William Warburton was Church of England bishop of Gloucester, born at Newark-upon- Trent (17 miles n.e. of Nottingham) on December 24, 1698. He died at Gloucester June 7, 1779. His father, an attorney, had him educated for the law, which he probably practiced 1719-23. Warburton always a passionate liking for theology, and was ordained deacon, 1723, and priest, 1727; he became rector-at Greaseley, Nottingham, 1726; was rector at Brant-Broughton, 1728- 30; and at Frisby, 1730-56; became chaplain to the Prince of Wales, 1735; preacher to Lincoln’s Inn, 1746; chaplain to the king, 1754; prebendary of Durham, 1755; dean of Bristol, 1757; and bishop of Gloucester, 1760. As a critic Warburton had a reputation for being excessively sarcastic and abusive. In the retirement of country life during the earlier years of his activity he prosecuted his studies with great diligence, and wrote those works which have perpetuated his memory. The first of these was The Alliance between Church and State; or the Necessity and Equity of an established Religion, and a Test Law demonstrated, from the Essence and End of civil Society upon the fundamental Principles of the Laws of Nature and Nations (1736), in which, while taking high ground, as the title indicates, he yet maintains that the State Church should tolerate those who differed from it in doctrine and worship. Soon thereafter came his great work, The Divine Legation of Moses, Demonstrated on the Principles of a Religious Deist, from the Omission of the Doctrine of a Future State of Rewards and Punishments in the Jewish Dispensation. Books I.-III. appeared in vol. I. (1737-38); books IV., V., VI., in vol. II. (1741); books VII. and VIII. never appeared; book IX. was first published in his Works (1788; 10th ed. Of the entire work, ed. James Nichols, 3 vols., 1846). The treatise was directed against the Deists (see also Deism), especially their doctrine of the Old Testament and their stress upon the omission of mention of immorality in the Old Testament. Warburton turns the tables upon them by constructing, out of the very absence of such statements, a proof of the divinity of the Mosaic legislation.The first three books deal with the necessity of the doctrine of a future state of rewards and punishments to civil society from (1) the nature of the thing, (2) the conduct of the ancient lawgivers and founders of civil policy, and (3) the opinions and conduct of the ancient sages and philosophers. The fourth book proves the high antiquity of the arts and empire of Egypt, and that such high antiquity illustrates and confirms the truth of the Mosaic history. The fifth book explains the nature of the Jewish theocracy. In the sixth book Warburton shows from the Old and New Testaments that a future state of rewards and punishments did make part of the Mosaic dispensation. The ninth book treats of the true nature and genius of the Christian religion. The general argument is that because the sacred books of Judaism said nothing respecting a future state of rewards and punishments, it must be divine, since it did really accomplish the punishment of wrong-doers without such a doctrine, and no other legislation has been able to do so without it. This it could do because the foundation and support of the Mosaic legislation was the theocracy which was peculiar to the Jews, and dealt out in this life righteous rewards and punishments upon individual-and nation. An extraordinary providence conducted the affairs of this people, and consequently the sending of Moses was divinely ordered. The work is confessedly limited to one line of argument, is defective in exegesis, and does not do justice to the intimations of immortality among the later Jews; yet it is distinguished by freshness and vigor, masterly argumentation, and bold imagination. The excursuses are particularly admirable. His writings, besides those already noted, embrace a commentary upon Pope’s Essay on Man (1742; by this he won Pope’s firm friendship); Julian (1750; on the numerous alleged providential interferences which defeated Julian’s attempt to rebuild the temple); Remarks on Mr. David Hume’s Essay on The Natural History of Religion (1757); The Doctrine of Grace; or the Office and Operations of the Holy Spirit vindicated from the Insults of Infidelity and the Abuses of Fanaticism (2 vols., 1762; a work directed against the Methodists, which did not advanace his reputation). His Works were edited with a biographical preface by Bishop Hurd (7 vols., 1788; new ed., 12 vols., 1811; the expense was borne by Warburton’s widow). Supplementary to this edition are the Tracts by Warburton and a Warburtonian (1789); Letters (Kidderminster, 1808; 2d ed., London, 1809); Selections from the Unpublished Papers of Warburton (1841).
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Last updated: August 30, 2004 | Originally published: August/30/2004
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