Help Sheet for Copy Editing Articles

Each new IEP article should be copy edited by a copy editor. However, it is not the responsibility of a copy editor to turn a poorly written article into a well written article, but only to revise obvious errors and to enforce the Encyclopedia's style guidelines.

Table of Contents

  1. Copy Editing New Submissions
  2. Copy Editing Existing Articles
  3. Depth or Extent of Copy Editing
  4. Avoid Awkward Phrases
  5. Style Preferences
    1. Author Guidelines
    2. Summary
    3. Article Title
    4. Headings
    5. Table of Contents
    6. Author Information
    7. American vs. British English
    8. References and Further Reading
    9. Hyperlinks
    10. Footnotes and Endnotes
    11. Acknowledgments and Thank Yous
    12. Latin Abbreviations
    13. Author's Ego
    14. Pejorative Terms
    15. Underlining
    16. Dates
    17. Initials
    18. Mentioning Now or Recent Time
    19. Quotations
    20. Quotation Marks and Italics
    21. Contractions
    22. Dashes and hyphens
    23. 'is' vs. 'will be'

1. Copy Editing New Submissions

The name of the copy editor is never revealed either to the author or to the area editor. Here is an example of the copy editing process from the volunteer copy editor's viewpoint. You will be sent an original article manuscript that has been approved by the referees and modified by the author and perhaps the area editor.  Make a copy of this file, save it under a new name, perhaps by adding "copyedited" at the end. Then do your copyediting on this file.  The manuscript will probably be an MS Word document. Your goal is to produce a copy edited version which you will send to the person who sent you the original. [If you click on "copy edited" in that previous sentence you will notice that the copy editor forgot to change Roman numerals in the table of contents to regular Arabic numerals.] The new version of the article will then be approved and sent on to a formatter to produce a formatted version that is placed within the Encyclopedia. You will receive a notification when the article is published.

In  the document that you are copy editing, you may indicate your changes in two ways: (1) In your MS Word program, click on Review | Track changes. That is, mark up the original Word document using that program’s built-in markup feature as in the example; (2) or make a separate errata list, such as this:

Table of contents: change Roman numerals to Arabic numerals

Section 4: replace “most men are mortal” with “all men are mortal."

Method (2) will be tedious.

Your goal is to improve the English without affecting the philosophical content. But be a minimalist. Poor writers should live with the consequences of their writing ability, but the copy editor will make some minimal improvements to correct clear errors or violations of the Encyclopedia's style requirements.  If you have any doubts about whether something needs to be changed, then use the Comment feature of Word to describe the problem, or write to the person who sent you the article.

When you are done copy editing, be sure to save a copy of your work by choosing Review | Accept All Changes in Document. Then you can look to see if you made any mistakes.

2. Copy Editing Existing Articles

For articles that have already been published but for some reason were not properly copy edited, the general editors will advise you on the proper procedure for copy editing.

3. Depth or Extent of Copy Editing

How much copy editing is appropriate? Don't be too picky. Be a minimalist and change only what is clearly confusing or sloppy. What that vague comment means is illustrated by this example which was chosen because there were so many errors that needed changing. Usually your document won't require quite so many changes.  The bottom line is that authors who are weak writers must live with what they create. Here is the list of rules that all good writers follow:

1. Be more or less specific.
2. Use not bad grammars.
3. Proofread carefully to see if you any words out.
4. Don't use no double negatives.
5. Avoid tumbling off the cliff of triteness into the dark abyss of overused metaphors.
6. Take care that your verb and your subject is in agreement.
7. No sentence fragments.
8. Placing a comma between subject and predicate, is not correct.
9. Who needs rhetorical questions?
10. Use the apostrophe in it's proper place.
11. Avoid colloquial stuff, like totally.
12. Avoid those run-on sentences you know the ones they stop and then start again they should be separated with semicolons.
13. The passive voice should be used infrequently.
14. And don't start sentences with a conjunction.
15. Excessive use of exclamation points can be disastrous!!!!
16. Exaggeration is a million times worse than understatement.
17. Stamp out and eliminate redundancy because, if you reread your work, you will find on rereading that a great deal of repetition can be avoided by rereading and editing, so reread your work and improve it by editing out the repetition you noticed during the rereading.
18. Tis incumbent upon one to employ the vernacular and eschew archaisms.
19. It's not O.K. to use ampersands & abbreviations.
20. Parenthetical remarks (however relevant) are usually (but not always) an obstacle for readers (and make it harder on readers even if you're being careful) who have the task of understanding your work (article, passage, document, and so forth).

4. Avoid Awkward Phrases

Notice this sentence:

If mind and sensation appear on the scene only as after-affects, one has to wonder how human experience can be anything but an ineffectual, spectatorial undergoing.

The last two words are confusing. Rewrite them this way:

...anything but an ineffectual, spectator process.

Maybe you also noticed that the phrase "after-affects" should be "after-effects."

5. Style Preferences

a. Author Guidelines

Become familiar with the author guidelines so that you have a good sense of what we expect from our authors. You are the enforcer of those guidelines.

b. Opening Summary

All articles should begin with a 200-500 word summary (synopsis). If the summary is absent, or significantly short or long, then contact the person who sent you the article. The summary should not contain a heading or subheadings or internal links to the table of contents, but it is OK for it to be broken into paragraphs. The IEP style is to refer to one of its own articles not as an "entry" but as an "article."

c. Article Title

Capitalize words as if the title is the name of a book. For articles on an individual philosopher, do not leave out the philosopher's first name. For an article on an individual philosopher, include the birth date and, if they have died, their death date. Separate the two dates with an em-dash (—) and neither a hyphen (-) nor blank. Use periods in “B.C.E.” and “C.E.” without blanks. Use “C.E.” only if the year's number is less than 500. Abbreviate “circa” as “c.” rather than "ca" or "CA." Do not insert a blank between it and the date: Anaxagoras (c.500—428 B.C.E.). If both the birth date and the death date are guesses, then use two circas as in: Anaxarchus (c.380—c.320 B.C.E.), use question marks as in: Anaxarchus (380?—320? B.C.E.). Abbreviate “century” as “cn.” and separate this from the date number with a blank, as in the following: Alexander Polyhistor (1st cn. B.C.E.). If an article about a philosopher contains both a second spelling and a date, then put both the second spelling, then a comma and blank, then the date, all in parentheses, as in : Zhuangzi (Chuang-Tzu, 369—298 B.C.E.).

d. Headings

Make sure the headings in the article match the headings in the table of contents. Trust the table of contents when you discover a disagreement. All article titles, headings and sub-headings should be in caps and smalls. Many authors will use full caps; but change these in order to conform to our style. Capitalize the first word of any title and all major words but not prepositions (for, between), articles (a, the), coordinating conjunctions (but, and, yet, or, so), or the "to" in infinitives. Note the exception for the article "a" below. Examples:

There Is More Than One

I Want to Hold Your Hand

It's between Here and There

Losing a Theater: A Manifesto

e. Table of Contents

The opening summary should be followed by a table of contents that indicates the section headings and sub-headings of the article. Contact the editor if this isn't the case in the article you are copy editing. Make sure the headings in the table of contents match the headings within the article.

One of the most common errors made by authors is to begin their article with a table of contents, then to change the heading of some section during composition of the article and then to forget to go back and also revise the table of contents. For headings, the IEP formatter program pays attention only to the headings in the table of contents, and never to any heading within the article (so you don't need to bother making corrections in them). If a section is added into the article by the author but is not mentioned in the table of contents, then this causes a large problem if no one catches the error before it is published. It causes tedious revising of the computer code.

The table of contents can either be flat (for example in Solipsism and the Problem of Other Minds) or hierarchical (indented), with main sections and then sub-sections within them (for example in Aztec Philosophy). In either case, the table of contents must use the following structure and labeling convention.

  1. Heading One
    1. Subheading One
      1. Subsubheading One
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
      2. Subsubheading Two
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
    2. Subheading Two
  2. Heading Two
  3. Heading Three
  4. References and Further Reading

Minimize the use of italics, but italics is OK in headers for titles or foreign words. Never allow your author to use boldface or underlines.

f. Author Information

Remove all titles from the author's name such as "Dr." or "Professor."  Delete the department and university's address. Remove the city. Add the country without abbreviation, except for "U. S. A." with blanks between letters. For example, change

Sir Michael Dummett, associate professor
Dept. of Philosophy
University of Geneva
2010 La Mer Avenue


Michael Dummett
University of Geneva

g. American vs. British English

The IEP prefers American English, but British English is acceptable; just be consistent throughout the article.

British spelling: Aristotelean, favourite, defence, sceptic, behaviour, realisation.

American spelling: Aristotelian, favorite, defense, skeptic, behavior, realization.

Don't change the words if they occur within titles of books or articles or quotations.  In an American article, do not change the reference "The Foetus: Its Defence" (for a book published in the U.K.) even though its title would be "The Fetus: Its Defense" if it were published in the U.S.  Regarding punctuation, American English uses double quote marks around direct quotations, names of journal articles, mentioned terms, and scare quotes. British English uses single quote marks for all these.

h. References and Further Reading

The Encyclopedia recommends that authors use the MLA style of references and in-text citations; however, the IEP does not enforce this recommendation and allows almost any style that is coherent, for example APA.  The last main section of every table of contents must be named "References and Further Reading." Articles from authors will very often contain an ending section called "Sources" or "Bibliography" or "References" or "Notes." Change these to "References and Further Reading." This section can have sub-headings such as "Original sources," "More advanced studies," and so forth. The entries may or may not be annotated (see Defeaters in Epistemology for an example). The entire section should not exceed about 1,500 words, especially if it is not annotated. Let us know if it does. When there are more than two entries for the same author, repeat the author's name in the second and subsequent entries. Many authors prefer to use a dash in place of the author's name when it occurs a second time, but replace all these with the author's actual name. Remove all Internet addresses from references, and mention this to the general editor in a comment. Do not permit authors to say an article is forthcoming; highlight these occurrences with a comment, and the general editor will decide what to do about them.

i. Hyperlinks

No links should be to web sites external to the IEP (even in the section on References and Further Reading). If you notice that your article contains them, and you haven't been told to include them, then delete them and make a comment where this was done. Although external links to articles outside the Encyclopedia are to be avoided, links to other articles within the Encyclopedia are encouraged. Some authors are overly eager to include these links and will ask for a hyperlink for every occurrence of the term, but you should include only one link per term, usually upon the term's first occurrence in the text.

j. Footnotes and Endnotes

Articles should contain neither footnotes nor endnotes. If you notice that your article contains them, and you haven't been told explicitly to include them, then write the editor about what to do.

k. Acknowledgments and Thank Yous

In journal articles, authors regularly thank their colleagues for help in writing or editing the article.  But this isn't proper for encyclopedia articles.  The authors should thank their colleagues privately.  The copy editor should remove all the thank yous and acknowledgments.

l. Latin abbreviations

Avoid Latin abbreviations. Here are the replacements:

cf. | compare
et. al. | and others
etc. | and so forth
e.g. | for example
i.e. | that is
NB | note
viz. | namely

It is OK to use "ibid." and "op. cit."

m. Author's Ego

Revise self-referential and egotistical phrases such as the following:

  • I think he means... [He means...]
  • This concludes what I take to be the major influences on Mitchell’s thought. [This concludes the major influences on Mitchell's thought.]
  • My book about him says... [Jones (2005) says...]
  • I believe Passmore's description is right. [Passmore's description is generally accepted.]

n. Pejorative Terms

Do not permit your authors to use pejorative phrases such as "the idealist curse" and "which certain irrational philosophers still believe." Do not allow personal attacks or snide remarks.

o. Underlining

Do not allow authors to use underlining anywhere. Use italics.

p. Dates

Use "B.C.E." rather than "B.C." or "BC" for dates before the birth of Jesus. "B.C.E." stands for Before the Common Era. The IEP is multicultural, so we do not want to place all events on a Christian timeline that uses AD and BC.  Change "Pliny (A.D. 62-113)" to "Pliny (62-113 C.E.)."  We use C.E. only when it might be unclear whether the date is before or after the beginning of the Christian era; normally we wouldn't use "C.E." for any date after 500 C.E. Do not use any blanks in "B.C.E. but insert a blank between the number and the "B.C.E." Regarding approximate dates, our style is to use either "Ramanuja (c.1017-c.1137)" or "Ramanuja (1017?-1137?)." It is OK to insert extra blanks as in "Ramanuja (c. 1017-c. 1137). Use "c." for "circa" and "cn." for "century."Do not use "ca" for "circa."  When separating two dates, use a hyphen within the body of the article and the title of a section, but use an em-dash in the title of the entire article. Use no blanks around the hyphen or dash in either place. For disputed dates within a definite range, do not use circa or question marks, but instead use this style: "Ramanuja (1017/21-1137)." If only a death date is known, then use "Ramanuja (d. 1137)" with a blank after the period.

q. Initials

Use periods after initials, and use a blank between initials; for example, change "CI Lewis" and “C.I. Lewis” to “C. I. Lewis.”

r. Mentioning Recent Times

Do not allow authors to use the terms "now" or "recently" or "a few years ago" if that term would be inappropriate were the article to be read seventy years from now. For example, if an author says, "Recently this topic has become attractive to philosophers of mathematics," this can be changed to, "In the early 21st century, this topic became attractive to philosophers of mathematics."

s. Quotations

Long quotations, those longer than three published lines, should be indented. Remove the outer quotation marks. Unlike in journal articles, citations for all quotations are not required.

t. Quotation Marks and Italics

Although American-style quotation marks are preferred, that is, double quotes, the IEP accepts the British-style, or single quotes when the entire article is written in British English rather than American English. Emphasis can be added to a term by placing it either within quotation marks or in italics, although italics is preferred, as when a philosopher says mathematical existence statements should be taken literally. Do not use quotation marks merely to draw attention to slang, to disown trite expressions, or to justify an attempt at humor.

Incorrect: The mind contains the "stuff of thought."
Correct: The mind contains the stuff of thought.

u. Contractions

Change all contractions that are not direct quotations. For example, change "don't" to "do not."

v. Dashes and Hyphens

When separating a clause or phrase from the rest of the sentence, always use an em dash, not a double hyphen. Do not use a blank space before or after the em dash.

w. 'is' vs. 'will be'

Sentences referring to what is coming next within the article should use the present tense rather than the future tense. For example, use sentence (1) rather than (2):

  1. Both act and rule utilitarianism are discussed in the next section.
  2. Both act and rule utilitarianism will be discussed in the next section.


There are additional grammar guidelines available at: if you want to learn about more elegant copyediting.

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