents three objections and possible responses, based on broad ideas held in common by most accounts of virtue ethics.
Morality is supposed to be about other people. It deals with our actions to the extent that they affect other people. Moral praise and blame is attributed on the grounds of an evaluation of our behavior towards others and the ways in that we exhibit, or fail to exhibit, a concern for the well-being of others. Virtue ethics, according to this objection, is self-centered because its primary concern is with the agent’s own character. Virtue ethics seems to be essentially interested in the acquisition of the virtues as part of the agent’s own well-being and flourishing. Morality requires us to consider others for their own sake and not because they may benefit us. There seems to be something wrong with aiming to behave compassionately, kindly, and honestly merely because this will make oneself happier.
Related to this objection is a more general objection against the idea that well-being is a master value and that all other things are valuable only to the extent that they contribute to it. This line of attack, exemplified in the writings of Tim Scanlon, objects to the understanding of well-being as a moral notion and sees it more like self-interest. Furthermore, well-being does not admit to comparisons with other individuals. Thus, well-being cannot play the role that eudaimonists would have it play.
This objection fails to appreciate the role of the virtues within the theory. The virtues are other-regarding. Kindness, for example, is about how we respond to the needs of others. The virtuous agent’s concern is with developing the right sort of character that will respond to the needs of others in an appropriate way. The virtue of kindness is about being able to perceive situations where one is required to be kind, have the disposition to respond kindly in a reliable and stable manner, and be able to express one’s kind character in accordance with one’s kind desires. The eudaimonist account of virtue ethics claims that the good of the agent and the good of others are not two separate aims. Both rather result from the exercise of virtue. Rather than being too self-centered, virtue ethics unifies what is required by morality and what is required by self-interest.
Moral philosophy is concerned with practical issues. Fundamentally it is about how we should act. Virtue ethics has criticized consequentialist and deontological theories for being too rigid and inflexible because they rely on one rule or principle. One reply to this is that these theories are action guiding. The existence of “rigid” rules is a strength, not a weakness because they offer clear direction on what to do. As long as we know the principles, we can apply them to practical situations and be guided by them. Virtue ethics, it is objected, with its emphasis on the imprecise nature of ethics, fails to give us any help with the practicalities of how we should behave. A theory that fails to be action-guiding is no good as a moral theory.
The main response to this criticism is to stress the role of the virtuous agent as an exemplar. Virtue ethics reflects the imprecise nature of ethics by being flexible and situation-sensitive, but it can also be action-guiding by observing the example of the virtuous agent. The virtuous agent is the agent who has a fully developed moral character, who possesses the virtues and acts in accordance with them, and who knows what to do by example. Further, virtue ethics places considerable of emphasis on the development of moral judgment. Knowing what to do is not a matter of internalizing a principle, but a life-long process of moral learning that will only provide clear answers when one reaches moral maturity. Virtue ethics cannot give us an easy, instant answer. This is because these answers do not exist. Nonetheless, it can be action-guiding if we understand the role of the virtuous agent and the importance of moral education and development. If virtue consists of the right reason and the right desire, virtue ethics will be action-guiding when we can perceive the right reason and have successfully habituated our desires to affirm its commands.
Finally, there is a concern that virtue ethics leaves us hostage to luck. Morality is about responsibility and the appropriateness of praise and blame. However, we only praise and blame agents for actions taken under conscious choice. The road to virtue is arduous and many things outside our control can go wrong. Just as the right education, habits, influences, examples, etc. can promote the development of virtue, the wrong influencing factors can promote vice. Some people will be lucky and receive the help and encouragement they need to attain moral maturity, but others will not. If the development of virtue (and vice) is subject to luck, is it fair to praise the virtuous (and blame the vicious) for something that was outside of their control? Further, some accounts of virtue are dependent on the availability of external goods. Friendship with other virtuous agents is so central to Aristotelian virtue that a life devoid of virtuous friendship will be lacking in eudaimonia. However, we have no control over the availability of the right friends. How can we then praise the virtuous and blame the vicious if their development and respective virtue and vice were not under their control?
Some moral theories try to eliminate the influence of luck on morality (primarily deontology). Virtue ethics, however, answers this objection by embracing moral luck. Rather than try to make morality immune to matters that are outside of our control, virtue ethics recognizes the fragility of the good life and makes it a feature of morality. It is only because the good life is so vulnerable and fragile that it is so precious. Many things can go wrong on the road to virtue, such that the possibility that virtue is lost, but this vulnerability is an essential feature of the human condition, which makes the attainment of the good life all the more valuable.
Virtue ethics offers a radically different account to deontology and consequentialism. Virtue ethics, however, has influenced modern moral philosophy not only by developing a full-fledged account of virtue, but also by causing consequentialists and deontologists to re-examine their own theories with view to taking advantage of the insights of virtue.
For years Deontologists relied mainly on the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals for discussions of Kant’s moral theory. The emergence of virtue ethics caused many writers to re-examine Kant’s other works. Metaphysics of Morals, Anthropology From a Pragmatic Point of View and, to a lesser extent, Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone, have becomes sources of inspiration for the role of virtue in deontology. Kantian virtue is in some respects similar to Aristotelian virtue. In the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant stresses the importance of education, habituation, and gradual development—all ideas that have been used by modern deontologists to illustrate the common sense plausibility of the theory. For Kantians, the main role of virtue and appropriate character development is that a virtuous character will help one formulate appropriate maxims for testing. In other respects, Kantian virtue remains rather dissimilar from other conceptions of virtue. Differences are based on at least three ideas: First, Kantian virtue is a struggle against emotions. Whether one thinks the emotions should be subjugated or eliminated, for Kant moral worth comes only from the duty of motive, a motive that struggles against inclination. This is quite different from the Aristotelian picture of harmony between reason and desire. Second, for Kant there is no such thing as weakness of will, understood in the Aristotelian sense of the distinction between continence and incontinence. Kant concentrates on fortitude of will and failure to do so is self-deception. Finally, Kantians need to give an account of the relationship between virtue as occurring in the empirical world and Kant’s remarks about moral worth in the noumenal world (remarks that can be interpreted as creating a contradiction between ideas in the Groundwork and in other works).
Consequentialists have found a role for virtue as a disposition that tends to promote good consequences. Virtue is not valuable in itself, but rather valuable for the good consequences it tends to bring about. We should cultivate virtuous dispositions because such dispositions will tend to maximize utility. This is a radical departure from the Aristotelian account of virtue for its own sake. Some consequentialists, such as Driver, go even further and argue that knowledge is not necessary for virtue.
Rival accounts have tried to incorporate the benefits of virtue ethics and develop in ways that will allow them to respond to the challenged raised by virtue ethics. This has led to very fruitful and exciting work being done within this area of philosophy.
Last updated: July 7, 2010 | Originally published: