Wang Yangming, also known as Wang Shouren (Wang Shou-jen), is one of the most influential philosophers in the Confucian tradition. He is best known for his theory of the unity of knowledge and action. A capable and principled administrator and military official, he was exiled from 1507 to 1510 for his protest against political corruption. Although he studied the thought of Zhu Xi [Chu His] (1130-1200 CE) seriously in his teenage years, it was during this period of exile that he developed his contribution to what has become known as Neo-Confucianism (Daoxue, [Tao-hsueh or “Learning of the Way”). With Neo-Confucianism in general, Wang Yangming’s thought can be best understood as an attempt to propose personal morality as the main way to social well-being. Wang’s legacy in Neo-Confucian tradition and Confucian philosophy as a whole is his claim that the fundamental root of social problems lies in the fact that one fails to gain a genuine understanding of one’s self and its relation to the world, and thus fails to live up to what one could be.
Neo-Confucians, above all, urged people to engage in what they thought was “true learning,” which led to the genuine realization of the self. However, the cultural landscape of early and mid-Ming dynasty China (1368-1644 CE) did not unfold as Neo-Confucians wished. To understand the shared theoretical challenge that Wang Yangming confronted, one should first note that quite a number of Neo-Confucians at that time had contempt for what they thought was a certain vulgarized form of Confucian learning. This “vulgar learning” (suxue) included such activities as memorization and recitation (jisong), literary composition (cizhang), textual studies (xungu), and broad learning (boxue). To the eyes of Neo-Confucians, all these forms of learning represent learning that is aimed at accumulating external knowledge for its own sake. As a consequence, these forms of learning disregarded what Neo-Confucians considered to be the true purpose of the learning: construction of the moral self.
Ironically, the rampant increase in charges that certain work is “vulgar” was linked to the very triumph of Neo-Confucianism in general, and to Zhu Xi’s learning in particular, through its official recognition by the Ming state. While is true that, by the early Ming, “Cheng-Zhu” learning (named after the brothers Cheng Yi [Ch’eng I] and Cheng Hao [Ch’eng Hao] as well as the aforementioned Zhu Xi) had already enjoyed official recognition for over one hundred years, it was at this time that the institutionalization of the Cheng-Zhu teaching in early Ming was relatively complete. As is well known, by the time of the Yongle reign (1403-24), Cheng-Zhu learning had become fully established as the basis for the civil service examination that was the exclusive pathway to government service in imperial China. The Emperor Cheng Zu embraced Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism and ordered Hu Kuang (1370-1418) and others to compile an official version of Zhu Xi’s commentaries on the Four Books (the Confucian Lunyu or Analects, the Mengzi or Mencius, the Daxue or Great Learning, and the Zhongyong or Doctrine of the Mean) and Five Classics (the Shujing or Classic of History, the Shijing or Classic of Poetry, the Yijing or Classic of Changes, Liji or Record of Rituals, and the Xiaojing or Classic of Filial Piety). Their effort resulted in the comprehensive anthology of the Great Compendia on the Five Classics and the Four Books.
The establishment of Neo-Confucianism as the examination curriculum contributed to what some thinkers considered to be the “vulgarization” of Neo-Confucian moral teaching. As Cheng-Zhu learning served as the basis of the civil examinations, those who wanted to get involved in the political arena had to master it regardless of whether or not they agreed with the essence of its teaching. In other words, they studied it for the sake of their worldly interests rather than out of concern for moral self-fulfillment. Wang Yangming was one of the most prominent among those thinkers who found it difficult to accept both “vulgar learning” and the form of Neo-Confucian learning that was vulnerable to degeneration into “vulgar learning.” One can find Wang’s lengthy critique of “vulgar learning” in the section of “Pulling up the root and stopping up the source” in Chuan xi lu (“Instructions for Practical Living” in Wing-tsit Chan’s translation).
While Cheng-Zhu learning was different from “vulgar learning” in its fundamental orientation, Wang Yangming thought that Cheng-Zhu style of “investigation of things” (gewu) was particularly susceptible to degeneration into “vulgar learning. So, what was at stake in Wang Yangming’s reformulation of Neo-Confucianism was the issue of how to reinvent Confucian learning in a way different from the way of Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism, which turned out to be susceptible to “vulgarization.”
In Wang’s mind, given the fact that the practitioners of “vulgar learning” devote their attention only to the accumulation of external knowledge, what is potentially problematic in Cheng-Zhu style of “investigation of things” is its search for moral principle (li) in the external world (as well as in the mind, xin [hsin]). Wang believed that the internalization of li resolved many problems that “vulgar learning” created. Wang’s idea that “the mind is principle” (xin ji li) expresses his belief succinctly. The most apparent and significant implication of xin ji li is the change of the locus of li from the external world (and the mind) to solely the mind. However, the proposition of xin ji li indicates more than the locus of li.
First, li does not simply reside in the mind but is coextensive with the mind. Accordingly, li does not exist as a distinguishable, searchable entity in the mind. Rather we call li the state in which the mind is so well preserved that it responds to the situation properly. In this sense, xin ji li meant a kind of evaluation that the mind could embody, a desirable quality represented by the concept of li, rather than a formula expressing the relationship between two distinct entities. Since li was not conceived as a static principle that one could discern and hold fast to, being attuned to li involved nothing other than having no selfish desires. In other words, we should not “seek the Principle of Nature” because principle is not something we can “seek.”
Second, the identification of xin and li brought about significant changes in the understanding of the mind as well. These changes in the understanding of the mind entailed a new philosophical anthropology. The mind — the unstable entity that was formerly understood in terms of qi (ch’i, vital force) and believed to be vulnerable to evil — is now conceived as li, the perfect moral entity.
Many of Wang’s statements, such as “The nature of all humans is good” and “[T]he original substance of the mind is characterized by the highest good; is there anything in the original substance of the mind that is not good?” show that he upheld the typical Neo-Confucian premise of the goodness of human nature. However, Wang’s philosophical anthropology was different from that of Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism in that it pushed the premise of the goodness of human nature to its extreme.
In Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism, xin means the operation of the subjective consciousness, or the location where the operation of the subjective consciousness takes place. If xin represents the immediate self as a current flow of consciousness while li is a normative state that should be embodied, xin ji li means, above all, that the mind ceases to be one of the loci where the moral principle resides; it achieves the very status of moral principle itself. This identification of xin and xing (hsing, nature) means creating a notion of the self-sufficient moral agent by negating the distinction between the potential goodness of the self and the actual state of the self.
While this notion of a self-sufficient moral agent is encouraging, it was not without problems for a group of intellectuals. For example, Luo Qinshun thought that the identification of the subjective function of the mind with the objective reality of principle constituted “a case of an infinitesimal mistake in the beginning leading to an infinite error at the end.” How so?
In the view of people like Luo, the notion of a self-sufficient moral agent contained in the formula of xin ji li appears virtually bereft of any viable tension between the ideal and the actual: the immediate, actual self is the ideal. This absence of a normative tension poses a certain threat to the rigor of morality. This is why they criticized the notion of a self-sufficient moral agent as being a source of arbitrariness and subjectivism in moral behavior. However, normative tension is not completely out of sight for those who advocate the formula of xin ji li. For one thing, Wang’s distinction between the mind in itself (xin zhi benti) and the so-called human mind (renxin) provides one with a standard with which to distinguish between the normative state and the actual state of the self. For Wang, the “mind in itself” represents the original state of the mind, which possesses the perfect faculty of moral judgment. The “human mind” represents the state of the mind that is “obscured” by selfish human desires, and thus does not realize the perfect faculty of moral judgment. Since the immediate state of the mind often remains at the level of the human mind, one is expected to endeavor to recover the mind in itself.
As long as Wang maintains a distinction between the mind in itself and the human mind, what is really at issue is not whether to posit a normative ideal, but how to conceptualize a normative ideal. Most important to his conceptualization, Wang does not conceive the normative ideal independently of the functioning of the mind. That is, there is no ontological difference between the normative ideal and the actual, for both the mind in itself and the human mind represent certain states of our consciousness. The only difference between the mind in itself and the human mind is whether or not the mind is clouded by selfish desire.
Thus, the main consequence of this way of conceiving a normative ideal is that our current state of mind is able to return to its original state simply by getting rid of selfish desires, without a separate effort to apprehend normative principle.
Distinguishing the goodness that reflects the original state of the mind from the badness that stems from selfish desires is absolutely critical in the process of returning to the original state of the mind. Such knowledge is just another aspect of the self-sufficient nature of the self. Following the Mencian tradition, Wang called this knowledge liangzhi (innate knowing). According to Wang, liangzhi possesses several intriguing features:
- Everyone without exception possesses liangzhi.
- Liangzhi is innate, not something acquired by learning. Thus, effort is necessary not for forming liangzhi but for setting it in motion.
- Liangzhi is not subject to variation or change due to time and place. One’s inner source of moral guidance can be simply applied to human conduct or society irrespective of the circumstances. Also, one can understand and make perfect judgments about things without much information.
- We can never lose liangzhi. At worst, we simply lose sight of it. Since liangzhi is always present in the mind, one can always activate it anytime if one desires it. “Once determined to reform, he recovers at once his own mind.”
- The character of liangzhi is intuitive. For Wang, the power of liangzhi lies in its ability properly to respond to any situation, rather than in factual knowledge that involves concrete information. In this way, Wang emphasized the intuitive power of the mind. Wang’s invoking of the image of the mirror and balance well expresses his emphasis on the intuitive moral sensitivity that liangzhi possesses. Both the mirror and balance give us knowledge of a given object by making it possible to reflect and weigh it without previous understanding. This aspect of Wang’s learning can be characterized as anti-“over-intellectualizing.”
- Despite its intuitional character, liangzhi is perfect. People often tend to lose sight of liangzhi because of selfish human desire. But once one gets rid of selfish human desire, the perfect power of liangzhi is completely restored. Simply put, “it [innate knowledge] knows everything” In short, when liangzhi is rendered as innate knowledge, knowledge means the capacity for moral judgment rather than factual knowledge. Thus, if we were but in full contact with liangzhi, liangzhi would make people perfectly moral rather than erudite. For Wang, however, such moral judgment presupposes a total understanding of a given situation.
- For Wang, who believed in the perfect, intuitive power of liangzhi, resolution based on confidence was important: “There is the sage in everyone. Only one who has not enough self-confidence buries his own chance.”
- Trusting in innate moral knowing, Wang seemed to simplify the cumbersome process of learning, considering it to be a matter of eliminating selfish desires: “In learning to become a sage, the student needs only to get rid of selfish human desires and preserve the Principle of Nature, which is like refining gold and achieving perfection in quality.” People are no longer under the burden of any other business except for getting rid of selfish desire.
All of the above points together explain the populist ethos in Wang’s learning, as we see in Wang’s famous statement: “All the people filling the street are sages.” For Wang, becoming a fully moral agent is simple and easy. “Just don’t try to deceive it [liangzhi] but sincerely and truly follow in whatever you do. Then the good will be perceived and evil will be removed. What security and joy there is in this!” It cannot but be easy because we are already fully moral agents. As self-sufficient moral subjects we do not need to engage in the exploration of the external world.
Wang wanted to show that moral awareness depended on the self. While the importance of the moral agent is quite understandable in the moral sphere, it begs the question of what kind of relation moral principle has to the world out there if the ontological status of moral principle hinges solely on the moral agent. In other words, how could it be that one’s moral principle is completely in the mind and, at the same time, vitally connected to the world out there? Answering this question is absolutely critical if Wang’s reassertion of personal morality is to be socially responsible. Wang’s sense of social responsibility is clear when he wants to distinguish his own convictions from those of Buddhists, whom Confucians have regarded as forsaking the external world. “In nourishing the mind, we Confucians have never departed from things and events.”
On what ground, then, could Wang maintain that his learning was focused on the mind and, at the same time, did not depart from the external world? How did Wang resolve this contradiction? As is expected in his rhetorical question, “Is there any affair in the world outside of the mind?” the answer lay in his redefinition of the world in such a way that there was no affair outside of the mind.
According to Wang, the external world is not something out there, as distinct from the mind, but “that to which the operation of the mind is directed.” This redefinition of the external world is based on the insight that everything we can know about the world is mediated by experience. This experience is made possible by our sense organs. The activity of these sense organs is associated with the mind. Thus, all things that we encounter in our lives are necessarily associated with the mind. The world so conceived is no longer an independent entity external to the mind, but an inseparable part of the mind. According to this picture, the external world exists always in reference to the self.
This position makes one wonder if the external world does not exist without the operation of one’s mind. However, what Wang Yangming cares about is not (scientific) investigation of the existence of the world itself — which is a question of modern epistemology — but the perspective from which we can properly understand our relationship to the world. When Wang asks rhetorically, “Is there any affair in the world outside of the mind?” the message he is trying to convey is that all the things and affairs in our lives exist in an activated state, so that is what we should have in mind when we think about the world.
How, then, is the world in an activated state? The practitioners of “vulgar learning” often take the world as something statically “out there.” When they produce factual knowledge, they assume a static world-picture to the extent that they can produce fixed knowledge. However, if we accept Wang’s definition of things as “that to which the operation of the mind is directed,” the real world in our lives turns out to be the experienced world. In other words, the world is not silent, inert, and vacant, but activated and awakened. Indeed, life manifests itself in movements like eating, going to bed, and speaking rather than seeing while stationary. To be exact, we are, in a sense, moving when we are stationary, for we are experiencing something incessantly. Common metaphors of life — such as passage, travel, voyage, and journey — are related to this kind of mobility in our life-experience. What are the implications of Wang’s redefinition of the external world?
First, the most significant implication of this change in the meaning of the external world is that Wang has in principle dismissed the necessity of exploring the external world independent of the self. Under this framework, to take the mind seriously is none other than to do justice to the external world. Thus, Wang said, “The mind is the master of Heaven-and-Earth and myriad things. The mind is none other than Heaven. If we mention the mind, Heaven-and-Earth and the myriad things all are also mentioned automatically.”
Second, what we notice in Wang’s redefinition of the world is a reformulation of the relation between the mind as subject and the world as object. Wang suspected that the distinction between the mind as perceiving subject and the world as perceived object could, by creating a gap between self and world, make genuine Confucian learning liable to degenerate into “vulgar learning,” which justified the pursuit of external knowledge that was irrelevant to the self. Thus, Wang saw our experienced and lived reality as constituted in and through an inseparable relation between the mind and the world. In his reconceptualization of this relationship, inner and outer were unified because the mind was the world. This seamless conception of the mind and the world overcame the gulf between the subject and the object that “vulgar learning” engenderd.
Third, this rearrangement of the mind’s relation to the world makes the mind and the world coextensive. For Wang, the mind and the external world are not fully distinguishable, for the world is no more than that to which the operation of the mind is directed. This new arrangement of the mind’s relation to the world gives us total contact with both the self and the larger world from the beginning. We can say that the distance between the world and us is shortened in the sense that our access to the world is unmediated, and there is no world that exists beyond the scope of the self.
Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action (zhixing heyi) is probably the most well-known aspect of Wang’s philosophy. Some of the most puzzling aspects of Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action can be best understood by way of Wang’s conception of self and world.
The issue of the relationship between knowledge and action concerns the relationship between knowledge about (moral) matters and doing what the knowledge calls for. Traditionally, Chinese thought in general, and Zhu Xi in particular, maintained that once one acquired knowledge, one should do one’s best to put such knowledge into practice. In discussing Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action, however, we first need to make clear that by his theory of the unity of knowledge and action, Wang was not asserting a traditional idea. Indeed, this was precisely the position that Wang wished to repudiate.
Despite the emphasis on the need for knowledge to be put into practice, the traditional position presupposed two possibilities: first, that one can have knowledge without/prior to corresponding action; and second, that one can know what is the proper action, but still fail to act. Because of these two possibilities, the traditional position left open the possibility of separating knowledge and action, but called for the overcoming of this separation.
However, Wang denied both possibilities. These two denials constitute the essence of Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action. First, according to Wang, it is only through simultaneous action that one can obtain knowledge: “If you want to know bitterness, you have to eat a bitter melon yourself.” Wang denied any other possible routes to obtain knowledge.
According to Wang, it is not possible for one to put something into practice after acquiring knowledge. This is because knowledge and action are unified already, from beginning to end. We cannot unify knowledge and action because they are already unified. Of course, Wang was aware of the claims that “there are people who know that parents should be served with filial piety and elder brothers with respect but cannot put these things into practice. This shows that knowledge and action are clearly two different things.” Wang’s answer was: “The knowledge and action you refer to are already separated by selfish desires and are no longer knowledge and action in their original state.” In other words, knowledge necessarily/automatically leads to action in its original state. We cannot have knowledge while preventing it from leading to action.
Understanding these two apparently non-commonsensical ideas is crucial for understanding of Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action, for they are the points that differentiated Wang’s position from preceding positions. In order to understand them, we need to examine what Wang meant by “knowledge” and “action.” Furthermore, considering Wang’s view of self and world is indispensable to any examination of Wang’s notions of “knowledge” and “action.”
First, knowledge in Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action may not necessarily be the knowledge we conventionally imagine. What Wang meant by knowledge in his discussion of knowledge and action is not grasping information that was “out there” — which is prevalent in what Wang characterized as “vulgar learning.” What Wang meant was knowledge of how to act in a given situation, as we will confirm in Wang’s statements concerning the unity of knowledge and action. Where, then, does knowledge of how to act come from? This question brings us to Wang’s theory of philosophical anthropology and his notion of liangzhi. Liangzhi is supposed to provide that kind of certainty for action. The English translation of liangzhi is innate knowledge or innate knowing, which suggests that we already possess all the knowledge we need to have. We do not have to spend any time to acquire knowledge. Precisely speaking, we cannot acquire knowledge, for we, as self-sufficient moral agents, already possess it from the very beginning. Thus, it would be nonsense to say that we need to know before in order to act. In this sense, what we mean by “knowing” is not to attain from outside what is previously absent but to experience the operation of our innate knowledge/knowing in the concrete situations of our own lives. “To ‘obtain’ means to get in the mind; it is not infused from without.” From this we can understand Wang’s strange idea that it is only through simultaneous action that one can obtain knowledge. For action is the process of activating our innate knowledge. Thus, Wang said, “Can anyone learn without action?” What we conventionally think of as attaining knowledge is nothing other than experiencing knowledge that we already have.
But what, precisely, is action? Wang did not think of moral action in terms of willing and then performing an action. For him, the true perception of a situation automatically and immediately sets action into motion. In emphasizing the setting-in-motion of action followed by the perception of a situation, the action in Wang’s theory does not exactly correspond to the kinds of acts we have conventionally in mind. For Wang, action means all responses to a given situation. This includes studying, which was not conventionally regarded as belonging to the realm of action.
At the same time, Wang tended to consider action as responses to given situations rather than action in a vacuum. This point is evident in his examples of responses to such things as color, smell, and taste. When action is conceived largely as a response to a given situation, we cannot avoid acting. We never depart from the “situation” in which we find ourselves.
To understand further why Wang conceived of action as a response to a given situation, we need to remember his redefinition of the world. To describe the actual fabric of life that Wang had in mind, we have invoked the sense of movement, which posited an alternative to the more static conception of experience — one that deceived one into thinking that one stood outside the actual world. For Wang, our lives consist of living in the moment.
With this understanding of Wang’s notion of knowledge and action in mind, let us imagine the situation in which one acts with one’s knowledge. First of all, one does not spend any time to attain knowledge. All one needs is to respond to a given situation. Knowledge is not fixed knowledge, but consists of ever-changing responses to shifting situations: “Innate knowledge is to minute details and varying circumstances as compasses and measures are to areas and lengths. Details and circumstances cannot be predetermined, just as areas and lengths are infinite in number and cannot be entirely covered.” Wang is invoking “the radically context sensitive and particularist nature of moral judgement.” Accordingly, the knowledge is intuitive. As action is the natural inner workings of liangzhi in the form of reaction, there is no gap between knowledge and action.
Keeping the above understanding of knowledge and action in mind, we can understand the aforementioned two idiosyncratic points in Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action. First, it is only through simultaneous action that one can obtain knowledge. This is because one already possesses knowledge. What seems to be a process of obtaining knowledge is in reality the process of activating innate knowledge. Knowledge is activated through the contact with the situation, and this is called “action.” Second, knowledge necessarily/automatically leads to action. For Wang, knowledge means knowing how to respond to a given situation and action is responding to a given situation. Furthermore, one cannot help responding to the world because one is “moving” in every moment. Action is no longer an operation subsequent to the formulation of knowledge of the world, but a fundamental mode of human life. Given that one innately has knowledge of how to act in all situations, and that one cannot help acting, knowledge necessarily leads to action. When knowledge and action appear to be separate, it is because one has not activated one’s true knowledge — a result of delusion due to selfish desire or false learning: “There have never been people who know but do not act. Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not yet know.”
According to Wang, the normative picture of the universe is that moral agents are living their lives actualizing their liangzhi in the form of the unity of knowledge and action. In this picture, the betterment of society depends on the expansion of the self’s ability to respond morally to the world. Thus, Wang repeatedly reasserts the validity of the Neo-Confucian promise — the salvation of the world through personal morality — which is based on the assumption that “Governance depends on human beings (wei zheng zai ren).”
In his own time, Wang’s teaching was enthusiastically received. Although Wang’s new mode of thinking was rapidly gaining currency among intellectuals, for those who did not subscribe to his ideas Wang’s formulation was nothing more than a mistaken answer to the problem. Thus, Wang came to serve as a catalyst for complex and wide-ranging debates and controversies. No matter how later generation of thinkers would evaluate the legacy of Wang’s learning, it could hardly be denied that with Wang Yangming the tradition of Chinese philosophy became richer and more complex.
Leaving aside Wang Yangming’s importance in his own time, he deserves attention because of his tremendous, long-lived influence on Chinese intellectual history. Not surprisingly, therefore, important studies of Wang Yangming have been produced all the way up to the present.
In Anglophone scholarship, the work of Frederick Goodrich Henke (1916) and Wing-tsit Chan (1963) has made available translations of Wang’s major works. Wing-tsit Chan (1970) provides a bird’s-eye view on the flow of thought from the early Ming through Wang’s era by scrutinizing the evolution of “the learning of mind” in early Ming thinkers. Wang’s thought also has been explored by Tu Weiming (1976) in terms of the interaction between his life history and the formation of his major doctrines. Wm. Theodore de Bary (1970) has discussed the progression of thought in the late Ming in terms of the unfolding of “Wang Learning.” The work of Julia Ching (1976) also merits consideration. More recently, P. J. Ivanhoe (2002) has discussed Mencius’ and Wang’s philosophies from a comparative perspective.
In Japanese scholarship, the compilation of Yōmeigaku Taikei (Compendium of Yangming Learning) is most prominent among many works. In his classic study, Shushigaku to Yōmeigaku (Zhu Xi Learning and Yangming Learning) (1967), Shimada Kenzi attempts to compare the thought of Wang with that of Zhu Xi. However, his analysis does not pay attention to the specific historical contents of their philosophical movements, while Togawa Yoshio’s Jukyōshi (A History of Confucianism) (1987) pays relatively more attention to this issue.
In mainland China, Wang’s thought has been interpreted as subjective idealism and criticized by Marxist scholars despite the fact that the influence of Marxist ideology has become relatively weak since the end of Cultural Revolution (c. 1966-1976). Yang Guorong (1990) diachronically narrates the development of the structure of Wang’s philosophy. The work of Chen Lai (1991) also is worthy of attention.
Seoul National University, South Korea
Last updated: July 30, 2005 | Originally published: