Alfred North Whitehead was a notable mathematician, logician, educator and philosopher. The staggering complexity of Whitehead’s thought, coupled with the extraordinary literary quality of his writing, have conspired to make Whitehead (in an oft-repeated saying) one of the most-quoted but least-read philosophers in the Western canon. While he is widely recognized for his collaborative work with Bertrand Russell on the Principia Mathematica, he also made highly innovative contributions to philosophy, especially in the area of process metaphysics. Whitehead was an Englishman by birth and a mathematician by formal education. He was highly regarded by his students as a teacher and noted as a conscientious and hard-working administrator. The volume of his mathematical publication was never great, and much of his work has been eclipsed by more contemporary developments in the fields in which he specialized. Yet many of his works continue to stand out as examples of expository clarity without ever sacrificing logical rigor, while his theory of “extensive abstraction” is considered to be foundational in contemporary field of formal spatial relations known as “mereotopology.”
Whitehead’s decades-long focus on the logical and algebraic issues of space and geometry which led to his work on extension, became an integral part of an explosion of profoundly original philosophical work He began publishing even as his career as an academic mathematician was reaching a close. The first wave of these philosophical works included his Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge, The Concept of Nature, and The Principle of Relativity, published between 1919 and 1922. These books address the philosophies of science and nature, and include an important critique of the problem of measurement raised by Albert Einstein’s general theory of relativity. They also present an alternative theory of space and gravity. Whitehead built his system around an event-based ontology that interpreted time as essentially extensive rather than point-like.
Facing mandatory retirement in England, Whitehead accepted a position at Harvard in 1924, where he continued his philosophical output. His Science and the Modern World offers a careful critique of orthodox scientific materialism and presents his first worked-out version of the related fallacies of “misplaced concreteness” and “simple location.” The first fallacy is the error of treating an abstraction as though it were concretely real. The second is the error of assuming that anything that is real must have a simple spatial location. But the pinnacle of Whitehead’s metaphysical work came with his monumental Process and Reality in 1929 and his Adventures of Ideas in 1933. The first of these books gives a comprehensive and multi-layered categoreal system of internal and external relations that analyzes the logic of becoming an extension within the context of a solution to the problem of the one and the many, while also providing a ground for his philosophy of nature. The second is an outline of a philosophy of history and culture within the framework of his metaphysical scheme.
Alfred North Whitehead was born on February 15th, 1861 at Ramsgate in Kent, England, to Alfred and Maria Whitehead. Thought by his parents to be too delicate for the rough and tumble world of the English public school system, young Alfred was initially tutored at home. Ironically, when he was finally placed in public school, Whitehead became both head boy of his house and captain of his school’s rugby team. Whitehead always looked upon his days as a boy as a rather idyllic time. The education he received at home was always congenial to his natural habit of thinking, and he was able to spend long periods of time walking about in English country settings that were rich with history.
While Whitehead always enjoyed the classics, his true strength was with mathematics. Because of both its quality, and the unique opportunity to take the entrance examinations early, Alfred tested for Trinity College, Cambridge, in 1879, a year before he would otherwise have been allowed to enter. Whitehead’s focus was in mathematics, as were those of about half the hopefuls that were taking the competitive exams that year. While not in the very top tier, Whitehead’s exam scores were nevertheless good enough to gain him entrance into Trinity for the school year beginning in 1880, along with a £50 scholarship. While the money was certainly important, the scholarship itself qualified Whitehead for further rewards and considerations, and set him on the path to eventually being elected a Fellow of Trinity.
This happened in 1884, with the completion of his undergraduate work and his high standing in the finals examinations in mathematics for that year. Whitehead’s early career was focused on teaching, and it is known that he taught at Trinity during every term from 1884 to 1910. He traveled to Germany during an off-season at Cambridge (probably 1885), in part to learn more of the work of such German mathematicians as Felix Klein. Whitehead was also an ongoing member of various intellectual groups at Cambridge during this period. But he published nothing of note, and while he was universally praised as a teacher, the youthful Alfred displayed little promise as a researcher.
In 1891, when he was thirty years of age, Whitehead married Evelyn Wade. Evelyn was in every respect the perfect wife and partner for Alfred. While not conventionally intellectual, Evelyn was still an extremely bright woman, fiercely protective of Alfred and his work, and a true home-maker in the finest sense of the term. Although Evelyn herself was never fully accepted into the social structures of Cambridge society, she always ensured that Alfred lived in a comfortable, tastefully appointed home, and saw to it that he had the space and opportunity to entertain fellow scholars and other Cambrians in a fashion that always reflected well upon the mathematician.
It is also in this period that Whitehead began work on his first major publication, his Treatise on Universal Algebra. Perhaps with his new status as a family man, Whitehead felt the need to better establish himself as a Cambridge scholar. The book would ultimately be of minimal influence in the mathematical community. Indeed, the mathematical discipline that goes by that name shares only its name with Whitehead’s work, and is otherwise a very different area of inquiry. Still, the book established Whitehead’s reputation as a scholar of note, and was the basis for his 1903 election as a Fellow of the Royal Society.
It was after the publication of this work that Whitehead began the lengthy collaboration with his student, and ultimately Trinity Fellow, Bertrand Russell, on that monumental work that would become the Principia Mathematica. However, the final stages of this collaboration would not occur within the precincts of Cambridge. By 1910, Whitehead had been at Trinity College for thirty years, and he felt his creativity was being stifled. But it was also in this year that Whitehead’s friend and colleague Andrew Forsyth’s long-time affair with a married woman turned into a public indiscretion. It was expected that Forsyth would lose his Cambridge professorship, but the school took the extra step of withdrawing his Trinity Fellowship as well. Publicly in protest of this extravagant action, Whitehead resigned his own professorship (though not his Fellowship) as well. Privately, it was the excuse he needed to shake up his own life.
At the age of 49 and lacking even the promise of a job, Whitehead moved his family to London, where he was unemployed for the academic year of 1910 – 11. It was Evelyn who borrowed or bullied the money from their acquaintances that kept the family afloat during that time. Alfred finally secured a lectureship at University College, but the position offered no chance of growth or advancement for him. Finally in 1914, the Imperial College of Science and Technology in London appointed him as a professor of applied Mathematics.
It was here that Whitehead’s initial burst of philosophical creativity occurred. His decades of research into logic and spatial reasoning expressed itself in a series of three profoundly original books on the subjects of science, nature, and Einstein’s theory of relativity. At the same time, Whitehead maintained his teaching load while also assuming an increasing number of significant administrative duties. He was universally praised for his skill in all three of these general activities. However, by 1921 Whitehead was sixty years old and facing mandatory retirement within the English academic system. He would only be permitted to work until his sixty-fifth birthday, and then only with an annual dispensation from Imperial College. So it was that in 1924, Whitehead accepted an appointment as a professor of philosophy at Harvard University.
While Whitehead’s work at Imperial College is impressive, the explosion of works that came during his Harvard years is absolutely astounding. These publications include Science and the Modern World, Process and Reality, and Adventures of Ideas.
Whitehead continued to teach at Harvard until his retirement in 1937. He had been elected to the British Academy in 1931, and awarded the Order of Merit in 1945. He died peacefully on December 30th, 1947. Per the explicit instructions in his will, Evelyn Whitehead burned all of his unpublished papers. This action has been the source of boundless regret for Whitehead scholars, but it was Whitehead’s belief that evaluations of his thought should be based exclusively on his published work.
The thematic and historical analyses of Whitehead’s work largely coincide. However, these two approaches naturally lend themselves to slightly different emphases, and there are important historical overlaps of the dominating themes of his thought. So it is worthwhile to view these themes ahistorically prior to showing their temporal development.
The first of these thematic structures might reasonably be called “the problem of space.” The confluence of several trends in mathematical research set this problem at the very forefront of Whitehead’s own inquiries. James Clerk Maxwell’s Treatise on electromagnetism had been published in 1873, and Maxwell himself taught at Cambridge from 1871 until his death in 1879. The topic was a major subject of interest at Cambridge, and Whitehead wrote his Trinity Fellowship dissertation on Maxwell’s theory. During the same period, William Clifford in England, and Felix Klein and Wilhelm Killing in Germany were advancing the study of spaces of constant curvature. Whitehead was well aware of their work, as well as that of Hermann Grassmann, whose ideas would later become of central importance in tensor analysis.
The second major trend of Whitehead’s thought can be usefully abbreviated as “the problem of history,” although a more accurate descriptive phrase would be “the problem of the accretion of value.” Of the two themes, this one can be the more difficult to discern within Whitehead’s corpus, partly because it is often implicit and does not lend itself to formalized analysis. In its more obvious forms, this theme first appears in Whitehead’s writings on education. However, even in his earliest works, Whitehead’s concern with the function of symbolism as an instrument in the growth of knowledge shows a concern for the accretion of value. Nevertheless, it is primarily with his later philosophical work that this topic emerges as a central element and primary focus of his thought.
Whitehead’s first major publication was his A Treatise on Universal Algebra with Applications (“UA,” 1898.) (Whenever appropriate, common abbreviations will be given, along with the year of publication, for Whitehead’s major works.) Originally intended as a two-volume work, the second volume never appeared as Whitehead’s thinking on the subject continued to evolve, and as the plans for Principia Mathematica eventually came to incorporate many of the objectives of this volume. Despite the “algebra” in the title, the work is primarily on the foundations of geometry and formal spatial relations. UA offers little in the way of original research by Whitehead. Rather, the work is primarily expository in character, drawing together a number of previously divergent and scattered themes of mathematical investigation into the nature of spatial relations and their underlying logic, and presenting them in a systematic form.
While the book helped establish Whitehead’s reputation as a scholar and was the basis of his election as a Fellow of the Royal Society, UA had little direct impact on mathematical research either then or later. Part of the problem was the timing and approach of Whitehead’s method. For while he was very explicit about the need for the rigorous development of symbolic logic, Whitehead’s logic was “algebraic” in character. That is to say, Whitehead’s focus was on relational systems of order and structure preserving transformations. In contrast, the approaches of Giuseppe Peano and Gottlob Frege, with their emphasis on proof and semantic relations, soon became the focus of mathematical attention. While these techniques were soon to become of central importance for Whitehead’s own work, the centrality of algebraic methods to Whitehead’s thinking is always in evidence, especially in his philosophy of nature and metaphysics. The emphasis on structural relations in these works is a key component to understanding his arguments.
In addition, UA itself was one in a rising chorus of voices that had begun to take the work of Hermann Grassmann seriously. Grassmann algebras would come to play a vital role in tensor analysis and general relativity. Finally, the opening discussion of UA regarding the importance and uses of formal symbolism remains of philosophical interest, both in its own right and as an important element in Whitehead’s later thought.
Other early works by Whitehead include his two short books, the Axioms of Projective Geometry (1906) and the Axioms of Descriptive Geometry (1907). These works take a much more explicitly logical approach to their subject matter, as opposed to the algebraic techniques of Whitehead’s first book. However, it remains the case that these two works are not about presenting cutting edge research so much as they are about the clear and systematic development of existing materials. As suggested by their titles, the approach is axiomatic, with the axioms chosen for their illustrative and intuitive value, rather than their strictly logical parsimony. As such, these books continue to serve as clear and concise introductions to their subject matters.
Even as he was writing the two Axioms books, Whitehead was well into the collaboration with Bertrand Russell that would lead to the three volumes of the Principia Mathematica. Although most of the Principia was written by Russell, the work itself was a truly collaborative endeavor, as is demonstrated by the extant correspondence between the two. The intention of the Principia was to deduce the whole of arithmetic from absolutely fundamental logical principles. But Whitehead’s role in the project, besides working with Russell on the vast array of details in the first three volumes, was to be the principal author of a fourth volume whose focus would be the logical foundations of geometry. Thus, what Whitehead had originally intended to be the second volume of UA had transformed into the fourth volume of the Principia Mathematica, and like that earlier planned volume, the fourth part of Principia Mathematica never appeared. It would not be until Whitehead’s published work on the theory of extension, work that never appeared independently but always as a part of a larger philosophical enterprise, that his research into the foundations of geometry would finally pay off.
By the time the Principia was published, Whitehead had left his teaching position at Trinity, and eventually secured a lectureship at London’s University College. It was in these London years that Whitehead published a number of essays and addresses on the theory of education. But it would be a mistake to suppose that his concern with education began with the more teaching-oriented (as opposed to research-oriented) positions he occupied after departing Cambridge. Whitehead had long been noted as an exceptional lecturer by his students at Cambridge. He also took on less popular teaching duties, such as teaching at the non-degree conferring women’s institutions associated with Cambridge of Girton and Newham colleges.
Moreover, the concern for the conveyance of ideas is evident from the earliest of Whitehead’s writings. The very opening pages of UA are devoted to a discussion of the reasons and economies of well-chosen symbols as aids to the advancement of thought. Or again, the intention underlying the two Axioms books was not so much the advancement of research as the communication of achieved developments in mathematics. Whitehead’s book, An Introduction to Mathematics (1911), published in the midst of the effort to get the Principia out, had no research agenda per se. This book was again entirely devoted toward introducing students to the character of mathematical thought, to the methods of abstraction, the nature of variables and functions, and to offer some sense of the power and generality of these formalisms.
Whitehead’s essays that specifically address education often do so with the explicit desire to revise the teaching of mathematics in England. But they also argue, both explicitly and implicitly, for a balance of liberal education devoted to the opening of the mind, with technical education intended to facilitate the vocational aptitudes of the student. Education for Whitehead was never just the mere memorization of ancient stories and empty abstractions, any more than it was just the technical training of the working class. It always entailed the growth of the student as a fully functioning human being. In this respect, as well as others, Whitehead’s arguments compare favorably with those of John Dewey [[hyperlink]].
Whitehead never systematized his educational thought the way Dewey did, so these ideas must be gleaned from his various essays and looked for as an implicit foundation to such larger works as his Adventures of Ideas (see below). Many of Whitehead’s essays on education were collected together in The Aims of Education, published in 1929, as well as his Essays in Science and Philosophy, published in 1948.
Whitehead’s interest in the problem of space was, at least from his days as a graduate student at Cambridge, more than just an interest in the purely formal or mathematical aspects of geometry. It is to be recalled that his dissertation was on Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism, which was a major development in the ideas that led to Einstein’s theories of special and general relativity. The famous Michelson-Morely experiment to measure the so-called “Ether drift” was a response to Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism. Einstein himself offers only a generic nod toward the experiments regarding space and light in his 1905 paper on special relativity. The problem Einstein specifically cites in that paper is the lack of symmetry then to be found in theories of space and the behavior of electromagnetic phenomena. By 1910, when the first volume of the Principia Mathematica was being published, Hermann Minkowski had reorganized the mathematics of Einstein’s special relativity into a four-dimensional non-Euclidean manifold. By 1914, two years before the publication of Einstein’s paper on general relativity, theoretical developments had advanced to the extent that an expedition to the Crimea was planned to observe the predicted bending of stellar light around the sun during an eclipse. This expedition was cancelled with the eruption of the First World War.
These developments helped conspire to prevent Whitehead’s planned fourth volume of the Principia from ever appearing. A few papers appeared during the war years, in which a relational theory of space begins to emerge. What is perhaps most notable about these papers is that they are no longer specifically mathematical in nature, but are explicitly philosophical. Finally, in 1919 and 1920, Whitehead’s thought appeared in print with the publications of two books, An Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge (“PNK,” 1919) and The Concept of Nature (“CN,” 1920).
While PNK is much more formally technical than CN, both books share a common and radical view of nature and science that rejects the identification of nature with the mathematical tools used to characterize its relational structures. Nature for Whitehead is that which is experienced through the senses. For this reason, Whitehead argues that there are no such things as “points” of either time or space. An infinitesimal point is a high abstraction with no experiential reality, while time and space are irreducibly extensional in character.
To account for the effectiveness of mathematical abstractions in their application to natural knowledge, Whitehead introduced his theory of “extensive abstraction.” By using the logical and topological structures of concentric part-whole relations, Whitehead argued that abstract entities such as geometric points could be derived from the concrete, extensive relations of space and time. These abstract entities, in their turn, could be shown to be significant of the nature they had been abstractively derived from. Moreover, since these abstract entities were formally easier to use, their significance of nature could be retained through their various deductive relations, thereby giving evidence for further natural significances by this detour through purely abstract relations.
Whitehead also rejected “objects” as abstractions, and argued that the fundamental realities of both experience and nature are events. Events are themselves irreducibly extended entities, where the temporal / durational extension is primary. “Objects” are the idealized significances that retain a stable meaning through an event or family of events.
It is important to note here that Whitehead is arguing for a kind of empiricism. But, as Victor Lowe has noted, this empiricism is more akin to the ideas of William James than it is to the logical positivism of Whitehead’s day. In other words, Whitehead is arguing for a kind of Jamesian “radical empiricism,” in which sense-data are abstractions, and the basic deliverances of raw experience include such things as relations and complex events.
These ideas were further developed with the publication of Whitehead’s The Principles of Relativity with Applications to Natural Science (“R,” 1922). Here Whitehead proposed an alternative physical theory of space and gravity to Einstein’s general relativity. Whitehead’s theory has commonly been classified as “quasi-linear” in the physics literature, when it should properly be describes as “bimetric.” Einstein’s theory collapses the physical and the spatial into a single metric, so that gravity and space are essentially identified. Whitehead pointed out that this then loses the logical relations necessary to make meaningful cosmological measurements. In order to make meaningful measurements of space, we must know the geometry of that space so that the congruence relations of our measurement instruments can be projected through that space while retaining their significance. Since Einstein’s theory loses the distinction between the physical and the geometrical, the only way we can know the geometry of the space we are trying to measure is if we first know the distributions of matter and energy throughout the cosmos that affect that geometry. But we can only know these distributions if we can first make accurate measurements of space. Thus, as Whitehead argued, we are left in the position of first having to know everything before we can know anything.
Whitehead argued that the solution to this problem was to separate the necessary relations of geometry from the contingent relations of physics, so that one’s theory of space and gravity is “bimetric,” or is built from the two metrics of geometry and physics. Unfortunately, Whitehead never used the term “bimetric,” and his theory has often been misinterpreted. Questions of the viability of Whitehead’s specific theory have needlessly distracted both philosophers and physicists from the real issue of the class of theories of space and gravity that Whitehead was arguing for. Numerous viable bimetric alternatives to Einstein’s theory of relativity are currently known in the physics literature. But because Whitehead’s theory has been misclassified and its central arguments poorly understood, the connections between Whitehead’s philosophical arguments and these physical theories have largely gone unnoticed.
The problems Whitehead had engaged with his triad of works on the philosophy of nature and science required a complete re-evaluation of the assumptions of modern science. To this end, Whitehead published Science in the Modern World (“SMW,” 1925). This work had both a critical and a constructive aspect, although the critical themes occupied most of Whitehead’s attention. Central to those critical themes was Whitehead’s challenge to dogmatic scientific materialism developed through an analysis of the historical developments and contingencies of that belief. In addition, he continued with the themes of his earlier triad, arguing that objects in general, and matter in particular, are abstractions. What are most real are events and their mutual involvements in relational structures.
Already in PNK, Whitehead had characterized electromagnetic phenomena by saying that while such phenomena could be related to specific vector quantities at each specific point of space, they express “at all points one definite physical fact” (PNK, 29). Physical facts such as electromagnetic phenomena are single, relational wholes, but they are spread out across the cosmos. In SMW Whitehead called the failure to appreciate this holism and the relational connectedness of reality, “the fallacy of simple location.” According to Whitehead, much of contemporary science, driven as it was by the dogma of materialism, was committed to the fallacy that only such things as could be localized at a mathematically simple “point” of space and time were genuinely real. Relations and connections were, in this dogmatic view, secondary to and parasitic upon such simply located entities. Whitehead saw this as reversing the facts of nature and experience, and devoted considerable space in SMW to criticizing it.
A second and related fallacy of contemporary science was what Whitehead identified in SMW as, “the fallacy of misplaced concreteness.” While misplaced concreteness could include treating entities with a simple location as more real than those of a field of relations, it also went beyond this. Misplaced concreteness included treating “points” of space or time as more real than the extensional relations that are the genuine deliverances of experience. Thus, this fallacy resulted in treating abstractions as though they were concretely real. In Whitehead’s view, all of contemporary physics was infected by this fallacy, and the resultant philosophy of nature had reversed the roles of the concrete and the abstract.
The critical aspects of SMW were ideas that Whitehead had already expressed (in different forms) in his previous publications, only now with more refined clarity and persuasiveness. On the other hand, the constructive arguments in SMW are astonishing in their scope and subtlety, and are the first presentation of his mature metaphysical thinking. For example, the word “prehension,” which Whitehead defines as “uncognitive apprehension” (SMW 69) makes its first systematic appearance in Whitehead’s writings as he refines and develops the kinds and layers of relational connections between people and the surrounding world. As the “uncognitive” in the above is intended to show, these relations are not always or exclusively knowledge based, yet they are a form of “grasping” of aspects of the world. Our connection to the world begins with a “pre-epistemic” prehension of it, from which the process of abstraction is able to distill valid knowledge of the world. But that knowledge is abstract and only significant of the world; it does not stand in any simple one-to-one relation with the world. In particular, this pre-epistemic grasp of the world is the source of our quasi- a priori knowledge of space which enables us to know of those uniformities that make cosmological measurements, and the general conduct of science, possible.
SMW goes far beyond the purely epistemic program of Whitehead’s philosophy of nature. The final three chapters, entitled “God,” “Religion and Science,” and “Requisites for Social Progress,” clearly announce the explicit emergence of the second major thematic strand of Whitehead’s thought, the “problem of history” or “the accretion of value.” Moreover, these topics are engaged with the same thoroughly relational approach that Whitehead previously used with nature and science.
Despite the foreshadowing of these last chapters of SMW, Whitehead’s next book may well have come as a surprise to his academic colleagues. Whitehead’s brief Religion in the Making (“RM,” 1926) tackles no part of his earlier thematic problem of space, but instead focuses entirely on the second thematic of history and value. Whitehead defines religion as “what the individual does with his own solitariness” (RM 16). Yet it is still Whitehead the algebraist who is constructing this definition. Solitariness is understood as a multi-layered relational modality of the individual in and toward the world. In addition, this relational mode cannot be understood in separation from its history. On this point, Whitehead compares religion with arithmetic. Thus, an understanding of the latter makes no essential reference to its history, whereas for religion such a reference is vital. Moreover, as Whitehead states, “You use arithmetic, but you are religious” (RM 15).
Whitehead also argues that, “The purpose of God is the attainment of value in the temporal world,” and “Value is inherent in actuality itself” (RM 100). Whitehead’s use of the word “God” in the foregoing invites a wide range of habitual assumptions about his meaning, most, if not all, of which will probably be mistaken. The key element for Whitehead is value. God, like arithmetic, is discussed in terms of something which has a purpose. On the other hand, value is like being religious in that it is inherent. It is something that is rather than something that is used.
Shortly after this work, there appeared another book whose brevity betrays its importance, Symbolism its Meaning and Effect (“S,” 1927). Whitehead’s explicit interest in symbols was present in his earliest publication. But in conjunction with his theory of prehension, the theory of symbols came to take on an even greater importance for him. Our “uncognitive” sense-perceptions are directly caught up in our symbolic awareness as is shown by the immediacy with which we move beyond what is directly given to our senses. Whitehead uses the example of a puppy dog that sees a chair as a chair rather than as a patch of color, even though the latter is all that impinges on the dog’s retina. (Whitehead may not have known that dogs are color blind, but this does not significantly affect his example.) Thus, this work further develops Whitehead’s theories of perception and awareness, and does so in a manner that is relatively non-technical. Because of the centrality of the theory of symbols and perception to Whitehead’s later philosophy, this clarity of exposition makes this book a vital stepping stone to what followed.
What followed was Process and Reality (“PR,” 1929). This book is easily one of the most dense and difficult works in the entire Western canon. The book is rife with technical terms of Whitehead’s own invention, necessitated by his struggle to push beyond the inherited limits of the available concepts toward a comprehensive vision of the logical structures of becoming. It is here that we see the problem of space receive its ultimate payoff in Whitehead’s thought. But this payoff comes in the form of a fully relational metaphysical scheme that draws upon his theory of symbols and perception in the most essential manner possible. At the same time, PR plants the seeds for the further engagement of the problem of the accretion of value that is to come in his later work. Because each process of becoming must be considered holistically as an essentially organic unity, Whitehead often refers to his theory as the “philosophy of organism.”
PR invites controversy while defying brief exposition. Many of the relational ideas Whitehead develops are holistic in character, and thus do not lend themselves to the linear presentation of language. Moreover, the language Whitehead needs to build his holistic image of the world is often biological or mentalistic in character, which can be jarring when the topic being discussed is something like an electron. Moreover, Whitehead the algebraist was an intrinsically relational thinker, and explicitly characterized the subject / predicate mode of language as a “high abstraction.” Nevertheless, there are some basic ideas which can be quickly set out.
The first of these is that PR is not about time per se. This has been a subject of much confusion. But Whitehead himself points out that physical time as such only comes about with “reflection” of the “divisibility” of his two major relational types into one another (PR 288 – 9). Moreover, throughout PR, Whitehead continues to endorse the theory of nature found in his earlier triad of books on the subject. So the first step in gaining a handle on PR is to recognize that it is better thought of as addressing the logic of becoming, whereas his books from 1919 – 1922 address the “nature” of time.
The basic units of becoming for Whitehead are “actual occasions.” Actual occasions are “drops of experience,” and relate to the world into which they are emerging by “feeling” that relatedness and translating it into the occasion’s concrete reality. When first encountered, this mode of expression is likely to seem peculiar if not downright outrageous. One thing to note here is that Whitehead is not talking about any sort of high-level cognition. When he speaks of “feeling” he means an immediacy of concrete relatedness that is vastly different from any sort of “knowing,” yet which exists on a relational spectrum where cognitive modes can emerge from sufficiently complex collections of occasions that interrelate within a systematic whole. Also, feeling is a far more basic form of relatedness than can be represented by formal algebraic or geometrical schemata. These latter are intrinsically abstract, and to take them as basic would be to commit the fallacy of misplaced concreteness. But feeling is not abstract. Rather, it is the first and most concrete manifestation of an occasion’s relational engagement with reality.
This focus on concrete modes of relatedness is essential because an actual occasion is itself a coming into being of the concrete. The nature of this “concrescence,” using Whitehead’s term, is a matter of the occasion’s creatively internalizing its relatedness to the rest of the world by feeling that world, and in turn uniquely expressing its concreteness through its extensive connectedness with that world. Thus an electron in a field of forces “feels” the electrical charges acting upon it, and translates this “experience” into its own electronic modes of concreteness. Only later do we schematize these relations with the abstract algebraic and geometrical forms of physical science. For the electron, the interaction is irreducibly concrete.
Actual occasions are fundamentally atomic in character, which leads to the next interpretive difficulty. In his previous works, events were essentially extended and continuous. And when Whitehead speaks of an “event” in PR without any other qualifying adjectives, he still means the extensive variety found in his earlier works (PR 73). But PR deals with a different set of problems from that previous triad, and it cannot take such continuity for granted. For one thing, Whitehead treats Zeno’s Paradoxes very seriously and argues that one cannot resolve these paradoxes if one starts from the assumption of continuity, because it is then impossible to make sense of anything coming immediately before or immediately after anything else. Between any two points of a continuum such as the real number line there are an infinite number of other points, thus rendering the concept of the “next” point meaningless. But it is precisely this concept of the “next occasion” that Whitehead requires to render intelligible the relational structures of his metaphysics. If there are infinitely many occasions between any two occasions, even ones that are nominally “close” together, then it becomes impossible to say how it is that later occasions feel their predecessors – there is an unbounded infinity of other occasions intervening in such influences, and changing it in what are now undeterminable ways. Therefore, Whitehead argued, continuity is not something which is “given;” rather it is something which is achieved. Each occasion makes itself continuous with its past in the manner in which it feels that past and creatively incorporates the past into its own concrescence, its coming into being.
Thus, Whitehead argues against the “continuity of becoming” and in favor of the “becoming of continuity” (PR 68 – 9). Occasions become atomically, but once they have become they incorporate themselves into the continuity of the universe by feeling the concreteness of what has come before and making that concreteness a part of the occasion’s own internal makeup. The continuity of space and durations in Whitehead’s earlier triad does not conflict with his metaphysical atomism, because those earlier works were dealing with physical nature in which continuity has already come into being, while PR is dealing with relational structures that are logically and metaphysically prior to nature.
Most authors believe that the sense of “atomic” being used here is similar to, if not synonymous with, “microscopic.” However, there are reasons why one might want to resist such an interpretation. To begin with, it teeters on the edge of the fallacy of simple location to assume that by “atomic” Whitehead means “very small.” An electron, which Whitehead often refers to as an “electronic occasion,” may have a tiny region of most highly focused effects. But the electromagnetic field that spreads out from that electron reaches far beyond that narrow focus. The electron “feels” and is “felt” throughout this field of influence which is not spatially limited. Moreover, Whitehead clearly states that space and time are derivative notions from extension whereas, “To be an actual occasion in the physical world means that the entity in question is a relatum in this scheme of extensive connection” (PR 288 – 9). The quality of being microscopic is something that only emerges after one has a fully developed notion of space, while actual occasions are logically prior to space and a part of the extensive relations from which space itself is derived. Thus it is at least arguably the case that the sense of “atomic” that Whitehead is employing hearkens back more to the original Greek meaning of “irreducible” than to the microscopic sense that pervades physical science. In other words, the “atomic” nature of what is actual is directly connected to its relational holism.
The structure of PR is also worth attention, for each of the five major parts offers a significant perspective on the whole. Part I gives Whitehead’s defense of speculative philosophy and sets out the “categoreal scheme” underlying PR. The second part applies these categories to a variety of historical and thematic topics. Part three gives the theory of prehensions as these manifest themselves with and through the categories, and is often called the “genetic account.” The theory of extension, or the “coordinate account,” constitutes part four and represents the ultimate development of Whitehead’s rigorous thought on the nature of space. The last and final part presents both a theory of the dialectic of opposites, and the minimalist role of God in Whitehead’s system as the foundation of coherence in the world’s processes of becoming.
Two of the features of part I that stand out are Whitehead’s defense of speculative philosophy, and his proposed resolution of the traditional problem of the One and the Many. “Speculative philosophy” for Whitehead is a phrase he uses interchangeably with “metaphysics.” However, what Whitehead means is a speculative program in the most scientifically honorific sense of the term. Rejecting any form of dogmatism, Whitehead states that his purpose is to, “frame a coherent, logical, necessary system of general ideas in terms of which every element of our experience can be interpreted” (PR 3). The second feature, the solution to the problem of the “one and the many,” is often summarized as, “The many become one, and increase by one.” This means that the many occasions of the universe that have already become contribute their atomic reality to the becoming of a new occasion (“the many become one”). However, this occasion, upon fully realizing in its own atomic character, now contributes that reality to the previously achieved realities of the other occasions (“and increase by one”).
The atomic becoming of an actual occasion is achieved by that occasion’s “prehensive” relations and its “extensive” relations. An actual occasion’s holistically felt and non-sequentially internalized concrete evaluations of its relationships to the rest of the world is the subject matter of the theory of “prehension,” part III of PR. This is easily one of the most difficult and complex portions of that work. The development that Whitehead is describing is so holistic and anti-sequential that it might appropriately be compared to James Joyce’s Finnegan’s Wake. An actual occasion “prehends” its world (relationally takes that world in) by feeling the “objective data” of past occasions which the new occasion utilizes in its own concrescence. This data is prehended in an atemporal and nonlinear manner, and is creatively combined into the occasion’s own manifest self-realization. This is to say that the becoming of the occasion is also informed by a densely teleological sense of the occasion’s own ultimate actuality, its “subjective aim” or what Whitehead calls the occasion’s “superject.” Once it has become fully actualized, the occasion as superject becomes an objective datum for those occasions which follow it, and the process begins again.
This same process of concrescence is described in its extensive characters in part IV, where the mereological (formal relations of part and whole) as well as topological (non-metrical relations of neighborhood and connection) characteristics of extension are developed. Unlike the subtle discussion of prehensions, Whitehead’s theory of extension reads very much like a text book on the logic of spatial relations. Indeed, a great deal of contemporary work in artificial intelligence and spatial reasoning identifies this section of PR as foundational to this field of research, which often goes by the intimidating title of “mereotopology.”
The holistic character of prehension and the analytical nature of extension invite the reader to interpret the former as a theory of “internal relations” and the latter as a theory of “external relations.” Put simply, external relations treat the self-identity of a thing as the first, analytically given fact, while internal relations treat it as the final, synthetically developed result. But Whitehead explicitly associates internal relations with extension, and externality with that of prehension. This seeming paradox can be resolved by noting that, even though prehension is the process of the actual occasion’s “internalizing” the rest of reality as it composes its own self-identity, the achieved result (the superject) is the atomic realization of that occasion in its ultimate externality to the rest of the world. On the other hand, the mereological relations of part and whole from which extension is built, are themselves so intrinsically correlative to one another that each only meaningfully expresses its own relational structures to the extent that it completely internalizes the other.
Whitehead was never one to revisit a problem once he felt he had addressed it adequately. With the publication of PR and the final version of his theory of extension, Whitehead never returned to the ‘problem of space’ except on those limited occasions when his later work required that he mention those earlier developments. Those later works were effectively focused upon the ‘problem of history’ to the exclusion of all else. The primary book on this topic is Adventures of Ideas (“AI,” 1933).
AI is a pithy and engaging book whose opening pages entice the reader with clear and evidently non-technical language. But it is a book that needs to be approached with care. Whitehead assumes, without explanation, knowledge on the part of his readers of the metaphysical scheme of PR, and resorts to the terminology of that book whenever the argument requires it. Indeed, AI is the application of Whitehead’s process metaphysics to the “problem of history.” Whitehead surveys numerous cultural forms from a thoroughly relational perspective, analyzing the ways in which these connections contribute both to the rigidities of culture and the possibilities for novelty in various “adventures” in the accumulation of meanings and values. Many of the forces in this adventure of meaning are blind and senseless, thus presenting the challenge of becoming more deliberate in our processes of building and changing them.
In line with this, two other works bear mentioning: The Function of Reason (“FR,” 1929) and Modes of Thought (“MT,” 1938). FR presents an updated version of Aristotle’s three classes of soul (the vegetative, the animate, and the rational); only in Whitehead’s case, the classifications are, as the title states, functional rather than facultative. Thus, for Whitehead, the function of reason is “promote the art of life,” which is a three-fold function of “(i) to live, (ii) to live well, (iii) to live better” (FR 4, 8). Thus, reason for Whitehead is intrinsically organic in both origin and purpose. But the achievement of a truly reasonable life is a matter that involves more than just the logical organization of propositional knowledge. It is a matter of full and sensitive engagement with the entire lived world. This is the topic of MT, Whitehead’s final major publication. In arguing for a multiplicity of modes of thought, Whitehead offered his final great rebellion against the excessive focus on language that dominated the philosophical thought of his day. In this work, Whitehead also offered his final insight as to the purpose and function of philosophy itself. “The use of philosophy,” Whitehead concluded, “is to maintain an active novelty of fundamental ideas illuminating the social system. It reverses the slow descent of accepted thought towards the inactive commonplace.” In this respect, “philosophy is akin to poetry” (MT 174).
Evaluating Whitehead’s influence is a difficult matter. While Whitehead’s influence has never been great, in the opening years of the 21st century it appears to be growing in a broad range of otherwise divergent disciplines. Fulfilling his own vision of the use of philosophy, Whitehead’s ideas are a rich trove of alternative approaches to traditional problems. His thoroughgoing relational and process orientation offers numerous opportunities to reimagine the ways in which the world is connected and how those connections manifest themselves.
The most prominent area of ongoing Whiteheadian influence is within process theology. While Whitehead’s explicit philosophical treatments of God seldom went beyond that of an ideal principle of maximal coherence, many others have developed these ideas further. Writers such as Charles Hartshorne and John Cobb have speculated on, and argued for, a much more robust, ontological conception of God. Nothing in Whitehead’s own writings require such developments, but neither are they in any way precluded. The God of process theology tends to be far more personal and much more of a co-participant in the creative process of the universe than that which one often finds in orthodox religions.
Within philosophy itself, Whitehead’s influence has been smaller and much more diffuse. Yet those influences are likely to crop up in what seem, on the surface at least, to be improbable places. The literature here is too vast to enumerate, but it includes researches from all of the major philosophical schools including pragmatism, analytical, and continental thought. The topics engaged include ontology, phenomenology, personalism, philosophical anthropology, ethics, political theory, economics, etc.
There are also a variety of ways in which Whitehead’s work continues to influence scientific research. This influence is, again, typically found only in the work of widely scattered individuals. However, one area where this is not the case is Whitehead’s theory of extension. Whitehead’s work on the logical basis of geometry is widely cited as foundational in the study of mereotopology, which in turn is of fundamental importance in the study of spatial reasoning, especially in the context of artificial intelligence.
There is also a growing interest in Whitehead’s work within physics, where it is proving to be a valuable source of ideas to help re-conceive the nature of physical relations. This is particularly true of such bizarre phenomena as quantum entanglement, which seems to violate orthodox notions of mechanistic interaction. There is a renewed interest in Whitehead’s arguments regarding relativity, particularly because of their potential tie-in with other bimetric theories of space and gravity. Other areas of interest include biology, where Whitehead’s holistic relationalism again offers alternative models of explanation.
Those of Whitehead’s primary texts which have been mentioned in the article are listed below in chronological order. More technical works have been “starred” with an asterisk. Original publication dates are given, as well as more recent printings. Of these more recent printings, those done by Dover Publications have been favored because they retain the pagination of the original imprints. On the other hand, the volume of the secondary literature on Whitehead is truly astounding, and a comprehensive list would go far beyond the limits of this article. So while the secondary works listed below can hardly be viewed as definitive, they do offer a useful starting place. The secondary sources are divided into two groups, those that are relatively more accessible and those that are relatively more technical.
(Relatively more accessible secondary texts:)
(Relatively more technical secondary texts:)
Gary L. Herstein
Southern Illinois University at Carbondale
Last updated: May 8, 2007 | Originally published: