Ludwig Wittgenstein is one of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century, and regarded by some as the most important since Immanuel Kant. His early work was influenced by that of Arthur Schopenhauer and, especially, by his teacher Bertrand Russell and by Gottlob Frege, who became something of a friend. This work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, the only philosophy book that Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. It claimed to solve all the major problems of philosophy and was held in especially high esteem by the anti-metaphysical logical positivists. The Tractatus is based on the idea that philosophical problems arise from misunderstandings of the logic of language, and it tries to show what this logic is. Wittgenstein’s later work, principally his Philosophical Investigations, shares this concern with logic and language, but takes a different, less technical, approach to philosophical problems. This book helped to inspire so-called ordinary language philosophy. This style of doing philosophy has fallen somewhat out of favor, but Wittgenstein’s work on rule-following and private language is still considered important, and his later philosophy is influential in a growing number of fields outside philosophy.
Ludwig Josef Johann Wittgenstein, born on April 26th 1889 in Vienna, Austria, was a charismatic enigma. He has been something of a cult figure but shunned publicity and even built an isolated hut in Norway to live in complete seclusion. His sexuality was ambiguous but he was probably gay; how actively so is still a matter of controversy. His life seems to have been dominated by an obsession with moral and philosophical perfection, summed up in the subtitle of Ray Monk’s excellent biography Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius.
His concern with moral perfection led Wittgenstein at one point to insist on confessing to several people various sins, including that of allowing others to underestimate the extent of his ‘Jewishness’. His father Karl Wittgenstein’s parents were born Jewish but converted to Protestantism and his mother Leopoldine (nee Kalmus) was Catholic, but her father was of Jewish descent. Wittgenstein himself was baptized in a Catholic church and was given a Catholic burial, although between baptism and burial he was neither a practicing nor a believing Catholic.
The Wittgenstein family was large and wealthy. Karl Wittgenstein was one of the most successful businessmen in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, leading the iron and steel industry there. The Wittgensteins’ home attracted people of culture, especially musicians, including the composer Johannes Brahms, who was a friend of the family. Music remained important to Wittgenstein throughout his life. So did darker matters. Ludwig was the youngest of eight children, and of his four brothers, three committed suicide.
As for his career, Wittgenstein studied mechanical engineering in Berlin and in 1908 went to Manchester, England to do research in aeronautics, experimenting with kites. His interest in engineering led to an interest in mathematics which in turn got him thinking about philosophical questions about the foundations of mathematics. He visited the mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege (1848-1925), who recommended that he study with Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) in Cambridge. At Cambridge Wittgenstein greatly impressed Russell and G.E. Moore (1873- 1958), and began work on logic.
When his father died in 1913 Wittgenstein inherited a fortune, which he quickly gave away. When war broke out the next year, he volunteered for the Austrian army. He continued his philosophical work and won several medals for bravery during the war. The result of his thinking on logic was the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus which was eventually published in English in 1922 with Russell’s help. This was the only book Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. Having thus, in his opinion, solved all the problems of philosophy, Wittgenstein became an elementary school teacher in rural Austria, where his approach was strict and unpopular, but apparently effective. He spent 1926-28 meticulously designing and building an austere house in Vienna for his sister Gretl.
In 1929 he returned to Cambridge to teach at Trinity College, recognizing that in fact he had more work to do in philosophy. He became professor of philosophy at Cambridge in 1939. During World War II he worked as a hospital porter in London and as a research technician in Newcastle. After the war he returned to university teaching but resigned his professorship in 1947 to concentrate on writing. Much of this he did in Ireland, preferring isolated rural places for his work. By 1949 he had written all the material that was published after his death as Philosophical Investigations, arguably his most important work. He spent the last two years of his life in Vienna, Oxford and Cambridge and kept working until he died of prostate cancer in Cambridge in April 1951. His work from these last years has been published as On Certainty. His last words were, “Tell them I’ve had a wonderful life.”
Wittgenstein told Ludwig von Ficker that the point of the Tractatus was ethical. In the preface to the book he says that its value consists in two things: “that thoughts are expressed in it” and “that it shows how little is achieved when these problems are solved.” The problems he refers to are the problems of philosophy defined, we may suppose, by the work of Frege and Russell, and perhaps also Schopenhauer. At the end of the book Wittgenstein says “My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical” [emphasis added]. What to make of the Tractatus, its author, and the propositions it contains, then, is no easy matter.
The book certainly does not seem to be about ethics. It consists of numbered propositions in seven sets. Proposition 1.2 belongs to the first set and is a comment on proposition 1. Proposition 1.21 is about proposition 1.2, and so on. The seventh set contains only one proposition, the famous “What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence.”
Some important and representative propositions from the book are these:
1 The world is all that is the case.
4.01 A proposition is a picture of reality.
4.0312 …My fundamental idea is that the ‘logical constants’ are not representatives; that there can be no representatives of the logic of facts.
4.121 …Propositions show the logical form of reality. They display it.
4.1212 What can be shown, cannot be said.
4.5 …The general form of a proposition is: This is how things stand.
5.43 …all the propositions of logic say the same thing, to wit nothing.
5.4711 To give the essence of a proposition means to give the essence of all description, and thus the essence of the world.
5.6 The limits of my language mean the limits of my world.
Here and elsewhere in the Tractatus Wittgenstein seems to be saying that the essence of the world and of life is: This is how things are. One is tempted to add “–deal with it.” That seems to fit what Cora Diamond has called his “accept and endure” ethics, but he says that the propositions of the Tractatus are meaningless, not profound insights, ethical or otherwise. What are we to make of this?
Many commentators ignore or dismiss what Wittgenstein said about his work and its aims, and instead look for regular philosophical theories in his work. The most famous of these in the Tractatus is the “picture theory” of meaning. According to this theory propositions are meaningful insofar as they picture states of affairs or matters of empirical fact. Anything normative, supernatural or (one might say) metaphysical must, it therefore seems, be nonsense. This has been an influential reading of parts of the Tractatus. Unfortunately, this reading leads to serious problems since by its own lights the Tractatus’ use of words like “object,” “reality” and “world” is illegitimate. These concepts are purely formal or a priori. A statement such as “There are objects in the world” does not picture a state of affairs. Rather it is, as it were, presupposed by the notion of a state of affairs. The “picture theory” therefore denies sense to just the kind of statements of which the Tractatus is composed, to the framework supporting the picture theory itself. In this way the Tractatus pulls the rug out from under its own feet.
If the propositions of the Tractatus are nonsensical then they surely cannot put forward the picture theory of meaning, or any other theory. Nonsense is nonsense. However, this is not to say that the Tractatus itself is without value. Wittgenstein’s aim seems to have been to show up as nonsense the things that philosophers (himself included) are tempted to say. Philosophical theories, he suggests, are attempts to answer questions that are not really questions at all (they are nonsense), or to solve problems that are not really problems. He says in proposition 4.003 that:
Most of the propositions and questions of philosophers arise from our failure to understand the logic of our language. (They belong to the same class as the question whether the good is more or less identical than the beautiful.) And it is not surprising that the deepest problems are in fact not problems at all.
Philosophers, then, have the task of presenting the logic of our language clearly. This will not solve important problems but it will show that some things that we take to be important problems are really not problems at all. The gain is not wisdom but an absence of confusion. This is not a rejection of philosophy or logic. Wittgenstein took philosophical puzzlement very seriously indeed, but he thought that it needed dissolving by analysis rather than solving by the production of theories. The Tractatus presents itself as a key for untying a series of knots both profound and highly technical.
Wittgenstein had a lifelong interest in religion and claimed to see every problem from a religious point of view, but never committed himself to any formal religion. His various remarks on ethics also suggest a particular point of view, and Wittgenstein often spoke of ethics and religion together. This point of view or attitude can be seen in the four main themes that run through Wittgenstein’s writings on ethics and religion: goodness, value or meaning are not to be found in the world; living the right way involves acceptance of or agreement with the world, or life, or God’s will, or fate; one who lives this way will see the world as a miracle; there is no answer to the problem of life–the solution is the disappearance of the problem.
Certainly Wittgenstein worried about being morally good or even perfect, and he had great respect for sincere religious conviction, but he also said, in his 1929 lecture on ethics, that “the tendency of all men who ever tried to write or talk Ethics or Religion was to run against the boundaries of language,” i.e. to talk or write nonsense. This gives support to the view that Wittgenstein believed in mystical truths that somehow cannot be expressed meaningfully but that are of the utmost importance. It is hard to conceive, though, what these ‘truths’ might be.
An alternative view is that Wittgenstein believed that there is really nothing to say about ethics. This would explain why he wrote less and less about ethics as his life wore on. His “accept and endure” attitude and belief in going “the bloody hard way” are evident in all his work, especially after the Tractatus. Wittgenstein wants his reader not to think (too much) but to look at the “language games” (any practices that involve language) that give rise to philosophical (personal, existential, spiritual) problems. His approach to such problems is painstaking, thorough, open-eyed and receptive. His ethical attitude is an integral part of his method and shows itself as such.
But there is little to say about such an attitude short of recommending it. In Culture and Value p.29e Wittgenstein writes:
Rules of life are dressed up in pictures. And these pictures can only serve to describe what we are to do, not justify it. Because they could provide a justification only if they held good in other respects as well. I can say: “Thank these bees for their honey as though they were kind people who have prepared it for you”; that is intelligible and describes how I should like you to conduct yourself. But I cannot say: “Thank them because, look, how kind they are!”–since the next moment they may sting you.
In a world of contingency one cannot prove that a particular attitude is the correct one to take. If this suggests relativism, it should be remembered that it too is just one more attitude or point of view, and one without the rich tradition and accumulated wisdom, philosophical reasoning and personal experience of, say, orthodox Christianity or Judaism. Indeed crude relativism, the universal judgement that one cannot make universal judgements, is self- contradictory. Whether Wittgenstein’s views suggest a more sophisticated form of relativism is another matter, but the spirit of relativism seems far from Wittgenstein’s conservatism and absolute intolerance of his own moral shortcomings. Compare the tolerance that motivates relativism with Wittgenstein’s assertion to Russell that he would prefer “by far” an organization dedicated to war and slavery to one dedicated to peace and freedom. (This assertion, however, should not be taken literally: Wittgenstein was no war-monger and even recommended letting oneself be massacred rather than taking part in hand-to-hand combat. It was apparently the complacency, and perhaps the self-righteousness, of Russell’s liberal cause that Wittgenstein objected to.)
With regard to religion, Wittgenstein is often considered a kind of Anti-Realist (see below for more on this). He opposed interpretations of religion that emphasize doctrine or philosophical arguments intended to prove God’s existence, but was greatly drawn to religious rituals and symbols, and considered becoming a priest. He likened the ritual of religion to a great gesture, as when one kisses a photograph. This is not based on the false belief that the person in the photograph will feel the kiss or return it, nor is it based on any other belief. Neither is the kiss just a substitute for a particular phrase, like “I love you.” Like the kiss, religious activity does express an attitude, but it is not just the expression of an attitude in the sense that several other forms of expression might do just as well. There might be no substitute that would do. The same might be said of the whole language-game (or games) of religion, but this is a controversial point. If religious utterances, such as “God exists,” are treated as gestures of a certain kind then this seems not to be treating them as literal statements. Many religious believers, including Wittgensteinian ones, would object strongly to this. There is room, though, for a good deal of sophisticated disagreement about what it means to take a statement literally. For instance, Charles Taylor’s view, roughly, is that the real is whatever will not go away. If we cannot reduce talk about God to anything else, or replace it, or prove it false, then perhaps God is as real as anything else.
Wittgenstein’s view of what philosophy is, or should be, changed little over his life. In the Tractatus he says at 4.111 that “philosophy is not one of the natural sciences,” and at 4.112 “Philosophy aims at the logical clarification of thoughts.” Philosophy is not descriptive but elucidatory. Its aim is to clear up muddle and confusion. It follows that philosophers should not concern themselves so much with what is actual, keeping up with the latest popularizations of science, say, which Wittgenstein despised. The philosopher’s proper concern is with what is possible, or rather with what is conceivable. This depends on our concepts and the ways they fit together as seen in language. What is conceivable and what is not, what makes sense and what does not, depends on the rules of language, of grammar.
In Philosophical Investigations Sect. 90 Wittgenstein says:
Our investigation is a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language.
The similarities between the sentences “I’ll keep it in mind” and “I’ll keep it in this box,” for instance, (along with many others) can lead one to think of the mind as a thing something like a box with contents of its own. The nature of this box and its mental contents can then seem very mysterious. Wittgenstein suggests that one way, at least, to deal with such mysteries is to recall the different things one says about minds, memories, thoughts and so on, in a variety of contexts.
What one says, or what people in general say, can change. Ways of life and uses of language change, so meanings change, but not utterly and instantaneously. Things shift and evolve, but rarely if ever so drastically that we lose all grip on meaning. So there is no timeless essence of at least some and perhaps all concepts, but we still understand one another well enough most of the time.
When nonsense is spoken or written, or when something just seems fishy, we can sniff it out. The road out of confusion can be a long and difficult one, hence the need for constant attention to detail and particular examples rather than generalizations, which tend to be vague and therefore potentially misleading. The slower the route, the surer the safety at the end of it. That is why Wittgenstein said that in philosophy the winner is the one who finishes last. But we cannot escape language or the confusions to which it gives rise, except by dying. In the meantime, Wittgenstein offers four main methods to avoid philosophical confusion, as described by Norman Malcolm: describing circumstances in which a seemingly problematic expression might actually be used in everyday life, comparing our use of words with imaginary language games, imagining fictitious natural history, and explaining psychologically the temptation to use a certain expression inappropriately.
The complex, intertwined relationship between a language and the form of life that goes with it means that problems arising from language cannot just be set aside–they infect our lives, making us live in confusion. We might find our way back to the right path, but there is no guarantee that we will never again stray. In this sense there can be no progress in philosophy.
In 1931 Wittgenstein described his task thus:
Language sets everyone the same traps; it is an immense network of easily accessible wrong turnings. And so we watch one man after another walking down the same paths and we know in advance where he will branch off, where walk straight on without noticing the side turning, etc. etc. What I have to do then is erect signposts at all the junctions where there are wrong turnings so as to help people past the danger points.
But such signposts are all that philosophy can offer and there is no certainty that they will be noticed or followed correctly. And we should remember that a signpost belongs in the context of a particular problem area. It might be no help at all elsewhere, and should not be treated as dogma. So philosophy offers no truths, no theories, nothing exciting, but mainly reminders of what we all know. This is not a glamorous role, but it is difficult and important. It requires an almost infinite capacity for taking pains (which is one definition of genius) and could have enormous implications for anyone who is drawn to philosophical contemplation or who is misled by bad philosophical theories. This applies not only to professional philosophers but to any people who stray into philosophical confusion, perhaps not even realizing that their problems are philosophical and not, say, scientific.
Sect. 43 of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations says that: “For a large class of cases–though not for all–in which we employ the word “meaning” it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.”
It is quite clear that here Wittgenstein is not offering the general theory that “meaning is use,” as he is sometimes interpreted as doing. The main rival views that Wittgenstein warns against are that the meaning of a word is some object that it names–in which case the meaning of a word could be destroyed, stolen or locked away, which is nonsense–and that the meaning of a word is some psychological feeling–in which case each user of a word could mean something different by it, having a different feeling, and communication would be difficult if not impossible.
Knowing the meaning of a word can involve knowing many things: to what objects the word refers (if any), whether it is slang or not, what part of speech it is, whether it carries overtones, and if so what kind they are, and so on. To know all this, or to know enough to get by, is to know the use. And generally knowing the use means knowing the meaning. Philosophical questions about consciousness, for example, then, should be responded to by looking at the various uses we make of the word “consciousness.” Scientific investigations into the brain are not directly relevant to this inquiry (although they might be indirectly relevant if scientific discoveries led us to change our use of such words). The meaning of any word is a matter of what we do with our language, not something hidden inside anyone’s mind or brain. This is not an attack on neuroscience. It is merely distinguishing philosophy (which is properly concerned with linguistic or conceptual analysis) from science (which is concerned with discovering facts).
One exception to the meaning-is-use rule of thumb is given in Philosophical Investigations Sect.561, where Wittgenstein says that “the word “is” is used with two different meanings (as the copula and as the sign of equality)” but that its meaning is not its use. That is to say, “is” has not one complex use (including both “Water is clear” and “Water is H2O”) and therefore one complex meaning, but two quite distinct uses and meanings. It is an accident that the same word has these two uses. It is not an accident that we use the word “car” to refer to both Fords and Hondas. But what is accidental and what is essential to a concept depends on us, on how we use it.
This is not completely arbitrary, however. Depending on one’s environment, one’s physical needs and desires, one’s emotions, one’s sensory capacities, and so on, different concepts will be more natural or useful to one. This is why “forms of life” are so important to Wittgenstein. What matters to you depends on how you live (and vice versa), and this shapes your experience. So if a lion could speak, Wittgenstein says, we would not be able to understand it. We might realize that “roar” meant zebra, or that “roar, roar” meant lame zebra, but we would not understand lion ethics, politics, aesthetic taste, religion, humor and such like, if lions have these things. We could not honestly say “I know what you mean” to a lion. Understanding another involves empathy, which requires the kind of similarity that we just do not have with lions, and that many people do not have with other human beings.
When a person says something what he or she means depends not only on what is said but also on the context in which it is said. Importance, point, meaning are given by the surroundings. Words, gestures, expressions come alive, as it were, only within a language game, a culture, a form of life. If a picture, say, means something then it means so to somebody. Its meaning is not an objective property of the picture in the way that its size and shape are. The same goes of any mental picture. Hence Wittgenstein’s remark that “If God had looked into our minds he would not have been able to see there whom we were speaking of.” Any internal image would need interpretation. If I interpret my thought as one of Hitler and God sees it as Charlie Chaplin, who is right? Which of the two famous contemporaries of Wittgenstein’s I mean shows itself in the way I behave, the things I do and say. It is in this that the use, the meaning, of my thought or mental picture lies. “The arrow points only in the application that a living being makes of it.”
Without sharing certain attitudes towards the things around us, without sharing a sense of relevance and responding in similar ways, communication would be impossible. It is important, for instance, that nearly all of us agree nearly all the time on what colors things are. Such agreement is part of our concept of color, Wittgenstein suggests. Regularity of the use of such concepts and agreement in their application is part of language, not a logically necessary precondition of it. We cannot separate the life in which there is such agreement from our concept of color. Imagine a different form or way of life and you imagine a different language with different concepts, different rules and a different logic.
This raises the question of the relation between language and forms or ways of life. For instance, could just one person have a language of his or her own? To imagine an individual solitary from birth is scarcely to imagine a form of life at all, but more like just imagining a life- form. Moreover, language involves rules establishing certain linguistic practices. Rules of grammar express the fact that it is our practice to say this (e.g. “half past twelve”) and not that (e.g. “half to one”). Agreement is essential to such practices. Could a solitary individual, then, engage in any practice, including linguistic ones? With whom could he or she agree? This is a controversial issue in the interpretation of Wittgenstein. Gordon Baker and P.M.S. Hacker hold that such a solitary man could speak his own language, follow his own rules, and so on, agreeing, over time, with himself in his judgements and behavior. Orthodoxy is against this interpretation, however.
Norman Malcolm has written that “If you conceive of an individual who has been in solitude his whole life long, then you have cut away the background of instruction, correction, acceptance–in short, the circumstances in which a rule is given, enforced, and followed.” Mere regularity of behavior does not constitute following rules, whether they be rules of grammar or any other kind. A car that never starts in cold weather does not follow the rule “Don’t start when it’s cold,” nor does a songbird follow a rule in singing the same song every day. Whether a solitary-from-birth individual would ever do anything that we would properly call following a rule is at least highly doubtful. How could he or she give himself or herself a rule to follow without language? And how could he or she get a language? Inventing one would involve inventing meaning, as Rush Rhees has argued, and this sounds incoherent. (The most famous debate about this was between Rhees and A.J. Ayer. Unfortunately for Wittgenstein, Ayer is generally considered to have won.) Alternatively, perhaps the Crusoe-like figure just does behave, sound, etc. just like a native speaker of, say, English. But this is to imagine either a freakish automaton, not a human being, or else a miracle. In the case of a miracle, Wittgenstein says, it is significant that we imagine not just the pseudo- Crusoe but also God. In the case of the automatic speaker, we might adopt what Daniel Dennett calls an “intentional stance” towards him, calling what he does “speaking English,” but he is obviously not doing what the rest of us English-speakers–who learned the language, rather than being born speaking it, and who influence and are influenced by others in our use of the language–do.
The debate about solitary individuals is sometimes referred to as the debate about “private language.” Wittgenstein uses this expression in another context, however, to name a language that refers to private sensations. Such a private language by definition cannot be understood by anyone other than its user (who alone knows the sensations to which it refers). Wittgenstein invites us to imagine a man who decides to write ‘S’ in his diary whenever he has a certain sensation. This sensation has no natural expression, and ‘S’ cannot be defined in words. The only judge of whether ‘S’ is used correctly is the inventor of ‘S’. The only criterion of correctness is whether a sensation feels the same to him or her. There are no criteria for its being the same other than its seeming the same. So he writes ‘S’ when he feels like it. He might as well be doodling. The so-called ‘private language’ is no language at all. The point of this is not to show that a private language is impossible but to show that certain things one might want to say about language are ultimately incoherent. If we really try to picture a world of private objects (sensations) and inner acts of meaning and so on, we see that what we picture is either regular public language or incomprehensible behavior (the man might as well quack as say or write ‘S’).
This does not, as has been alleged, make Wittgenstein a behaviorist. He does not deny the existence of sensations or experiences. Pains, tickles, itches, etc. are all part of human life, of course. At Philosophical Investigations Sect. 293 Wittgenstein says that “if we construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of ‘object and designation’ the object drops out of consideration as irrelevant.” This suggests not that pains and so on are irrelevant but that we should not construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of ‘object and designation’. If we want to understand a concept like pain we should not think of a pain as a private object referred to somehow by the public word “pain.” A pain is not “a something,” just as love, democracy and strength are not things, but it is no more “a nothing” than they are either (see Philosophical Investigations Sect. 304). Saying this is hardly satisfactory, but there is no simple answer to the question “What is pain?” Wittgenstein offers not an answer but a kind of philosophical ‘therapy’ intended to clear away what can seem so obscure. To judge the value of this therapy, the reader will just have to read Wittgenstein’s work for herself.
The best known work on Wittgenstein’s writings on this whole topic is Saul A. Kripke’s Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Kripke is struck by the idea that anything might count as continuing a series or following a rule in the same way. It all depends on how the rule or series is interpreted. And any rule for interpretation will itself be subject to a variety of interpretations, and so on. What counts as following a rule correctly, then, is not determined somehow by the rule itself but by what the relevant linguistic community accepts as following the rule. So whether two plus two equals four depends not on some abstract, extra-human rule of addition, but on what we, and especially the people we appoint as experts, accept. Truth conditions are replaced by assertability conditions. To put it crudely, what counts is not what is true or right (in some sense independent of the community of language users), but what you can get away with or get others to accept.
Kripke’s theory is clear and ingenious, and owes a lot to Wittgenstein, but is doubtful as an interpretation of Wittgenstein. Kripke himself presents the argument not as Wittgenstein’s, nor as his own, but as “Wittgenstein’s argument as it struck Kripke” (Kripke p.5). That the argument is not Wittgenstein’s is suggested by the fact that it is a theory, and Wittgenstein rejected philosophical theories, and by the fact that the argument relies heavily on the first sentence of Philosophical Investigations Sect. 201: “This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule.” For Kripke’s theory as a reading of Wittgenstein, it is not good that the very next paragraph begins, “It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here…” Still, it is no easy matter to see just where Wittgenstein does diverge from the hybrid person often referred to as ‘Kripkenstein’. The key perhaps lies later in the same paragraph, where Wittgenstein writes that “there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation“. Many scholars, notably Baker and Hacker, have gone to great lengths to explain why Kripke is mistaken. Since Kripke is so much easier to understand, one of the best ways into Wittgenstein’s philosophy is to study Kripke and his Wittgensteinian critics. At the very least, Kripke introduces his readers well to issues that were of great concern to Wittgenstein and shows their importance.
Wittgenstein’s place in the debate about philosophical Realism and Anti-Realism is an interesting one. His emphasis on language and human behavior, practices, etc. makes him a prime candidate for Anti-Realism in many people’s eyes. He has even been accused of linguistic idealism, the idea that language is the ultimate reality. The laws of physics, say, would by this theory just be laws of language, the rules of the language game of physics. Anti-Realist scepticism of this kind has proved quite popular in the philosophy of science and in theology, as well as more generally in metaphysics and ethics.
On the other hand, there is a school of Wittgensteinian Realism, which is less well known. Wittgenstein’s views on religion, for instance, are often compared with those of Simone Weil, who was a Platonist of sorts. Sabina Lovibond argues for a kind of Wittgensteinian Realism in ethics in her Realism and Imagination in Ethics and the influence of Wittgenstein is clear in Raimond Gaita’s Good and Evil: An Absolute Conception. However, one should not go too far with the idea of Wittgensteinian Realism. Lovibond, for instance, equates objectivity with intersubjectivity (universal agreement), so her Realism is of a controversial kind.
Both Realism and Anti-Realism, though, are theories, or schools of theories, and Wittgenstein explicitly rejects the advocacy of theories in philosophy. This does not prove that he practiced what he preached, but it should give us pause. It is also worth noting that supporters of Wittgenstein often claim that he was neither a Realist nor an Anti-Realist, at least with regard to metaphysics. There is something straightforwardly unWittgensteinian about the Realist’s belief that language/thought can be compared with reality and found to ‘agree’ with it. The Anti-Realist says that we could not get outside our thought or language (or form of life or language games) to compare the two. But Wittgenstein was concerned not with what we can or cannot do, but with what makes sense. If metaphysical Realism is incoherent then so is its opposite. The nonsensical utterance “laubgefraub” is not to be contradicted by saying, “No, it is not the case that laubgefraub,” or “Laubgefraub is a logical impossibility.” If Realism is truly incoherent, as Wittgenstein would say, then so is Anti-Realism.
Wittgenstein’s last writings were on the subject of certainty. He wrote in response to G.E. Moore’s attack on scepticism about the external world. Moore had held up one hand, said “Here is one hand,” then held up his other hand and said “and here is another.” His point was that things outside the mind really do exist, we know they do, and that no grounds for scepticism could be strong enough to undermine this commonsense knowledge.
Wittgenstein did not defend scepticism, but questioned Moore’s claim to know that he had two hands. Such ‘knowledge’ is not something that one is ever taught, or finds out, or proves. It is more like a background against which we come to know other things. Wittgenstein compares this background to the bed of a river. This river bed provides the support, the context, in which claims to know various things have meaning. The bed itself is not something we can know or doubt. In normal circumstances no sane person doubts how many hands he or she has. But unusual circumstances can occur and what was part of the river bed can shift and become part of the river. I might, for instance, wake up dazed after a terrible accident and wonder whether my hands, which I cannot feel, are still there or not. This is quite different, though, from Descartes’s pretended doubt as to whether he has a body at all. Such radical doubt is really not doubt at all, from Wittgenstein’s point of view. And so it cannot be dispelled by a proof that the body exists, as Moore tried to do.
Wittgenstein is generally considered to have changed his thinking considerably over his philosophical career. His early work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus with its picture theory of language and mysticism, according to this view. Then there came a transitional middle period when he first returned to philosophical work after realizing that he had not solved all the problems of philosophy. This period led to his mature, later period which gave us the Philosophical Investigations and On Certainty.
There certainly are marked changes in Wittgenstein’s work, but the differences between his early and late work can be exaggerated. Two central discontinuities in his work are these: whereas the Tractatus is concerned with the general form of the proposition, the general nature of metaphysics, and so on, in his later work Wittgenstein is very critical of “the craving for generality”; and, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein speaks of the central problems of philosophy, whereas the later work treats no problems as central. Another obvious difference is in Wittgenstein’s style. The Tractatus is a carefully constructed set of short propositions. The Investigations, though also consisting of numbered sections, is longer, less clearly organized and more rambling, at least in appearance. This reflects Wittgenstein’s rejection of the idea that there are just a few central problems in philosophy, and his insistence on paying attention to particular cases, going over the rough ground.
On the other hand, the Tractatus itself says that its propositions are nonsense and thus, in a sense (not easy to understand), rejects itself. The fact that the later work also criticizes the Tractatus is not, therefore, proof of discontinuity in Wittgenstein’s work. The main change may have been one of method and style. Problems are investigated one at a time, although many overlap. There is not a full-frontal assault on the problem or problems of philosophy. Otherwise, the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations attack much the same problems; they just do so in different ways.
Wittgenstein’s place in the history of philosophy is a peculiar one. His philosophical education was unconventional (going from engineering to working first-hand with one of the greatest philosophers of his day in Bertrand Russell) and he seems never to have felt the need to go back and make a thorough study of the history of philosophy. He was interested in Plato, admired Leibniz, but was most influenced by the work of Schopenhauer, Russell and Frege.
From Schopenhauer (perhaps) Wittgenstein got his interest in solipsism and in the ethical nature of the relation between the will and the world. Schopenhauer’s saying that “The world is my idea,” (from The World as Will and Idea) is echoed in such remarks as “The world is my world” (from Tractatus 5.62). What Wittgenstein means here, where he also says that what the solipsist means is quite correct, but that it cannot be said, is obscure and controversial. Some have taken him to mean that solipsism is true but for some reason cannot be expressed. H.O. Mounce, in his valuable Wittgenstein’s Tractatus: An Introduction, says that this interpretation is surely wrong. Mounce’s view is that Wittgenstein holds solipsism itself to be a confusion, but one that sometimes arises when one tries to express the fact that “I have a point of view on the world which is without neighbours.” (Mounce p.91) Wittgenstein was not a solipsist but he remained interested in solipsism and related problems of scepticism throughout his life.
Frege was a mathematician as well as a logician. He was interested in questions of truth and falsehood, sense and reference (a distinction he made famous) and in the relation between objects and concepts, propositions and thoughts. But his interest was in logic and mathematics exclusively, not in psychology or ethics. His great contribution to logic was to introduce various mathematical elements into formal logic, including quantification, functions, arguments (in the mathematical sense of something substituted for a variable in a function) and the value of a function. In logic this value, according to Frege, is always either the True or the False, hence the notion of truth-value. Both Frege and Russell wanted to show that mathematics is an extension of logic. Undoubtedly both men influenced Wittgenstein enormously, especially since he worked first-hand with Russell. Some measure of their importance to him can be seen in the preface to the Tractatus, where Wittgenstein says that he is “indebted to Frege’s great works and to the writings of my friend Mr Bertrand Russell for much of the stimulation of my thoughts.” For some insight into whether Frege or Russell had the greater influence one can consider whether one would rather be recognized for his or her great works or for simply being a friend.
In turn Wittgenstein influenced twentieth century philosophy enormously. The Vienna Circle logical positivists were greatly impressed by what they found in the Tractatus, especially the idea that logic and mathematics are analytic, the verifiability principle and the idea that philosophy is an activity aimed at clarification, not the discovery of facts. Wittgenstein, though, said that it was what is not in the Tractatus that matters most.
The other group of philosophers most obviously indebted to Wittgenstein is the ordinary language or Oxford school of thought. These thinkers were more interested in Wittgenstein’s later work and its attention to grammar.
Wittgenstein is thus a doubly key figure in the development and history of analytic philosophy, but he has become rather unfashionable because of his anti-theoretical, anti-scientism stance, because of the difficulty of his work, and perhaps also because he has been little understood. Similarities between Wittgenstein’s work and that of Derrida are now generating interest among continental philosophers, and Wittgenstein may yet prove to be a driving force behind the emerging post-analytic school of philosophy.
A full bibliographical guide to works by and on Wittgenstein would fill a whole book, namely Wittgenstein: A Bibliographical Guide by Guido Frongia and Brian McGuinness (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1990). Obviously this is already out of date. Instead of a complete guide, therefore, what follows is a list of some of Wittgenstein’s main works, some of the best secondary material on his work, and a few other works chosen for their accessibility and entertainment value, for want of a better expression.
A good rule of thumb for picking secondary material on Wittgenstein is to trust Wittgenstein’s own judgement. He chose G.E.M. Anscombe, Rush Rhees and G.H. von Wright to understand and deal with his unpublished writings after his death. Anything by one of these people should be fairly reliable. More contentiously, I would say that the best people writing on Wittgenstein today are James Conant and Cora Diamond. Other books referred to in the text above or of special note are these:
Duncan J. Richter
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.
Last updated: August 30, 2004 | Originally published: