Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Virtue Epistemology

Virtue epistemology is a collection of recent approaches to epistemology that give epistemic or intellectual virtue concepts an important and fundamental role. Virtue epistemologists can be divided into two groups. Virtue reliabilists conceive of intellectual virtues as stable and reliable cognitive faculties or powers and cite vision, introspection, memory, and the like as paradigm cases of intellectual virtue. These virtue epistemologists tend to focus on formulating virtue-based accounts of knowledge or justification. Virtue responsibilists conceive of intellectual virtues as good intellectual character traits, traits like attentiveness, fair-mindedness, open-mindedness, intellectual tenacity, and courage. While some virtue responsibilists have also attempted to give virtue-based accounts of knowledge or justification, others have pursued less traditional projects, focusing on such issues as the nature and value of virtuous intellectual character as such, the relation between intellectual virtue and epistemic responsibility, and the relevance of intellectual virtue to the social and cross-temporal aspects of the intellectual life.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction to Virtue Epistemology
  2. Virtue Reliabilism
    1. Key Figures
    2. Prospects for Virtue Reliabilism
  3. Virtue Responsibilism
    1. Key Figures
    2. Prospects for Virtue Responsibilism
  4. The Reliabilist/Responsibilist Divide
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction to Virtue Epistemology

Virtue epistemology is a collection of recent approaches to epistemology that give epistemic or intellectual virtue concepts an important and fundamental role.

The advent of virtue epistemology was at least partly inspired by a fairly recent renewal of interest in virtue concepts among moral philosophers (see, e.g., Crisp and Slote 1997). Noting this influence from ethics, Ernest Sosa introduced the notion of an intellectual virtue into contemporary epistemological discussion in a 1980 paper, “The Raft and the Pyramid.” Sosa argued in this paper that an appeal to intellectual virtue could resolve the conflict between foundationalists and coherentists over the structure of epistemic justification. Since the publication of Sosa’s paper nearly 25 years ago, several epistemologists have turned to intellectual virtue concepts to address a wide range of issues, from the Gettier problem to the internalism/externalism debate to skepticism.

There are substantial and complicated differences between the various virtue epistemological views; as a result, relatively little can be said by way of generalization about the central tenets of virtue epistemology. These differences are attributable mainly to two competing conceptions of the nature of an intellectual virtue. Sosa and certain other virtue epistemologists tend to define an intellectual virtue as roughly any stable and reliable or truth-conducive property of a person. They cite as paradigm instances of intellectual virtue certain cognitive faculties or powers like vision, memory, and introspection, since such faculties ordinarily are especially helpful for getting to the truth. Epistemologists with this conception of intellectual virtue have mainly been concerned with constructing virtue-based analyses of knowledge and/or justification. Several have argued, for instance, that knowledge should be understood roughly as true belief arising from an exercise of intellectual virtue. Because of their close resemblance to standard reliabilist epistemologies, these views are referred to as instances of “virtue reliabilism.”

A second group of virtue epistemologists conceives of intellectual virtues, not as cognitive faculties or abilities like memory and vision, but rather as good intellectual character traits, traits like inquisitiveness, fair-mindedness, open-mindedness, intellectual carefulness, thoroughness, and tenacity. These character-based versions of virtue epistemology are referred to as instances of “virtue responsibilism,” since the traits they regard as intellectual virtues might also be viewed as the traits of a responsible knower or inquirer. Some virtue responsibilists have adopted an approach similar to that of virtue reliabilists by giving virtue concepts a crucial role in an analysis of knowledge or justification. Linda Zagzebski, for instance, claims that knowledge is belief arising from what she calls “acts of intellectual virtue” (1996). Other virtue responsibilists like Lorraine Code (1987) have eschewed more traditional epistemological problems. Code argues that epistemology should be oriented on the notion of epistemic responsibility and that epistemic responsibility is the chief intellectual virtue; however, she makes no attempt to offer a definition of knowledge or justification based on these concepts. Her view instead gives priority to topics like the value of virtuous cognitive character as such, the social and moral dimensions of the intellectual life, and the role of agency in inquiry.

Virtue reliabilists and virtue responsibilists alike have claimed to have the more accurate view of intellectual virtue and hence of the general form that a virtue-based epistemology should take. And both have appealed to Aristotle, one of the first philosophers to employ the notion of an intellectual virtue, in support of their claims. Some virtue responsibilists (e.g., Zagzebski 1996) have argued that the character traits of interest to them are the intellectual counterpart to what Aristotle and other moral philosophers have regarded as the moral virtues and that these traits are therefore properly regarded as intellectual virtues. In response, virtue reliabilists have pointed out that, whatever his conception of moral virtue, Aristotle apparently conceived of intellectual virtues more as truth-conducive cognitive powers or faculties than as good intellectual character traits. They have claimed furthermore that these powers, but not the responsibilist’s character traits, have an important role to play in an analysis of knowledge, and that consequently, the former are more reasonably regarded as intellectual virtues (Greco 2000).

It would be a mistake, however, to view either group of virtue epistemologists as necessarily having a weightier claim than the other to the concept of an intellectual virtue, for both are concerned with traits that are genuine and important intellectual excellences and therefore can reasonably be regarded as intellectual virtues. Virtue reliabilists are interested in cognitive qualities that are an effective means to epistemic values like truth and understanding. The traits of interest to virtue responsibilists are also a means to these values, since a person who is, say, reflective, fair-minded, perseverant, intellectually careful, and thorough ordinarily is more likely than one who lacks these qualities to believe what is true, to achieve an understanding of complex phenomena, etc. Moreover, these qualities are “personal excellences” in the sense that one is also a better person (albeit in a distinctively intellectual rather than straightforwardly moral way) as a result of possessing them, that is, as a result of being reflective, fair-minded, intellectually courageous, tenacious, and so forth. The latter is not true of cognitive faculties or abilities like vision or memory. These traits, while contributing importantly to one’s overall intellectual well-being, do not make their possessor a better person in any relevant sense. This is entirely consistent, however, with the more general point that virtue responsibilists and virtue reliabilists alike are concerned with genuine and important intellectual excellences both sets of which can reasonably be regarded as intellectual virtues. Virtue reliabilists are concerned with traits that are a critical means to intellectual well-being or “flourishing” and virtue responsibilists with traits that are both a means to and are partly constitutive of intellectual flourishing.

A firmer grasp of the field of virtue epistemology can be achieved by considering, for each branch of virtue epistemology, how some of its main proponents have conceived of the nature of an intellectual virtue and how they have employed virtue concepts in their theories. It will also be helpful to consider the apparent prospects of each kind of virtue epistemology.

2. Virtue Reliabilism

a. Key Figures

Since introducing the notion of an intellectual virtue to contemporary epistemology, Sosa has had more to say than any other virtue epistemologist about the intellectual virtues conceived as reliable cognitive faculties or abilities. Sosa characterizes an intellectual virtue, very generally, as “a quality bound to help maximize one’s surplus of truth over error” (1991: 225). Recognizing that any given quality is likely to be helpful for reaching the truth only with respect to a limited field of propositions and only when operating in a certain environment and under certain conditions, Sosa also offers the following more refined characterization: “One has an intellectual virtue or faculty relative to an environment E if and only if one has an inner nature I in virtue of which one would mostly attain the truth and avoid error in a certain field of propositions F, when in certain conditions C” (284). Sosa identifies reason, perception, introspection, and memory as among the qualities that most obviously satisfy these conditions.

Sosa’s initial appeal to intellectual virtue in “The Raft and the Pyramid” is aimed specifically at resolving the foundationalist/coherentist dispute over the structure of epistemic justification. (Sosa has since attempted to show that virtue concepts are useful for addressing other epistemological problems as well; the focus here, however, will be limited to his seminal discussion in the “The Raft and the Pyramid.”) According to Sosa, traditional formulations of both foundationalism and coherentism have fatal defects. The main problem with coherentism, he argues, is that it fails to give adequate epistemic weight to experience. The coherentist claims roughly that a belief is justified just in case it coheres with the rest of what one believes. But it is possible for a belief to satisfy this condition and yet be disconnected from or even to conflict with one’s experience. In such cases, the belief in question intuitively is unjustified, thereby indicating the inadequacy of the coherentist’s criterion for justification (1991: 184-85). Sosa also sees standard foundationalist accounts of justification as seriously flawed. The foundationalist holds that the justification of nonbasic beliefs derives from that of basic or foundational beliefs and that the latter are justified on the basis of things like sensory experience, memory, and rational insight. According to Sosa, an adequate version of foundationalism must explain the apparent unity of the various foundationalist principles that connect the ultimate sources of justification with the beliefs they justify. But traditional versions of foundationalism, Sosa claims, seem utterly incapable of providing such an explanation, especially when the possibility of creatures with radically different perceptual or cognitive mechanisms than our own (and hence of radically different epistemic principles) is taken into account (187-89).

Sosa briefly sketches a model of epistemic justification that he says would provide the required kind of explanation. This model depicts justification as “stratified”: it attaches primary justification to intellectual virtues like sensory experience and memory and secondary justification to beliefs produced by these virtues. A belief is justified, according to the model, just in case it is has its source in an intellectual virtue (189). Sosa’s proposed view of justification is, in effect, an externalist version of foundationalism, since a belief can have its source in an intellectual virtue and hence be justified without this fact’s being internally or subjectively accessible to the person who holds it. This model provides an explanation of the unity of foundationalist epistemic principles by incorporating the foundationalist sources of epistemic justification under the concept of an intellectual virtue and offering a unified account of why beliefs grounded in intellectual virtue are justified (namely, because they are likely to be true). If Sosa’s criticisms of traditional coherentist and foundationalist views together with his own positive proposal are plausible, virtue reliabilism apparently has the resources to deal effectively with one of the more challenging and longstanding problems in contemporary epistemology.

John Greco also gives the intellectual virtues conceived as reliable cognitive faculties or abilities a central epistemological role. Greco characterizes intellectual virtues generally as “broad cognitive abilities or powers” that are helpful for reaching the truth. He claims, more specifically, that intellectual virtues are “innate faculties or acquired habits that enable a person to arrive at truth and avoid error in some relevant field.” These include things like “perception, reliable memory, and various kinds of good reasoning” (2002: 287).

Greco offers an account of knowledge according to which one knows a given proposition just in case one believes the truth regarding that proposition because one believes out of an intellectual virtue (311). This definition is broken down by Greco as follows. It requires, first, that one be subjectively justified in believing the relevant claim. According to Greco, one is subjectively justified in believing a given proposition just in case this belief is produced by dispositions that one manifests when one is motivated to believe what it is true. Greco stipulates that an exercise of intellectual virtue entails the manifestation of such dispositions. Second, Greco’s definition of knowledge requires that one’s belief be objectively justified. This means that one’s belief must be produced by one or more of one’s intellectual virtues. Third, Greco’s definition requires that one believe the truth regarding the claim in question because one believes the claim out of one or more of one’s intellectual virtues. In other words, one’s being objectively justified must be a necessary and salient part of the explanation for why one believes the truth.

Greco discusses several alleged virtues of his account of knowledge. One of these is the reply it offers to the skeptic. According to one variety of skepticism, we do not and cannot have any non-question-begging reasons for thinking that any of our beliefs about the external world are true, for any such reasons inevitably depend for their force on some of the very beliefs in question (305-06). Greco replies by claiming that the skeptic’s reasoning presupposes a mistaken view of the relation between knowledge and epistemic grounds or reasons. The skeptic assumes that to know a given claim, one must be in possession of grounds or reasons which, via some inductive, deductive, or other logical or quasi-logical principle, provide one with a cogent reason for thinking that the claim is true or likely to be true. If Greco’s account of knowledge is correct, this mischaracterizes the conditions for knowledge. Greco’s account requires merely that an agent’s grounds be reliable, or rather, that an agent herself be reliable on account of a disposition to believe on reliable grounds. It follows that as long as a disposition to form beliefs about the external world on the basis of sensory experience of that world is reliable, knowledge of the external world is possible for a person who possesses this disposition. But since an agent can be so disposed and yet lack grounds for her belief that satisfy the skeptic’s more stringent demands, Greco can conclude that knowledge does not require the satisfaction of these demands (307).

b. Prospects for Virtue Reliabilism

The foregoing indicates some of the ways that virtue reliabilist accounts of knowledge and justification may, if headed in the right general direction, provide helpful ways of addressing some of the more challenging problems in epistemology. It remains, however, that one is likely to find these views plausible only to the extent that one is already convinced of a certain, not wholly uncontroversial position that undergirds and partly motivates them.

Virtue reliabilist accounts of knowledge and justification are versions of epistemological externalism: they deny that the factors grounding one’s justification must be cognitively accessible from one’s first-person or internal perspective. Consequently, whatever their strengths as versions of externalism, virtue reliabilist views are likely to prove unsatisfying to anyone with considerable internalist sympathies. Consider, for example, a version of internalism according to which one is justified in believing a given claim just in case one has an adequate reason for thinking that the claim is true. It is not difficult to see why, if this account of justification were correct, the virtue reliabilist views considered above would be less promising than they might initially appear.

Sosa, for instance, attempts to resolve the conflict between foundationalism and coherentism by offering an externalist version of foundationalism. But traditionally, the coherentist/foundationalist debate has been an in-house debate among internalists. Coherentists and foundationalists alike have generally agreed that to be justified in believing a given claim is to have a good reason for thinking that the claim is true. The disagreement has been over the logical structure of such a reason, with coherentists claiming that the structure should be characterized in terms of doxastic coherence relations and foundationalists that it should be characterized mainly in terms of relations between foundational beliefs and the beliefs they support. Sosa rejects this shared assumption. He claims that justification consists in a belief’s having its source in an intellectual virtue. But a belief can have its source in an intellectual virtue without one’s being aware of it and hence without one’s having any reason at all for thinking that the belief is true. Therefore, Sosa’s response to the coherentism/foundationalism debate is likely to strike traditional coherentists and foundationalists as seriously problematic.

(It is worth noting in passing that in later work [e.g. 1991], Sosa claims that the kind of justification just described is sufficient, when combined with the other elements of knowledge, merely for “animal knowledge” and not for “reflective” or “human knowledge.” The latter requires the possession of an “epistemic perspective” on any known proposition. While Sosa is not entirely clear on the matter, this apparently requires the satisfaction of something like either traditional coherentist or traditional foundationalist conditions for justification [see, e.g., BonJour 1995].)

An internalist is likely to have a similar reaction to Greco’s response to the skeptic. Greco argues against skepticism about the external world by claiming that if a disposition to reason from the appearance of an external world to the existence of that world is in fact reliable then knowledge of the external world is possible for a person who possesses such a disposition. But this view allows for knowledge of the external world in certain cases where a person lacks any cogent or even merely non-question-begging reasons for thinking that the external world exists. As a result, Greco’s more lenient requirements for knowledge are likely to seem to internalists more like a capitulation to rather than a victory over skepticism.

Of course these considerations do not by themselves show virtue reliabilism to be implausible, as the internalist viewpoint in question is itself a matter of some controversy. Indeed, Sosa and Greco alike have argued vigorously against internalism and have lobbied for externalism as the only way out of the skeptical bog. But the debate between internalists and externalists remains a live one and the foregoing indicates that the promise of virtue reliabilism hangs in a deep and important way on the outcome of this debate.

3. Virtue Responsibilism

a. Key Figures

Virtue responsibilism contrasts with virtue reliabilism in at least two important ways. First, virtue responsibilists think of intellectual virtues, not as cognitive faculties like introspection and memory, but rather as traits of character like attentiveness, intellectual courage, carefulness, and thoroughness. Second, while virtue reliabilists tend to focus on the task of providing a virtue-based account of knowledge or justification, several virtue responsibilists have seen fit to pursue different and fairly untraditional epistemological projects.

One of the first contemporary philosophers to discuss the epistemological role of the intellectual virtues conceived as character traits is Lorraine Code (1987). Code claims that epistemologists should pay considerably more attention to the personal, active, and social dimensions of the cognitive life and she attempts to motivate and outline an approach to epistemology that does just this. The central focus of her approach is the notion of epistemic responsibility, as an epistemically responsible person is especially likely to succeed in the areas of the cognitive life that Code says deserve priority. Epistemic responsibility, she claims, is the chief intellectual virtue and the virtue “from which other virtues radiate” (44). Some of these other virtues are open-mindedness, intellectual openness, honesty, and integrity. Since Code maintains that epistemic responsibility should be the focus of epistemology and thinks of epistemic responsibility in terms of virtuous intellectual character, she views the intellectual virtues as deserving an important and fundamental role in epistemology.

Code claims that intellectual virtue is fundamentally “a matter of orientation toward the world, toward one’s knowledge-seeking self, and toward other such selves as part of the world” (20). This orientation is partly constituted by what she calls “normative realism”: “[I]t is helpful to think of intellectual goodness as having a realist orientation. It is only those who, in their knowing, strive to do justice to the object – to the world they want to know as well as possible – who can aspire to intellectual virtue … Intellectually virtuous persons value knowing and understanding how things really are” (59). To be intellectually virtuous on Code’s view is thus to regard reality as genuinely intellectually penetrable; it is to regard ourselves and others as having the ability to know and understand the world as it really is. It is also to view such knowledge as an important good, as worth having and pursuing.

Code also claims that the structure of the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life are such that an adequate conception of these things is unlikely to be achieved via the standard methodologies of contemporary epistemology. She claims that an accurate and illuminating account of the intellectual virtues and their cognitive significance must draw on the resources of fiction (201) and often must be content with accurate generalizations rather than airtight technical definitions (254).

Because of its uniqueness on points of both content and method, Code’s suggested approach to epistemology is relatively unconcerned with traditional epistemological problems. But she sees this as an advantage. She believes that the scope of traditional epistemology is too narrow and that it overemphasizes the importance of analyzing abstract doxastic properties (e.g., knowledge and justification) (253-54). Her view focuses alternatively on cognitive character in its own right, the role of choice in intellectual flourishing, the relation between moral and epistemic normativity, and the social and communal dimensions of the intellectual life. The result, she claims, is a more rich and “human” approach to epistemology.

A second contemporary philosopher to give considerable attention to the intellectual virtues understood as character traits is James Montmarquet. Montmarquet’s interest in these traits arises from a prior concern with moral responsibility (1993). He thinks that to make sense of certain instances moral responsibility, an appeal must be made to a virtue-based conception of doxastic responsibility.

According to Montmarquet, the chief intellectual virtue is epistemic conscientiousness, which he characterizes as a desire to achieve the proper ends of the intellectual life, especially the desire for truth and the avoidance of error (21). Montmarquet’s “epistemic conscientiousness” bears a close resemblance to Code’s “epistemic responsibility.” But Montmarquet is quick to point out that a desire for truth is not sufficient for being fully intellectually virtuous and indeed is compatible with the possession of vices like intellectual dogmatism or fanaticism. He therefore supplements his account with three additional kinds of virtues that regulate this desire. The first are virtues of impartiality, which include “an openness to the ideas of others, the willingness to exchange ideas with and learn from them, the lack of jealousy and personal bias directed at their ideas, and the lively sense of one’s own infallibility.” A second set of virtues are those of intellectual sobriety: “These are the virtues of the sober-minded inquirer, as opposed to the ‘enthusiast’ who is disposed, out of sheer love of truth, discovery, and the excitement of new and unfamiliar ideas, to embrace what is not really warranted, even relative to the limits of his own evidence.” Finally, there are virtues of intellectual courage, which include “the willingness to conceive and examine alternatives to popularly held beliefs, perseverance in the face of opposition from others (until one is convinced that one is mistaken), and the determination required to see such a project through to completion” (23).

Montmarquet argues that the status of these traits as virtues cannot adequately be explained on account of their actual reliability or truth-conduciveness. He claims, first, that if we were to learn that, say, owing to the work of a Cartesian demon, the traits we presently regard as intellectual virtues actually lead us away from the truth and the traits we regard as intellectual vices lead us to the truth, we would not immediately revise our judgments about the worth or virtue of those epistemic agents we have known to possess the traits in question (e.g., we would not then regard someone like Galileo as intellectually vicious) (20). Second, he points out that many of those we would regard as more or less equally intellectually virtuous (e.g., Aristotle, Ptolemy, Galileo, Newton, Einstein, etc.) were not equally successful at reaching the truth (21).

Montmarquet goes on to argue that the traits we presently regard as intellectual virtues merit this status because they are qualities that a truth-desiring person would want to have (30). The desire for truth therefore plays an important and basic normative role in Montmarquet’s account of intellectual virtue. The value or worth of this desire explains why the traits that emerge from it should be regarded as intellectual virtues.

Unlike Code, Montmarquet does not call for a reorientation of epistemology on the intellectual virtues. His concern is considerably narrower. He is interested mainly in cases in which an agent performs a morally wrong action which from her own point of view is morally justified. In some such cases, the person in question intuitively is morally responsible for her action. But this is possible, Montmarquet argues, only if we can hold the person responsible for the beliefs that permitted the action. He concludes that moral responsibility is sometimes grounded in doxastic responsibility.

Montmarquet appeals to the concept of an intellectual virtue when further clarifying the relevant sense of doxastic responsibility. He claims that in cases of the sort in question, a person can escape moral blame only if the beliefs that license her action are attributable to an exercise of intellectual virtue. Beliefs that satisfy this condition count as epistemically justified in a certain subjective sense (99). Thus on Montmarquet’s view, the intellectual virtues are central to an account of doxastic responsibility which in turn is importantly related to the notion of moral responsibility.

Linda Zagzebski’s treatment of the intellectual virtues in her book Virtues of the Mind (1996) is one of the most thoroughly and systematically developed in the literature. Zagzebski is unquestionably a virtue responsibilist, as she clearly thinks of intellectual virtues as traits of character. That said, her view bears a notable resemblance to several virtue reliabilist views because its main component is a virtue-based account of knowledge.

Zagzebski begins this account with a detailed and systematic treatment of the structure of a virtue. She says that a virtue, whether moral or intellectual, is “a deep and enduring acquired excellence of a person” (137). She also claims that all virtues have two main components: a motivation component and a success component. Accordingly, to possess an intellectual virtue, a person must be motivated by and reliably successful at achieving certain intellectual ends. These ends are of two sorts (1999: 106). The first are ultimate or final intellectual ends like truth and understanding. Zagzebski’s account thus resembles both Code’s and Montmarquet’s, since she also views the intellectual virtues as arising fundamentally from a motivation or desire to achieve certain intellectual goods. The second set of ends consists of proximate or immediate ends that differ from virtue to virtue. The immediate end of intellectual courage, for instance, is to persist in a belief or inquiry in the face of pressure to give it up, while the immediate end of open-mindedness is to genuinely consider the merits of others’ views, even when they conflict with one’s own. Thus, on Zagzebski’s view, an intellectually courageous person, for instance, is motivated to persist in certain beliefs or inquiries out of a desire for truth and is reliably successful at doing so.

Zagzebski claims that knowledge is belief arising from “acts of intellectual virtue.” An “act of intellectual virtue” is an act that “gets everything right”: it involves having an intellectually virtuous motive, doing what an intellectually virtuous person would do in the situation, and reaching the truth as a result (1996: 270-71). One performs an act of fair-mindedness, for example, just in case one exhibits the motivational state characteristic of this virtue, does what a fair-minded person would do in the situation, and reaches the truth as a result. Knowledge is acquired when one forms a belief out of one or more acts of this sort.

As this characterization indicates, the justification or warrant condition on Zagzebski’s analysis of knowledge entails the truth condition, since part of what it is to perform an act of intellectual virtue is to reach the truth or to form a true belief, and to do so through certain virtuous motives and acts. This explains why Zagzebski characterizes knowledge simply as belief – rather than true belief – arising from acts of intellectual virtue.

Zagzebski claims that this tight connection between the warrant and truth conditions for knowledge makes her analysis immune to Gettier counterexamples (1996: 296-98). She characterizes Gettier cases as situations in which the connection between the warrant condition and truth condition for knowledge is severed by a stroke of bad luck and subsequently restored by a stroke of good luck. Suppose that during the middle of the day I look at the highly reliable clock in my office and find that it reads five minutes past 12. I form the belief that it is five past 12, and this belief is true. Unknown to me, however, the clock unexpectedly stopped exactly 12 hours prior, at 12:05 AM. My belief in this case is true, but only as a result of good luck. And this stroke of good luck cancels out an antecedent stroke of bad luck consisting in the fact that my ordinarily reliable clock has malfunctioned without my knowing it. While my belief is apparently both true and justified, it is not an instance of knowledge.

Zagzebski’s account of knowledge generates the intuitively correct conclusion in this and similar cases. My belief about the time, for instance, fails to satisfy her conditions for knowledge because what explains my reaching the truth is not any virtuous motive or activity on my part, but rather a stroke of good luck. Thus by making it a necessary condition for knowledge that a person reach the truth through or because of virtuous motives and actions, Zagzebski apparently is able to rule out cases in which a person gets to the truth in the fortuitous manner characteristic of Gettier cases.

b. Prospects for Virtue Responsibilism

Virtue responsibilist views clearly are a diverse lot. This complicates any account of the apparent prospects of virtue responsibilism, since these prospects are likely to vary from one virtue responsibilist view to another. It does seem fairly clear, however, that as analyses of knowledge or justification, virtue responsibilism faces a formidable difficulty. Any such analysis presumably will make something like an exercise of intellectual virtue a necessary condition either for knowledge or for justification. The problem with such a requirement is that knowledge and justification often are acquired in a more or less passive way, that is, in a way that makes few if any demands on the character of the cognitive agent in question. Suppose, for example, that I am working in my study late at night and the electricity suddenly shuts off, causing all the lights in the room to go out. I will immediately know that the lighting in the room has changed. Yet in acquiring this knowledge, it is extremely unlikely that I exercise any virtuous intellectual character traits; rather, my belief is likely to be produced primarily, if not entirely, by the routine operation of my faculty of vision. Given this and related possibilities, an exercise of intellectual virtue cannot be a necessary condition for knowledge or justification.

This point has obvious implications for a view like Zagzebski’s. In the case just noted, I do not exhibit any virtuous intellectual motives. Moreover, while I may not act differently than an intellectually virtuous person would in the circumstances, neither can I be said to act in a way that is characteristic of intellectual virtue. Finally, I get to the truth in this case, not as a result of virtuous motives or actions, but rather as a result of the more or less automatic operation of one of my cognitive faculties. Thus, on several points, my belief fails to satisfy Zagzebski’s requirements for knowledge.

This suggests that any remaining hope for virtue responsibilism must lie with views that do not attempt to offer a virtue-based analysis of knowledge or justification. But such views, which include the views of Code and Montmarquet, also face a serious and rather general challenge. Virtue epistemologists claim that virtue concepts deserve an important and fundamental role in epistemology. But once it is acknowledged that these concepts should not play a central role in an analysis of knowledge or justification, it becomes difficult to see how the virtue responsibilist’s claim about the epistemological importance of the intellectual virtues can be defended, for it is at best unclear whether there are any other traditional epistemological issues or questions that a consideration of intellectual virtue is likely to shed much light on. It is unclear, for instance, how reflection on the intellectual virtues as understood by virtue responsibilists could shed any significant light on questions about the possible limits or sources of knowledge.

Any viable version of virtue responsibilism must, then, do two things. First, it must show that there is a unified set of substantive philosophical issues and questions to be pursued in connection with the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life. In the absence of such issues and questions, the philosophical significance of the intellectual virtues and the overall plausibility of virtue responsibilism itself remain questionable. Second, if these issues and questions are to form the basis of an alternative approach to epistemology, they must be the proper subject matter of epistemology itself, rather than of ethics or some other related discipline.

The views of Code and Montmarquet appear to falter with respect to either one or the other of these two conditions. Code, for instance, provides a convincing case for the claim that the possession of virtuous intellectual character is crucial to intellectual flourishing, especially when the more personal and social dimensions of intellectual flourishing are taken into account. But she fails to identify anything like a unified set of substantive philosophical issues and questions that might be pursued in connection with these traits. Nor is it obvious from her discussion what such questions and issues might be. This leaves the impression that while Code has identified an important insight about the value of the intellectual virtues, this insight does not have significant theoretical implications and therefore cannot successfully motivate anything like an alternative approach to epistemology.

Montmarquet, on the other hand, does identify several interesting philosophical questions related to intellectual virtue, for example, questions about the connection between moral and doxastic responsibility, the role of intellectual character in the kind of doxastic responsibility relevant to moral responsibility, and doxastic voluntarism as it relates to issues of moral and doxastic responsibility. The problem with Montmarquet’s view as a version of virtue responsibilism, however, is that the questions he identifies seem like the proper subject matter of ethics rather than epistemology. While he does offer a virtue-based conception of epistemic justification, he is quick to point out that this conception is not of the sort that typically interests epistemologists, but rather is aimed at illuminating one aspect of moral responsibility (1993: 104). Indeed, taken as an account of epistemic justification in any of the usual senses, Montmarquet’s view is obviously problematic, since it is possible to be justified in any of these senses without satisfying Montmarquet’s conditions, that is, without exercising any virtuous intellectual character traits. (This again is due to the fact that knowledge and justification are sometimes acquired in a more or less passive way.) Montmarquet’s view therefore apparently fails to satisfy the second of the two conditions noted above.

Jonathan Kvanvig (1992) offers a treatment of the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life that comes closer than that of either Code or Montmarquet to showing that there are substantive questions concerning these traits that might reasonably be pursued by an epistemologist. Kvanvig maintains that the intellectual virtues should be the focus of epistemological inquiry but that this is impossible given the Cartesian structure and orientation of traditional epistemology. He therefore commends a radically different epistemological perspective, one that places fundamental importance on the social and cross-temporal dimensions of the cognitive life and gives a backseat to questions about the nature and limits of knowledge and justification.

While the majority of Kvanvig’s discussion is devoted to showing that the traditional framework of epistemology leaves little room for considerations of intellectual virtue (and hence that this framework should be abandoned), he does go some way toward sketching a theoretical program motivated by his proposed alternative perspective that allegedly would give the intellectual virtues a central role. One of the main themes of this program concerns how, over the course of a life, “one progresses down the path toward cognitive ideality.” Understanding this progression, Kvanvig claims, would require addressing issues related to “social patterns of mimicry and imitation,” cognitive exemplars, and “the importance of training and practice in learning how to search for the truth” (172). Another crucial issue on Kvanvig’s view concerns “accounting for the superiority from an epistemological point of view of certain communities and the bodies of knowledge they generate.” This might involve asking, for instance, “what makes physics better off than, say, astrology; or what makes scientific books, articles, addresses, or lectures somehow more respectable from an epistemological point of view than books, articles, addresses or lectures regarding astrology” (176). Kvanvig maintains that answers to these and related questions will give a crucial role to the intellectual virtues, as he, like Code, thinks that the success of a cognitive agent in the more social and diachronic dimensions of the cognitive life depends crucially on the extent to which the agent embodies these virtues (183).

Kvanvig’s discussion along these lines is suggestive and may indeed point in the direction of a plausible and innovative version of virtue responsibilism. But without seeing the issues and questions he touches on developed and addressed in considerably more detail, it is difficult to tell whether they really could support a genuine alternative approach to epistemology and whether the intellectual virtues would really be the main focus of such an approach. It follows that the viability of virtue responsibilism remains at least to some extent an open question. But if virtue responsibilism is viable, this apparently must be on account of approaches that are in the same general vein as Kvanvig’s, that is, approaches that attempt to stake out an area of inquiry regarding the nature and cognitive significance of the intellectual virtues that is at once philosophically substantial as well as the proper subject matter of epistemology.

4. The Reliabilist/Responsibilist Divide

Virtue reliabilists and virtue responsibilists appear to be advocating two fundamentally different and perhaps opposing kinds of epistemology. The former view certain cognitive faculties or powers as central to epistemology and the latter certain traits of intellectual character. The two approaches also sometimes differ about the proper aims or goals of epistemology: virtue reliabilists tend to uphold the importance of traditional epistemological projects like the analysis of knowledge, while some virtue responsibilists give priority to new and different epistemological concerns. The impression of a deep difference between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism is reinforced by at least two additional considerations. First, by defining the notion of intellectual virtue in terms of intellectual character, virtue responsibilists seem to rule out ex hypothesi any significant role in their theories for the cognitive abilities that interest the virtue reliabilist. Second, some supporters of virtue reliabilism have claimed outright that the character traits of interest to the virtue responsibilist have little bearing on the questions that are most central to a virtue reliabilist epistemology (Goldman 1992: 162).

But the divide between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism is not entirely what it seems. Minimally, the two approaches are not always incompatible. A virtue reliabilist, for instance, can hold that relative to questions concerning the nature of knowledge and justification, a faculty-based approach is most promising, while still maintaining that there are interesting and substantive epistemological questions (even if not of the traditional variety) to be pursued in connection with the character traits that interest the virtue responsibilist (see, e.g., Greco 2002).

More importantly, there is a sense in which the very distinction between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism is considerably more sketchy than it initially appears. Virtue reliabilists conceive of intellectual virtues, broadly, as stable and reliable cognitive qualities. In developing their views, they go on to focus more or less exclusively on cognitive faculties or powers like introspection, vision, reason, and the like. To a certain extent, this approach is quite reasonable. After all, the virtue reliabilist is fundamentally concerned with those traits that explain one’s ability to get to the truth in a reliable way, and in many cases, all that is required for reaching the truth is the proper functioning of one’s cognitive faculties. For example, to reach the truth about the appearance of one’s immediate surroundings, one need only have good vision. Or to reach the truth about whether one is in pain, one need only be able to introspect. Therefore, as long as virtue reliabilists limit their attention to instances of knowledge like these, a more or less exclusive focus on cognitive faculties and related abilities seems warranted.

But reaching the truth often requires much more than the proper operation of one’s cognitive faculties. Indeed, reaching the truth about things that matter most to human beings – e.g., matters of history, science, philosophy, religion, morality, etc. – would seem frequently to depend more, or at least more saliently, on rather different qualities, many of which are excellences of intellectual character. An important scientific discovery, for example, is rarely explainable primarily in terms of a scientist’s good memory, excellent eyesight, or proficiency at drawing valid logical inferences. While these things may play a role in such an explanation, this role is likely to be secondary to the role played by other qualities, for instance, the scientist’s creativity, ingenuity, intellectual adaptability, thoroughness, persistence, courage, and so forth. And many of these are the very traits of interest to the virtue responsibilist.

It appears that since virtue reliabilists are principally interested in those traits that play a critical or salient role in helping a person reach the truth, they cannot reasonably neglect matters of intellectual character. They too should be concerned with better understanding the nature and intellectual significance of the character traits that interest the virtue responsibilist. Indeed, the most plausible version of virtue reliabilism will incorporate many of these traits into its repertoire of virtues and in doing so will go significant lengths toward bridging the gap between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. 1985. Nicomachean Ethics, trans. Terence Irwin (Indianapolis: Hackett).
  • Axtell, Guy. 1997. “Recent Work in Virtue Epistemology,” American Philosophical Quarterly 34: 1-27.
  • Axtell, Guy, ed. 2000. Knowledge, Belief, and Character (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield).
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1995. “Sosa on Knowledge, Justification, and ‘Aptness’,” Philosophical Studies 78: 207-220. Reprinted in Axtell (2000).
  • Code, Lorraine. 1987. Epistemic Responsibility (Hanover, NH: University Press of New England).
  • Crisp, Roger and Michael Slote, eds. 1997. Virtue Ethics (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • DePaul, Michael and Linda Zagzebski. 2003. Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Fairweather, Abrol and Linda Zagzebski. 2001. Virtue Epistemology: Essays on Epistemic Virtue and Responsibility (New York: Oxford UP).
  • Goldman, Alvin. 1992. “Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology,” Liaisons: Philosophy Meets the Cognitive and Social Sciences (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press).
  • Greco, John. 1992. “Virtue Epistemology,” A Companion to Epistemology, eds. Jonathan Dancy and Ernest Sosa (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Greco, John. 1993. “Virtues and Vices of Virtue Epistemology,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 23: 413-32.
  • Greco, John. 1999. “Agent Reliabilism,” Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology, ed. James Tomberlin (Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview).
  • Greco, John. 2000. “Two Kinds of Intellectual Virtue,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60: 179-84.
  • Greco, John. 2002. “Virtues in Epistemology,” Oxford Handbook of Epistemology, ed. Paul Moser (New York: Oxford UP).
  • Hookway, Christopher. 1994. “Cognitive Virtues and Epistemic Evaluations,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 2: 211-27.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan. 1992. The Intellectual Virtues and the Life of the Mind (Savage, MD: Rowman & Littlefield).
  • Montmarquet, James. 1992. “Epistemic Virtue,” A Companion to Epistemology, eds. Jonathan Dancy and Ernest Sosa (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Montmarquet, James. 1993. Epistemic Virtue and Doxastic Responsibility (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield).
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993. Warrant and Proper Function (New York: Oxford UP).
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1980. “The Raft and the Pyramid: Coherence versus Foundations in the Theory of Knowledge,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy V: 3-25. Reprinted in Sosa (1991).
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1991. Knowledge in Perspective (Cambridge: Cambridge UP).
  • Steup, Matthias. 2001. Knowledge, Truth, and Duty (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind (Cambridge: Cambridge UP).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1998. “Virtue Epistemology,” Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Edward Craig (London: Routledge).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1999. “What Is Knowledge?” The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology, eds. John Greco and Ernest Sosa (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 2000. “From Reliabilism to Virtue Epistemology,” Axtell (2000).

Author Information

Jason S. Baehr
Email: Jbaehr@lmu.edu
Loyola Marymount University
U. S. A.

Last updated: August 28, 2004 | Originally published: