Voluntarism is the theory that God or the ultimate nature of reality is to be conceived as some form of will (or conation). This theory is contrasted to intellectualism, which gives primacy to God’s reason. The voluntarism/intellectualism distinction was intimately tied to medieval and modern theories of natural law; if we grant that moral or physical laws issue from God, it next needs to answered whether they issue from God’s will or God’s reason. In medieval philosophy, voluntarism was championed by Avicebron, Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. Intellectualism, on the other hand, is found in Averroes, Aquinas, and Eckhart. The opposing theories were applied to the human psychology, the nature of God, ethics, and the heaven. According to intellectualism, choices of the will result from that which the intellect recognizes as good; the will itself is determined. For voluntarism, by contrast, it is the will which determines which objects are good, and the will itself is indetermined. Concerning the nature of heaven, intellectualists followed Aristotle‘s lead by seeing the final state of happiness as a state of contemplation. Voluntarism, by contrast, maintains that final happiness is an activity, specifically that of love. The conceptions of theology itself were polarized between these two views. According to intellectualism, theology should be an essentiall speculative science; according to voluntarism, it is a practical science aimed at controlling life, but not necessarily aimed at comprehending philosophic truth.In the modern period Spinoza advocates intellectualism insofar as desire is an indication of imperfection, and the passions are a source of human bondage. When all things are seen purely in rational relations, desire is stilled, the mind is freed from the passions and we experience the intellectual love of God, which is the ideal happiness. According to Leibniz, Spinoza’s interpretation of the world as rational and logical left no place for the individual, or for the conception of ends or purposes as a determining factor in reality. Voluntarism is seen in Leibniz‘s view of the laws which govern monads (individual units of which all reality is composed) in so far as they are the laws of the conscious realization of ends.
19th century voluntarism has its origin in Kant, particularly his doctrine of the “primacy of the practical over the pure reason.” Intellectually, humans are incapable of knowing ultimate reality, but this need not and must not interfere with the duty of acting as though the spiritual character of this reality were certain. Freedom cannot be demonstrated speculatively, but whenever a person acts under a motive supplied by reason, he is thereby exhibiting the practical efficiency of reason, and thus showing its reality in a practical sense. Following Kant, two distinct lines of voluntarism have proceeded which may be called rational and irrational voluntarism respectively. For Fichte, the originator of rational voluntarism, the ethical is primary both in the sphere of conduct and in the sphere of knowledge. The whole nature of consciousness can be understood only from the point of view of ends which are set up by the self. The actual world, with all the activity that it has, is only to be understood as material for the activity of the practical reason, as the means through which the will achieves complete freedom and complete moral realization. Schopenhauer’s irrational voluntarism asserts a more radical opposition between the will and intellect. For him, the will is by its very nature irrational. It manifests itself in various stages in the world of nature as physical, chemical, magnetic, and vital force, pre-eminently, however, in the animal kingdom in the form of “the will to live,” which means the tendency to assert itself in the struggle for means of existence and for reproduction of the species. This activity is all of it blind, so far as the individual agent is concerned, although the power and existence of the will are thereby asserted continually.
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Last updated: August 28, 2004 | Originally published: