Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Chauncey Wright (1830—1875)

Chauncey_WrightChauncey Wright, an American mathematician, philosopher, and intellectual catalyst of the Septum and the Metaphysical club at Cambridge, was a great influence on Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, Oliver Wendell Holmes, and Nicholas St. John Green. Unfortunately, Wright’s untimely death at the age of forty-five severed his growing influence on the direction of early-classical American philosophy, just when his intellectual powers were reaching their peek. Apart from some recent studies on his work, spearheaded by the eminent Wright scholar Edward H. Madden, his keen perspectives have been overlooked by both classical and contemporary American philosophers. As a thinker of the transition from early to classical American philosophy, Wright’s work captures the best of Scottish realism, English empiricism, and early science studies, especially in mathematics, physics, biology, meteorology, psychology, jurisprudence, and pedagogy, combining to establish his influence as a well-rounded, critic of system building, metaphysics, theological influence, and the imprecise use of language. His critical empiricism positioned him against any fusion of teleology in philosophy and science. He was one of the first supporters and careful readers of the work of Charles Darwin in the States, winning praise from Darwin for his clear minded approach and style, especially in his work on evolutionary psychology. Wright’s letters are the clearest testaments to his dynamic and personable style. They are exemplary of his patience and depth of cultural preparedness and prime examples of what he must have been like as a Socratic dialogue partner and “intellectual boxing master,” as C.S. Peirce stated. The collected reviews and essays by Wright demonstrate his range and precision of argument, though many reviews and scientific essays still remain uncollected. As his friend John Fiske wrote, “to have known such a man is an experience one cannot forget or outlive, and to have him pass away, leaving so scanty a record of what he had it in him to utter, is nothing less than a public calamity.”

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
    1. Letters
  2. The Language and Philosophy of Science
    1. Mathematics and Adequate Nomenclature
    2. Cosmology as “Cosmic Weather”
    3. Evolution as Theory of Natural Selection
  3. Theory of Knowledge
  4. History of Philosophy
  5. Pedagogy and the Philosophy of Education
  6. Recollections, Influence, and Critical Reception
  7. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Work

Chauncey Wright, mathematician, philosopher, was born at Northamptom, Massachusetts, September 20, 1830. He entered Harvard College in 1848, where he graduated twenty-seventh in a class of eighty-eight in 1852. From 1852 to 1870 Wright was employed as a computing machine for the American Ephemeris and Nautical Almanac at Cambridge, turning series of numbers into logarithms and vice versa, computing charts (ephemerids) for navigation based on the positions of the fixed stars, moon, sun and other planets. Wright taught natural philosophy at the Agassiz School for Girls from 1859 to 1860. He was elected a fellow of the American Academy of Arts and Science in 1860. In January 1870 he was offered a lecture series on psychology at Harvard College as part of the new post-graduate courses. These lectures were based on and developed from what was found in the work of the Scottish philosopher Alexander Bain (1818-1903). The lecture series, begun by Harvard’s former president Thomas Hill, had been revitalized by the then president C.W. Eliot, who also secured lectures from R.W. Emerson, W.D. Howells, F. Bôcher, C.S. Peirce, O. W. Holmes Jr., and J.Fiske. In 1874 and 1875 Wright also lectured in theoretical physics. This was the extent of Wright’s college teaching experience, and though not successful in a classroom setting, his reflections on education and pedagogy were inspiring to his friend, fellow classmate, and Dean of Harvard College, Prof. E. W. Gurney. Gurney describes how “[Wright had] some ten clever sophomores in the course; but his heavy artillery was mostly directed over their heads. They complained much to me (as Dean) of their inability to follow him; but Chauncey, with the best intentions, found it almost impossible to accommodate his pace to their short stride. His examination-papers, by the way, in this course, I remember as models of what such papers should be. Chauncey had as sound views on the subject of education, as fresh and original, and as little biased by his own peculiar training and deficiencies of sympathy, as those of anybody I ever listened to, but he has no adaptability in practice.” (Letters 212-213).

Wright’s pedagogical talents were better seen in his being a private tutor, philosophical mentor, and intellectual catalyst of both the “Cambridge Septum Club” and the “Metaphysical Club” in Cambridge. It was through the discussions and papers presented at these gatherings that Wright came to be known and respected as the “intellectual boxing master” to Charles Sanders Peirce, William James and Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. Also present at these gatherings were Nicholas St. John Green (1830-1876), Joseph Warner, Frank E. Abbot, and John Fiske. The scientist-philosophers of The Metaphysical Club were nearly outnumbered by members who were lawyers (Fisch 1942; Wiener 1948). Wright died in Cambridge, Massachusetts on September 12, 1875.

Wright published fifty-six articles between 1865 and 1875, the last published posthumously in 1876 in the American Naturalist. These ranged from book notices and reviews to longer technical philosophical and scientific essays. Except for his presentations to the Septum Club, and the Metaphysical Club, all lost to us except in short citations and titles mentioned in his letters, these articles are what remain of his work. He published in The Atlantic Monthly, The Mathematical Monthly, The North American Review, The Nation, Memoirs of the Academy of Arts and Sciences, Proceedings of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, and the American Naturalist. Eighteen of his longer articles were collected and published in 1877 by his friend Charles Eliot Norton under the title Philosophical Discussions. There exists one generously detailed review, though anonymous, of this text from The Nation, dated May 17, 1877, vol. 24, n. 620, pp. 294-296. In it we find written how “[Wright’s works] form the most important contributions which now chiefly engage the attention of the students of philosophy,” and further, how “it was only Mr. Wright’s neglect to preserve his thoughts in writing that prevented him”, citing John Fiske “from taking rank among the foremost philosophers of the nineteenth century.” In a letter of recommendation that William James wrote on Peirce’s behalf to Prof. Gilman of Chicago, dated November 25, 1875, he stated, “I don’t think it extravagant praise to say that of late years there has been no intellect in Cambridge of such general powers and originality as [Peirce], unless one should except the late Chauncey Wright, and effectively, Peirce will always rank higher than Wright” (James, Correspondence, Vol. 4).

a. Letters

Chauncey Wright maintained a lively and inspiring correspondence throughout his life. It is from these letters that we may approach his conversational genius. Thanks to his friend from childhood James Bradley Thayer, these were collected and privately printed in 1878.

Wright’s letters act as a primer, glossary, and journal to connect and clarify his published philosophical perspectives, while revealing the life and dialogue of one of the great pioneers in the history of early classical American philosophy of science, metaphysics, ethics and pedagogy. Although Wright mentioned that “letter-writing [was] still odious to [him]”, just two months before his death, he added, “I think it is, but so that the good of it, the Promethean endurance and philanthropy of it, is set off on high artistic principles against its evils, the vexatious stupidities of Cadmean invention” (Letters 344). It is through these letters, crafted to a high artistic principle that a study on Chauncey Wright begins in earnest, followed by his collected works in the volume entitled Philosophical Discussions (1877). This would, in the words of his friend William James (1842-1910), allow us to see “his tireless amiability, his beautiful modesty, his affectionate nature and freedom from egotism [and] his childlike simplicity in worldly affairs” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 4).

2. The Language and Philosophy of Science

For Wright, the philosophy of science as a general theory of the universe was not a main concern. He was actually a critic of such formulations and systems, a critic of anything that began to resemble metaphysical web-spinning, as seen in the works of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903). For Wright, science, or “true science”, does not base itself on any “principle of Authority” which would include principles which are linguistically construed to substitute for dogma and superstition. Science should not be a substitute system for the lost innocence of theological speculations, nor be tainted by a teleological nature. Wright believed “true science deals with nothing but questions of facts [which] if possible, shall not be determined beforehand [nor by] how we ought to feel about the facts … nor by moral biases” (Letters 113). As part of this position he was interested and critically tuned to the issues of “motives” that generated theories. As he wrote to F.E. Abbot, “no real fate or necessity is indeed manifested anywhere in the universe, only a phenomenal regularity” (Letters 111). Many years later, in 1932, Justice Oliver W. Holmes (1841-1935) recalls this point, stating Wright “taught me when young that I must not say necessary about the universe, that we don’t know whether anything is necessary or not. So I describe myself as a bettabilitarian. I believe we can bet on the behavior of the universe in its contact with us.” Much of Wright’s position and amicable critique of the theories of science (or attempts at being “scientific”) can be seen in his letters to F.E. Abbot (1836-1903), Mrs. Lesley and Miss Grace Norton, followed by the longer more technical articles collected in Philosophical Discussions, most notably “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer”, “Evolution by Natural Selection”, “Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, “The Conflict of Studies”, and “A Fragment on Cause and Effect”. Many of Wright’s as-of-yet uncollected review articles also contain important statements regarding his critique of, and position on the philosophy of science. The study of these articles should clarify Wright’s non-partisan view of the use of science, his accommodation of what today we would call “complexity”, his care for precision in the use of terms and definitions employed in experimental methods, and his caution against the metaphysical adaptation of science that haunted many fanciful theories of the time. Wright was cautious in focusing on what he saw as the “two uses of language – the social and the meditative, or mnemonic”. Only in their strict exchange and study would a clear language for science become possible (“Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, in Philosophical Discussions 255). For Wright, without the developed power of primary perception and attention, the meditative use of language breeds nothing but trite metaphysical glossaries, a type of false memory (projected recollections), and ultimately vague and dogmatic principles product of a faulty, unchecked use of terms and definitions. Wright sought “scientific distinctness” over “moral connotations” (Letters 112). As he wrote to Miss Grace Norton (July 29, 1874), “we suffer from a mental indigestion. We have not solved the ambiguity of words” (Letters 275). Here, as the preeminent Wright scholar E. H. Madden stated, “the concept of substance [which Wright takes to task] arises from misleading metaphors in the syntax of language [and] is not unlike modern neo-Wittgensteinian analysis” (“Wright, James, and Radical Empiricism,” The Journal of Philosophy, LI, 1954, 871). The influence in the philosophy of language is due to in part to Nicholas St. John Green, a legal scholar, and in how Green believed that “a real definition is an analysis”. This was written during Green’s involvement with the Metaphysical Club.For Wright. Language is not, nor should be used as a “lying device”, which is a “false instinct in a rational being”, a drive to return to pre-linguistic “animal oblivion” which can be dressed up in the disdain for the science and clarity of terms as seen in the works of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), and especially in those of the Rev. James Martineau (1805-1900). Wright called this type of philosophizing “poetry under the form of science, of which Hegelianism is the most notable modern epic” (Letters 179).

A compelling reflection on the question and power of language is seen in Wright’s letter to Charles Darwin (1809-1882), dated August 29, 1872 (Letters 240-246). With a clear use of terms and a sustained use of the nature of inference, Wright believed that we could extend, check, and use our knowledge of the study of nature as tools and extensions of careful perceptions. For Wright theoretical concepts should not be used as static summaries of truth, but as ever-active non-generalized “finders”. “Finders” are the use we make of working hypotheses through testable consequences open to future experiences. “Finders” are not hardened metaphysical concepts. They are speculative tools that may arise from experience, intuitions, dreams and imagination. For Wright the language and philosophy of science must be passed through the “tools of sensible experience”, not be concerned with “ontological pedigree or a priori character of a theory”, and above all search for the driving motives of research outside fear, respect and aspiration (Philosophical Discussions 47, 49).

For such an amiable and humble individual, Wright was a very tough-minded theorist. He cautions us to realize that the positivists stage of the Theological, Metaphysical and Scientific co-exist at every level and attempt of humankind’s quest for knowledge, as well as between rival hypotheses that seek to grasp culture and nature. Wright saw the space for a true scientific attitude based upon the methods of observation and the testing of rules of investigation, not in an endless cycle of collecting hypotheses for and against said methods, rules and facts. Wright clearly followed Bacon’s lead in severing “physical science from scholastic philosophy …” (Philosophical Discussions 375). In his words, “the conscious purpose of arriving at general facts and at an adequate statement of them in language, or of bringing particular facts under explicit general ones, determines for any knowledge a scientific character” (Philosophical Discussions 205). This character must always be what Wright called “useful knowledge”, and further, “with connection in phenomena which are susceptible of demonstration by inductive observation, and independent of diversities or resemblances in their hidden nature, or of any question about their metaphysical derivation, or dependence” (Philosophical Discussions 408).

From these considerations many twentieth-century commentators, with the exception of E.H. Madden, have marked Wright as a pragmatist, or proto-pragmatist. This is not precise, since for Wright, basic empirical propositions are not open to the idea of working hypothesis at the level of matter-of-fact experience common sense beliefs, nor are long-run results safe from teleological underpinnings. Further, these basic propositions are not prone to being tested by, nor serve as, criteria of meaning. Wright avoided offering a meaning of truth, and did not generalize on the nature of thinking (Letters 325).

Wright’s prefiguring of what later came to be known in 1897 as Jamesian pragmatism and Peirce’s more trenchant “pragmaticism,” can be best understood if one relates Wright to his legal minded friends and fellow members of the Metaphysical Club. This vigor of thought and stimulus to study was carried into and from the conversations at the Metaphysical Club due to the presence of the lawyers in the group: Holmes, St. John Green, Warner and Fiske. It was especially with Nicholas St. John Green, who also taught at Harvard Law School (1870-1873), and was an instructor in philosophy, that the shared use of Alexander Bain’s and J.S. Mill’s texts would have prompted conversation on the applicability of facts, actions and rights. This direction of thought is present in Green’s article “Proximate and Remote Causes”, from the American Law Review of 1870. With Green and Holmes, Wright also shared a closer bond of the care for precision in the use of language, and in the words of Green, “a frequent cause of perplexity in law is the loose way in which legal terms are used, the same term being used to express different things” (Green, Essays and Notes on the Law of Torts and Crime, p. 146). A similar position on this precision in the use of language can be seen between Oliver Wendell Holmes and Wright and in how Holmes saw law as a study of “prediction, the prediction of the incidence of the public force through the instrumentality of the courts” (Holmes, Collected Legal Papers, 167). This was Holmes’ position from as early as 1871. Soon after that C.S. Peirce gave a talk at the Metaphysical Club, (November 1872) where he wished to pool the many conversations and ideas. Six year later, and two years after Wright’s death, Peirce published two versions of this talk as the articles, “The Fixation of Belief”, and “How to Make Our Ideas Clear.”

a. Mathematics and Adequate Nomenclature

Wright published ten articles in the field of mathematics. According to his friend and fellow mathematician Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914), Wright was a “thorough mathematician” (Ryan 2000: 188). This was indeed high praise coming from C.S. Peirce who was the son of Prof. Benjamin Peirce (1809-1880), the great American mathematician of the nineteenth century and teacher of Wright at Harvard between 1848 and 1852. Prof. Benjamin Peirce also publicly praised Wright at one of his lectures, and the modest student never appeared in class after that lecture (Letters 122). There is no doubt that Wright was influence by Prof. Peirce’s view of mathematics as the supreme science, a science that, in Peirce’s words “draws necessary conclusions.” Wright even defended Benjamin Peirce in an article left unsigned in The Nation, entitled “Mathematics in Court” (September 19, 1867).

Wright’s talent for mathematics was seen early on in his years at the High School and Select High School in Northampton, MA, and at Harvard College, where he took the elective in mathematics in his junior year. His essay on “Ancient Geometry” was mentioned in the 1852 Commencement Program. Wright continually strove for the precision of terms and form which he found so clearly present in mathematics. In a letter dated October 1864, (most likely to F.E. Abbot) he stated that “mathematician are the most exacting of purists, since, having none but perfectly adequate nomenclature, they are intolerant of, and, as one may confess, also insensible to any thought not set forth in exact form.” In Wright’s substantial review article entitled “The Conflict of Studies” (Philosophical Discussions 267-295), one may explore Wright’s perspective on the use and abuse of mathematics and its teaching. We find how Wright championed the imaginative use of memory, a training that would loosen it from the shackles of projected route memorization. Wright’s coupling of mathematics and pedagogical techniques with the recreational are telling. It is here that his influence on friends must have been most powerful, because he believed that play is a useful character or drive that overcomes the repetitive and droll “irksome exercises”. An example of this exchange exists in a letter written by C.S. Peirce to Wright dated September 2, 1865 found at the American Philosophical Society in Philadelphia, PA. Peirce’s letters explains three card tricks, fully described and then explained by mathematical calculus. This, one quickly realizes is how mathematical genius is seen at play, and how such exuberance was transformed into high-level critique and discussion. It is unfortunate that Wright’s response is lost to us.

The earliest of the mathematical works of Wright is on “The Prismoidal Formula” (The Mathematical Monthly, October, 1858). In April 1859 he published the article “The Most Thorough Uniform Distribution of Points About an Axis”, a study of the form of distributions found in the arrangement of leaves around their stem (Phyllotaxis). In October of 1871, in Memoirs of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, Wright published a more complete study of this problem entitled “The Uses and Origin of the Arrangement of Leaves in Plants”. Posthumously, and due to the influence of Prof. Asa Gray (a former professor of his of natural history at Harvard College) Wright’s study “A Popular Explanation (for those who understand Botany) of the Mathematical Nature of Phyllotaxis” was published in the American Naturalist (June 1876). Mention of these studies, as well as a wonderful summary for those who are not very familiar with botany or mathematics, are included in a letter dated August 1, 1871 to Charles Darwin, who expressed much interest in Wright’s studies on phyllotaxis (Letters 232-233). In June of the same year, he wrote an article on “The Economy and Symmetry of the Honey-Bee’s cells” for The Mathematical Monthly where he analyses the geometrical properties of the hive-cell, which as excavation and structures share the angles of the plane of 120 degrees, or four-thirds of a right angle to any other. These aforementioned articles conclude Wright’s contributions to The Mathematical Monthly.

In April 1864, Wright reviewed Prof. Chauvenet’s text “A Manual of Spherical and Practical Astronomy” for the North American Review, which he praises as a welcomed text for students in astronomical observation and calculation, replete with a history of the science, adding also praise for Chauvenet’s work on Spherical trigonometry, the problem of Eclipses, Occultations, and the numerical method of dealing with the values of observed quantities. Wright was always conscious of how his desire for precise terms and definitions became strained when, as a mathematician, he found himself out of his element (Letters 67). He left us a remarkable statement on this danger, from a letter to Miss Grace Norton dated January 1874, which is worth quoting in full. “There is ease and ease – two kinds – in understanding [with the degree of precision which analytic habits of thought demand]. Mathematics is easy in one way, – cannot be misunderstood, except by gross carelessness; is no more vague than a boulder; is either out of, or in, the mind entirely. To make progress among a heap of boulders is, you know, far from easy, in one way; but it is easier than walking on water, or than clearing the rough ground by flight. It is easy to dream of making such a flight, and to have every thing else in our dream as rational as real things; and it is easy to be actually carried on the made ways of familiar phraseology over difficulties which we are interested in only as a picturesque under-view, but which do not tempt us to explore them with the chemist’s reagents, the mineralogist’s tests, or the geologist’s hammer” (Letters 254). In this short statement we may gauge Chauncey Wright’s philosophical position, and his main line of critique against metaphysics, theology, and fanciful system building, which strove as was previously mentioned, to “turn[ ] history into mythology, and science into mythic cosmology” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 61).

b. Cosmology as “Cosmic Weather”

Wright’s interest and writings on cosmology are an excellent example of his approach to the problems of philosophical speculation and scientific research. The tension between these areas of study is nowhere clearer than in these writings. From these meditations, Wright coined the metaphor “cosmic weather”, a most apt term to reveal the continual presence of irregularities as product of the causal complexity, mixture of law and accident in the continual production of natural and physical causes unhinged from a teleological framework and continually prone to what he called “counter-movements” – or the action and counter-action and cycles of convertible and reversible mechanical energy. For Wright, “the physical laws of nature are … the only real type of the general order in the universe … showing at every turn the ultimate play of action and counter-action in the balanced forces from which they spring” (Letters 177). These reflections are also revealed in Wright’s conceptual patience and theoretical doubts on issues seemingly complex, for instance, the nature of volitional determinations and human actions which he believed were also product of the law of causation, but more embroiled with metaphors of “good” and “evil,” which raise the level of ambiguity by the increased reliance on metaphorical characters. For Wright “it is easy to be actually carried on the made ways of familiar phraseology over difficulties which we are interested in only as a picturesque under-view, but which do not tempt us to explore them with the chemist’s reagents, the mineralogist’s tests, or the geologist’s hammer” (Letters 254). Wright uses the difficulty of predicting the weather to focus the problem that “we do not hope to predict the weather with certainty, though this is probably a much simpler problem [than those of ethics, metaphysics, and theology]” (Letters 74). For Wright, phenomena, from the simplest organism to the grander phenomena of the universe, find observational repose in the complex connections of the law of evolution (non-teleologically construed), freed from the metaphorical disputes of faith, morality, and metaphysics. For a view of Wright’s position on this, and on the principle of “counter-movements” his article “A Physical Theory of the Universe” in Philosophical Discussions, serves as a prime example. Wright’s position is further clarified in his article “The Genesis of Species”, where he writes, “the very hope of experimental philosophy, its expectation of constructing the science into a true philosophy of nature, is based on the induction, or, if you please, the a priori presumption, that physical causation is universal; that the constitution of nature is written in its actual manifestations, and needs only to be deciphered by experimental and inductive research; that it is not a latent invisible writing, to be brought out by the magic of mental anticipation or metaphysical meditation” (Philosophical Discussions 131). Wright’s use of “weather” was picked up by William James in The Will to Believe (1896), for which his friend C.A. Strong wrote on November 12, 1905, “if external happenings are weather, then internal happenings … are so too, and they maintain themselves not primarily because they are true but because they are useful” (James, Correspondence, 2003: 11).

Contained in Philosophical Discussions there are three major reflections on the issue of cosmology and a true philosophy of nature, “A Physical Theory of the Universe” (July 1864), “Speculative Dynamics” (June 1875), and “A Fragment on Cause and Effect” (1873). In Wright’s uncollected articles, one may also profit from reading “The Winds and the Weather” (The Nation, January 1858), “Ennis on the Origin of the Stars” (The Nation, March, 1867), “The Correlation and Conservation of Gravitation and Heat, and the some of the effect of these Forces on the Solar System” (North American Review, July 1867), and “The Positive Philosophy” (North American Review, January 1868).

From Wright’s earliest piece, “The Winds and the Weather” (1858), an essay-review of three texts, he states that “the study of climates is … the first step towards the solution of the problem of the weather”, yet, he adds “the weather makes the most reckless excursions from its averages…” Weather is nothing but the “perturbations of climate” where one must track the periodic and prevailing winds, a first feature of regularity noticed by Halley as trade-winds, and product of the “unequal distribution of the sun’s heat in different latitudes”. Where Wright’s forward looking view of cosmology enters his review-essay is when he notes the “disturbing [second-order] accidents”, namely, “effects of the distributions themselves upon the action of the disturbing agencies.” As part of the idea of “counter-movements”, Wright believes that “some of the outward changes of nature are regular and periodic, while others without law or method, are apparently adapted by their diversity to draw out the unlimited capacities and varieties of life … as organic nature approaches a regulated confusion, the more it tends to bring forth that perfect order, of which fragments appear in the incomplete system of actual organic life.” In a similar vein, Wright saw the vast expanse of the nebulae and stars, in the “operations of secondary causes” that works with, yet as a check on, the simplistic theory of spiritualistic cosmic evolution most always prefaced by the ever deceptive yet charming metaphor: “In the beginning….”

In “Ennis on the Origin of the Stars” (The Nation, March 1867), Wright questions the facile understanding of the “law of motion” and the misstep of writers in seeking the origin of such laws from the nebular hypothesis and the interaction of its parts; a fault, he believes, of the author’s failure to employ previous accomplishments in the history of science. This is a similar criticism he leveled against Ethan Chapin’s “The Correlation and Conservation of Gravitation and Heat” (North American Review, 1867). This reveals Wright’s belief in the “guidance of results already reached”, which would eliminate the many false moves in “retracing our steps, and remodeling our fundamental ideas”. Upon the path of results already reached, Wright would add that “no one is bound to maintain any hypotheses to the exclusion of any other, until it is proved to be true”, and as part of his principle of “counter-movements” adds that “enlightened faith … does not demand as the condition of assent the force of irresistible demonstration, nor does it deceive itself with fallacious arguments” (“The Positive Philosophy” in North American Review, January 1868). In Wright’s review of Fendler’s “The Mechanism of the Universe and its Primary Effort-exerting Powers” (The Nation, June 1875), we find a more sustained criticism of the abuse of nomenclatures when mathematical definitions are allowed to slide into speculative metaphysics. These processes, as Wright mentions in “A Fragment on Cause and Effect” (1873) are always “causes [as] a continuation of conditions, or a concurrence of things, relations and events.” Throughout his writings on cosmology, Wright maintained a healthy tension with his non-developmental, ateleological view of “counter-movements”. It was no doubt a source of conceptual worry for the builders of philosophical systems of the time, H. Spencer, J. McCosh, F. Bowen, F.E. Abbot, J. Fiske, and C.S. Peirce.

c. Evolution as Theory of Natural Selection

Of all the articles of Chauncey Wright we find the most sustained flow in his reflections on the structure of evolutionary thought, which he saw and defended as Darwin’s theory of natural selection, a theory stripped of any a priori grounds or teleological ends, and as an on-going cumulative use of experiment, observation and argument.

The essay articles that cover Wright’s reflection on evolutionary theory are “Limits of Natural Selection”, “The Genesis of Species”, “Evolution by Natural Selection”, and “Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, all of which are collected in the volume Philosophical Discussions. An earlier article entitled “Natural Theology as a Positive Science” sets the stage for understanding Wright’s elimination of all religious dogmatism from the work of science, especially the latter’s misuse of final causes, ends, and intelligent design, which amount to the “theologian’s perversion of language.” “Evolution by Natural Selection” was a critique of the English Jesuit Naturalist George Mivart (1827-1900), which Wright had sent to Darwin on June 21, 1871, and which Darwin mentions and praises in The Descent of Man, stating that “nothing can be clearer than the way in which you discuss the permanence and fixity of species” (Letters 230-231). The article “Genesis of Species” was so admired by Darwin that he took it upon himself to publish it in England. Darwin wrote, “Will you provisionally give me permission to reprint your article as a pamphlet?” In a following letter Darwin added “I have been looking over your review again; and it seems to me and others so excellent that, if I receive your permission, with a title, I will republish it, notwithstanding that I am afraid pamphlets on literary or scientific subjects never will sell in England” (Letters 231). Together with these studies, Wright also provided us with two brief book notices, one entitled, “Books Relating to the Theory of Evolution” (The Nation, February, 1875), which serves as a primer to the literature surrounding the “unsurpassable quality” of Darwin’s 1872 edition of The Origin of Species. In the words of Wright’s friend James Bradley Thayer, “Darwin was a thinker who fairly drew from [Wright] an unbounded homage; and this lasted till his death; I never heard him speak of any one with such ardor of praise” (Letters 30). Wright met Charles Darwin in London on September 5, 1872 (Letters 246-247), and exchanged many letters with Darwin, the most revealing written on August 29, 1872, September 3, 1874, and February 24, 1875 (Letters 240-246, 304-318, 331-338).

3. Theory of Knowledge

None of Wright’s essays or reviews contains a full account of his theory of knowledge (epistemology). Wright did not generalize on the nature of thinking or on cosmology as generalized evolution. One can see his theory of knowledge as weighing in on the side of an empirical view, one that must be tested towards more precise types of verification, and at all costs avoiding any metaphysical trapping of “origins”. In combining his letters and the mention of the problems of knowledge throughout his published articles, one may gain a picture of his leaning towards empirical verification, that is, where beliefs are continually tested by shared concrete experiences. A primer to Wright’s view of the problems of knowledge and its shifts from ancient to modern science is seen in the first eleven pages of his 1865 article “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” (Philosophical Discussions 43-96). While verification is essential to scientific method, Wright believed that “there is still room for debate as to what constitutes verification in the various departments of philosophical inquiry” (Philosophical Discussions 45). Even as an empiricist, from but not blindly wedded to, the tradition of David Hume, Wright would not settle for an undisputed base of knowledge, but was more convinced that, in shared common experience (working hypotheses), and the study of how other individual perspectives interact, one would be allowed more profitable hypotheses. On this issue of hypotheses one must carefully follow what Wright says in reference to Darwin, that is, that he was “no more a maker of hypotheses than Newton was”, and that hypotheses have “no place in experimental philosophy” (Philosophical Discussions 136). For Wright, hypotheses are “trial questions … interrogations of nature; they are scaffolding which must be taken down as they are succeeded by the tests, the verifications of observation and experiment” (Philosophical Discussions 384).

A fairly detailed view of Wright’s position on the theory of knowledge is seen in his letter to F.E. Abbot, dated Oct 28, 1867 (Letters 123-135), where Wright argues that an “impression is cognized only when brought into consciousness”, and sees consciousness as a process of accumulated, shifting, and comparative laws. In “Limits of Natural Selection” (October, 1870), Wright states, “Matter and mind co-exist. There are no scientific principles by which either can be determined to be the cause of the other.” Consciousness is co-operative memory (or trained imagination), which interacts with the senses and works its laws as “grounds of expectation” (Letters 131). This allows Wright to circumvent both the closed question of the finality of knowledge, and the specter of relativism. While he believed in grounds, he was opposed to asserting and defending them dogmatically. Two important articles that touch on this through the mention of various theories are Wright’s “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” and “McCosh on Tyndall” in Philosophical Discussions 43-96 and 375-384. Wright also focuses on the “form of truth” (Letters 300), where accurate statements lead us to shared and testable accounts of knowledge. Wright mentions Socrates’ attitude, that “there is no merit in any really known truth, however sacred to any one, greater than clearness and adequacy of expression” (Letters 300), for “I wonder whether you get any adequate idea from [an] inadequate sentence” (Letters 270).

Another telling letter on issue and upshots of theories of knowledge is Wright’s letter to Miss Grace Norton dated August 12, 1874. There he writes, “… the human heart is a gallery of the future, illuminated by the light of its instincts and experience reflected from pictures and images of the future and the universal. As the repository and agency of all rationally conceived ends, it is the only rational final cause to itself, however serviceable it may be incidentally to other forms of life or living beings. The uses of other forms of life to the human are not final causes, though the uses of any forms of life to the universe would properly be final, if it were true that the universe is served by them in any other way than to make it up, or be among the threads that are woven in its endless combinations – its formal rather than its final causes” (Letters 292). Along with this telling vision, Wright also warns that “to demand the submission of the intellect to the mystery of the simplest and most elementary relation of cause and effect in phenomena, or the restraint of its inquisitiveness on reaching an ultimate law of nature, is asking too much, in that it is a superfluous demand”, and adds that “explanation cannot go, and does not rationally seek to go, beyond such facts [the connection of elements in phenomena] …” (“The Evolution of Self-Consciousness” in Philosophical Discussions 247).

“The Evolution of Self-Consciousness” (April, 1873) was Wright’s most accomplished study, and one personally prompted by Darwin, and the question of the links and differences in animal instinct and human intelligence. Wright called this field of study “pyschozoology”, where he set out to show how there was “no act of self-consciousness, however elementary [that] may have realized before man’s first self-conscious act in the animal world …” (Philosophical Discussions 200). In this study Wright was clearly opposed to any mysticism in theory or religious application, seeing how it leads to vagueness, and teleological assumptions. He instead focused on the difference in degree between the stimulus and use of signs in physical and phenomenal experience, a direct application of Darwin’s stimulus-response conception. Wright saw the desire to communicate in both animal and humans; though by degree, the animal’s activity grasps the “signs” without knowledge of the sign as a sign, thus relying on “outward attention” as the main support of its common-sense nature. Humans form “reflective attention”, that is, signs that are recognized and related to what they signify, both in past use and as projected future use. This is possible when signs are recognized and manipulated through memory able to distinguish between outward and inward signs, thus as “representative imaginations of objects and their relations [kinds]” (Philosophical Discussions 208). It is through this double attentiveness that the “germ of the distinctive human form of self-consciousness” was planted (Philosophical Discussions 210).

4. History of Philosophy

Wright was by no means a historian of philosophy in the tradition of those influenced and trained in Germany, as seen years later in the Harvard professor Josiah Royce (1855-1916). However, as a catalyst for the “Cambridge Septum Club” and the “Metaphysical Club” there were ample occasions throughout the meetings to mention figures and theories that pertained to the history of philosophy. As early as 1857, C. S. Peirce recalls how he would debate philosophy almost daily with Wright, and most regularly on the work of Mill (Menand 2001, 221, 477n.42). From what we have in Wright’s letters, figures from the history of philosophy were mostly focused upon a desire to point out, question, or resolve a conceptual problem or misgiving, rather than spin a narrative of historical schools and conceptual debts. As a case in point, and to show how Wright maintained a similar position throughout the areas of intellectual interest, it is worth pointing out that Wright, using a term in David Masson’s “Recent British Philosophy”, which he reviewed in 1866, believed that “the ontological passion” is “very nearly akin to what, in the modern sense of the word, is expressed by ‘dogmatism’ [which when coupled with] his [Masson’s] scheme of classification … discovers the relations between opinions of [the] philosophers [in question]” (Philosophical Discussions 344). It is clear that Wright would see any history of philosophy as a drive to classify prone to a motive of justification. The unfolding of the history of philosophy in itself was not a necessary technique for Wright, mostly due to his non-academic employment, yet also by the nature of his wide scope of interests, of which philosophy proper was but another tool and set of problems. One possible reason for this critical position and avoidance of such “histories” is that, for him, “the mythic instinct slips into the place of chronicles at every opportunity,” so much so that he claims, “all history is written on dramatic principle” (Philosophical Discussions 70-71). Wright was not prone to enchantment over explanation, and thus not susceptible to a philosophy of history as an inexorable philosophical progression. Yet, through his letters and the Philosophical Discussions, and in uncollected publications, he did mention many figures that make up a telling configuration of philosophers. As part of the configuration we find a portion of a reading list and Wright’s favorites beginning with Emerson, who he also heard lecture on the poets at Harvard, then Sir Henry Maine’s Ancient Law, Bacon’s Novum Organum, Whewell’s History of the Inductive Science, List’s, Political Economy, Hamilton’s Lectures on Metaphysics, Lectures on Logic, and Philosophy of the Conditioned, Mill’s Logic, and Examination of Sir William Hamilton, Alexander Bain, (on which Wright based his lectures on psychology at Harvard) and of course Darwin’s Origin of Species and the Descent of Man. Among the philosophers mentioned in his Letters, not including Wright’s contemporaries, one finds, Bacon, Bain, Fichte, Hamilton, Hegel, Kant, J.S. Mill, Occam, Plato, and by far with the most mentions, Socrates. With the addition of Aristotle, Locke, and Zeno, the mentions are fairly similar in his Philosophical Discussions.

The following citation could be read as Wright’s caution in approaching the history of philosophy as a meta-narrative, and as a critique of the undertow of a Hegelian brand of mythic history. “All cosmological speculations are strictly teleological. We never can comprehend the whole of a concrete series of events. What arrests our attention in it is what constitutes the parts of an order either real or dramatic, or are determined by interests which are spontaneous in human life. Our speculations about what we have not really observed, to which we supply order and most of the facts, are necessarily determined by some principle of order in our minds. Now the most general principle which we can have is this: that the concrete series shall be an intelligible series in its entirety; thus alone can it interest and attract our thoughts and arouse rational curiosity” (“The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” in Philosophical Discussions 71). Wright’s sharpest critique of the metaphysical pretensions of order can be seen in his essay “German Darwinism” (September 9, 1875 in Philosophical Discussions 398-405).

It is likely that the most discussed critical position of Wright on the history of philosophy would have been a study not only of concepts and methods, but also motives. “The questions of philosophy proper are human desires and fears and aspirations – human emotions – taking an intellectual form” (Philosophical Discussions 50). This reveals Wright’s more sociological and psychological interest in the conditions for the pursuit of certain theories and methods over others. “We do not”, he wrote, “inquire what course has led to successful answers in science, but what motives have prompted the pertinent questions” (Philosophical Discussions 48). Further he adds, “philosophy proper should be classed with the Religions and with the Fine Arts, and estimated rather by the dignity of its motives, and the value it directs us to, than by the value of its own attainment” (Philosophical Discussions 52). This is again clearly stated in Wright’s review-essay “Lewes’s Problems of Life and Mind” in Philosophical Discussions, pages 366-368, where he mentions issues with “method” from Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Bacon, Leibniz, Locke and Newton. What Wright shows us is that “those who take the most active part in the philosophical discussions of their day have enlisted early in life in one or the other of two great schools [Platonic or Aristotelian], inspired predominately by one or the other of two distinct sets of philosophical motives, which we may characterize briefly as motives of defense in questioned sentiments, and motives of scientific or utilitarian inquisitiveness” (Philosophical Discussions 367).

For Wright, a history of philosophy would be an exacting engagement in discussion seeking to make the study of other minds part of the particular goods of human life, and as such would need to study how “philosophical stand-points” are but a parallax of previous doctrines (see Letters 124). Such a discursive history of philosophy (perhaps even “dialogical”) would require a “clearness and adequacy of expression” (Letters 300).

5. Pedagogy and the Philosophy of Education

Chauncey Wright’s “The Conflict of Studies” is a long review article of Isaac Todhunter’s (1820-1884) The Conflict of Studies, and Other Essays on Subjects connected with Education (1873). Todhunter was a mathematical lecturer at St. John’s College, Cambridge. The review appeared in The North American Review, July 1875, and is collected in Philosophical Discussions. Wright’s review was part of the ongoing debate on American educational reform during the mid-nineteenth century. Wright was privy to some of these changes, first as a student of Harvard College from 1848 to 1852, and then in 1870-1871 and 1874-1875 of Harvard’s early experiments in invited professional lecturers, under its then president and advocate of the Elective system, Charles W. Eliot.

Isaac Todhunter’s essay “The Conflict of Studies” notes the call for “useful knowledge” current in higher education, framing it as diffusion for and among the “humbler classes” (Todhunter 1873, 1). Todhunter, a conservative in the eyes of Wright, belongs to the line of Oxford and Cambridge masters who looked upon the growth of useful knowledge and the experimental sciences as inferior to what was taught at the ‘wealthy college or university”. Todhunter saw this difference reflected in the structures and rigor of competitive examinations, remarking that “we must not expect boys from the humbler classes to excel in the more expensive luxuries of education” (Todhunter, 1873, 21). Together with his marginalizing of the new experimental sciences, his dislike of the inclusion of any practical focus on the success or influence of mathematical study in practical life, and his disbelief in the powers of natural history or natural philosophy in raising a student’s attention to related pursuits, Todhunter stands in an opposite camp from Chauncey Wright. Wright responds to this with an insightful characterization of a letter of a young Union officer. “Command of the lower memory is doubtless improved by the mastery of some one or two subjects; the more special and narrow they are, the better, perhaps, for saving time, and even if they do not belong to what is commonly accounted essential to a liberal education. […] A young officer of the Union army in our late struggle, in a letter written on the evening before the battle in which his life was sacrificed, attributed his previous successes, and rapid promotion to responsible duties, to a six months’ study of turtles at the Zoölogical Museum of Harvard University, which was undertaken merely from the youthful instinct of mastery, or appreciation of the value of discipline, and was interrupted by the breaking out of the war and the young man’s enlistment in the service. Perhaps, however, the independence of character which determined this choice of means for discipline was the real source of the success which the youth too modestly attributed to the discipline itself” (Philosophical Discussions, 294).

The conflict of studies can be understood not only as the contrast between old curriculum and the more modern elective studies, but more profoundly as the conflict of the employment of types of memory, which Wright is clear in pointing out. “Writing and artificial memory are often, I think, in the way of a better sort of memory which holds what is worth retaining by more real ties” (Letters 201).

Wright unfolds what he considers to be aspects of a liberal education, and how a philosophy of mathematics can be re-employed towards a reform of general liberal education. The areas would be: i) the perfection of symbolism, ii) the use (applicability) of notation (symbols) to other sciences, iii) usefulness as the “objective ulterior value” of modern mathematics, and iv) where “useful knowledge” is that which is free from the mimicry of facts (cramming) and instead, focused on the moment of ‘selection” or the “utility of non-utilitarian motives.” For Wright, always cautious of his definitions, cramming is “a given amount of studious attention, either rational or merely mnemonic, given to a subject exclusively and for a short time” and this “gives the mind a different and a less persistent or valuable hold on the subject than the same amount and kind of attention spread over a longer time and interrupted by other pursuits” (Philosophical Discussions, 288). The focus on “selection” spread over a longer period of time, combines Wright’s evolutionary studies with the vision of keeping philosophy alive as the love of study, and as a “guest” not an “inmate” of the corporate spirit of the university or the “pittances of schoolmasters.”

Wright suggests a healthy dose of repetition, understood as a second mode of memory which would entail: i) the repeated acts of direct attention, (as repetition and intensity of impressions), ii) the repeated recalls or recollection, which has the variety of association, and repeated acts of voluntary recollection, or the active exercise of memory. This last mode needs “interposed intervals and diversions of attention,” which strengthen the more far-reaching constructive associations of thought (essential/rational), allowing the growth of reason. Such an understanding of the growth of reason and the re-tooling of the use of memory is directed against Todhunter’s idea that students should not question the statements of tutors, which for Wright entails shying away from appreciating evidence and learning from how experiments might also fail. Todhunter’s antiseptic vision of examinable experiments, where failure is seen as a static component, runs counter to the manifold processes involved in the love of study championed by Wright. “I venture to volunteer the advice that, in teaching philosophy, it is well to call in question and refute every thing you can, with the aid of collateral reading, in order that the young [students] may never forget that they are not studying their catechisms,–not merely studying to acquire true and settled doctrines, but mainly to strengthen their understanding, to learn to think, and doubt, and inquire with equanimity” (Letters 120).

Wright champions the “far-reaching constructive association of thought” (retentive memory), not as Todhunter believed, simple memory as exercised and practiced in the repetition of examinations as “temporary associations” (or recollection). The lower order of simple memory is not conducive to what Wright saw as the complex ends of study, that is, the “satisfaction of thought itself as a mental exercise.” What Wright grants as a testing of memory in conjunction with intuition, is raised by his example of the child’s memory of stories via contiguity and consecutiveness (retentiveness), versus a student’s memory for isolated facts in comparative mythology (recollection).

Wright suggests that the student be freed from the mere exercise of “simple memory” (or simple faith) by working with the “direct effect of illustrations … to aid the understanding and imagination,” which as part of the “ladder of the intellect” is made of the movement and counter-movements from the general to the particular, the abstract to the concrete and “to return again” (which includes the particular seen in the stages of experimental practices). “Only enough of discipline in the actual practice of experiments to enable the student to study his text-book intelligibly seems to us desirable for the purposes of a general education” (Philosophical Discussions 276).

Part of what this experimental practice entails is the use of what is recreational, that is, the fondness or love of study construed by a play-impulse. This is firmly opposed in Todhunter’s position. Instead, Wright (in Darwinian fashion) sees the aspect of the recreational (or re-associative) as what will have “habit to secure attractiveness,” where play is a useful character, or drive that overcomes the repetitive and droll “irksome exercises” (Letters 201).

The larger arena of debate, as Wright saw it, centered on the University’s duties to “mankind or to their several nations,” which entailed five related problems. The first is whether higher general university education should take on the form of a simple curriculum, or a variety of courses. The next problem must address the question of what constitutes a liberal education, which in turn will prompt the problem of the ends of a liberal education, which will lead to the fourth problem, that is, how these ends are to translate through a general education or specific studies found in lower school training. Wright’s perspective becomes clear in questioning the rather simplistic use of “ends,” geared, as he saw it, more by the “customs and institutions” within which the writers of reform (and the conservatives) are caught. Wright suggests that the problem of manifold ends requires a “scientific analysis of the experience,” which is a very sociological view. “It is quite true that the great qualities required and developed in philosophers by original research in experimental sciences are not product, or even approached, by the repetition of their experiments … Nevertheless we attribute much more value to a first-hand acquaintance with experimental processes than [Todhunter] appears to do. [Even] failures have in them an important general lesson, especially useful in correcting impressions and mental habits formed by too exclusive attention to abstract studies …” (Philosophical Discussions 274).

6. Recollections, Influence, and Critical Reception

A notice in the Hampshire Gazette, dated October 5, 1875, honoring Wright, mentions how his teacher at the Select High School from Northampton, Prof. David S. Sheldon “kindly and successfully suppressed [Wright’s rather deplorable early literary-poetic essays] and so it seems turned a very bad poet into a very great philosopher.” In Wright’s Letters J.B. Thayer, a classmate at Northampton High School shares what was reported in the notice, by yet another classmate, which describes how Prof. Sheldon “led all his pupils out into the fields and woods and taught them to observe the facts of nature, the life of plants and habits of birds, and insect, the movements of the heavenly bodies, the phenomena of the clouds …” Wright remembered this fondly, and in his Harvard College class-book of 1858 wrote of his inspired and zealous teacher and the specimens collected on these excursion through the wilds of Northampton. Though the collection has been lost, Wright retained the care and detail for these observations from Nature, especially seen in his letter to the daughter of Mr. Norton, Sara, dated September 1, 1875, eleven days before he died (Letters 353-354).

Wright was remembered with great affection by each of his friends, due to his good nature and talent for Socratic dialogue. Through the Letters this quality comes alive. A perceptive description of Wright’s person and style is found in John Fiske’s essay “Chauncey Wright” (Ryan 2000:3). Fiske writes, “his essays and review-article were pregnant with valuable suggestions, which he was wont to emphasize so slightly that their significance might easily pass unheeded; and such subtle suggestions made so large a part of his philosophical style that, if any of them chanced to be overlooked by the reader, the point and bearing of the entire argument was liable to be misapprehended.” Further he adds, “there was something almost touching in the endless patience with which he would strive in conversation to make abstruse matters clear to ordinary minds … [and] one of the most marked features of Mr. Wright’s style of thinking was his insuperable aversion to all forms of teleology … [and] more often he called himself a Lucretian [and] sharply attacked Anaxagoras for introducing creative design into the universe in order to bring coherence out of chaos. What need, he argued, to imagine a supernatural agency in order to get rid of primeval chaos, when we have no reason to believe that the primeval chaos ever had an existence save as a figment of the metaphysician!” In conclusion, Fiske wrote that “to have known such a man is an experience one cannot forget or outlive. To have had him pass away, leaving so scanty a record of what he had it in him to utter, is nothing less than a public calamity” (Ryan 2000:3, pp. 5-19).

William James also contributed a piece in The Nation upon Wright’s death, where he wrote that “Mr. Wright belonged to the precious band of genuine philosophers, and among them few can have been as completely disinterested as he. Add to this eminence his tireless amiability, his beautiful modesty, his affectionate nature and freedom from egotism, his childlike simplicity in worldly affairs, and we have the picture of a character of which his friends feel more than ever now the elevation and purity” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 4). Yet there was one mostly negative response to Wright from Borden Parker Bowne (1847-1910) written a few years after Wright’s death. It mostly defends his position against which Wright was critical, and seeking to place Wright in the camp of a crude empiricist. The article is of interest due to the effort to mention the history of philosophy with which Wright was engaged, and for which Prof. Bowne chides him for being anachronistic, lacking and narrow in historical study, and accuses him of being a mere critic, not a system-builder. If one adds to this Wright’s ateleological predisposition, his view of the belief in a God as confession of one’s speculative convictions and productions of education and experience, and in the possibility of irreligious morality, we gain part of the view of why his works were also difficult to place in the then budding neo-Hegelian religious system-builder of Classical American philosophy.

As the catalyst of the “Cambridge Septum Club” (1856, 1858, 1859), and especially for the “Metaphysical Club” (1872), Chauncey Wright was, as C.S. Peirce put it, the “intellectual boxing master”. As William James stated, Wright’s best work was “done in conversation; and in the acts and writing of the many friends he influenced, his spirit will, in one way or another, as the years roll on, be more operative than it ever was in direct production” (James in Ryan 2000: 1-2). As part of a splendid recollection of Wright as a modest, simple and well disposed friend, and as a “philosopher of the antique or Socratic type”, James’ tribute captures what Wright’s presence must have inspired. Where the perceptive and enthusiastic James overstated is in how Wright’s “acts and writing” would “be more operative than it ever was in direct production”. Apart from the few direct mentions in the works of William James in The Principles of Psychology (Preface), The Will to Believe, in Pragmatism, and once in his Letters, Wright was not made part of the emerging philosophical renaissance at Harvard.

There is a similarity in the immediate fate of Wright’s works, and those of C.S. Peirce, though the works and subsequent influence of Peirce in American philosophy was saved from oblivion thanks to the generosity of James and the care and philosophical and historical sensibility of Royce. The legacy of the works of Wright is owed to his friends J.B. Thayer, who collected his letters, and privately printed the volume in 1877, and his friend C. E. Norton, who collected his principle writings under the title Philosophical Discussions (1877). Yet, thirty-six review-articles remain in the journals within which Wright had published, from the years 1858 to 1876.

In a letter to William James, dated November 21, 1875, C.S. Peirce stated that “as to [Wright] being obscure and all that, he was as well known as a philosopher need desire. It is only when a philosopher has something very elementary to say that he seeks the great public or the great public him.” Peirce then adds, “I wish I was in Cambridge for one thing. I should like to have some talks about Wright and his ideas and see if we couldn’t get up a memorial for him. His memory deserves it for he did a great deal for every one of us [James, Peirce, Abbot]. Other of his friends, Gurney, Norton, Peter Lesley, Asa Gray etc., would be wanted to do the personal and other relations. But what I am thinking of [I don’t purpose anything] is to give some resume of his ideas and of the history of his thought” (James, The Correspondence of William James, Vol. 4. 1995: 523-524). These talks never happened.

While both Peirce and James acknowledged their personal debt to their “intellectual boxing master”, apart from a few mentions in their letters and in a few of James’ works, no directly cited conceptual links can be traced with scholarly confidence. While Charles Darwin was impressed by Wright’s work, and saw him as one of his clearest readers, the untimely death of Wright ended what could have been a more productive exchange. In Wright’s letters one finds that he possibly influenced Nicholas St. John Green in discussing the use of the terms “duty of belief”, (though reference to the author is not provided by Thayer). Wright believed that “duty of belief” means only those principles of conduct, and what follows from them, which recommend themselves to all rational beings or at least to all adult rational, human beings (Letters 342-343). One can imagine William James being present, and then adopting this critique years later for his text, The Will to Believe (1896). It was Nicholas St. John Green, as Max Fisch reports, that “urged the importance of applying Alexander Bain’s definition of belief as that upon which a man is prepared to act”, and continues, “from this definition, Peirce adds, pragmatism is scare more than a corollary” (Ryan 2000: 99, and 99n.28; 136). If C.S. Peirce was “disposed to think of [Bain] as the grandfather of pragmatism” (and either himself, or St. John Green as fathers), then perhaps, one may again refer to Chauncey Wright as pragmatism’s “uncle”, because Wright, more than anyone of his early fellow thinkers, worked under the guidance of the “instinctive attraction for living facts”, as Peirce once defined pragmatism (Ryan 2000: 136, 139).

7. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Wright, Chauncey, 1850-1875. Chauncey Wright Papers, American Philosophical Society.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1858. “The Winds and the Weather.” Atlantic Monthly Vol. 1 (January): pp. 272-279.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1971.Philosophical Discussions, ed. Charles Eliot Norton, (Henry Holt and Co., 1877), New York: Burt Franklin.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1971a. Letters of Chauncey Wright, ed. James Bradley Thayer, (Cambridge 1878), New York: Burt Franklin.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, Katharine, 2005. Predicting the Weather: Victorians and the Science of Meteorology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Chambliss, J.J., 1960. “Natural Selection and Utilitarian Ethics in Chauncey Wright”, American Quarterly, 12, pp. 145-152.
  • Chambliss, J.J., 1964. “Chauncey Wright’s Enduring Naturalism”, American Quarterly, 16, pp. 628-635.
  • Clendenning, John, 1985. The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, Wisconsin: The University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cohen, Felix, S. 1962. American Thought: A Critical Sketch. New York: Collier Books.
  • Croce, P. J., 1998. Science and Religion in the Era of William James: Eclipse of Certainty, 1820-1880,
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1909. Education for Efficiency and The New Definition of the Cultivated Man, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1913.The Tendency to the Concrete and Practical in Modern Education, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1924.Late Harvest: Miscellaneous Papers Written between Eighty and Ninety, Boston: The Atlantic Monthly Press.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1969.Educational Reform, New York: Arno Press.
  • Fisch, M.H., 1942. “Justice Holmes, the Prediction Theory of Law and Pragmatism”, The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 39, No. 4 (February 12), pp. 85-97.
  • Fiske, John, 1902. “Chauncey Wright” in Darwanism and Other Essays, Boston: Houghton, Mifflin andCompany.
  • Flower, Elizabeth, and Murphey, Murray, G., 1977, A History of Philosophy in America, Vol 2. New York: G.P. Putnam’s Sons.
  • Gardiner, John H., 1914. Harvard, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Giuffrida, Robert Jr., 1980. “Chauncey Wright and the Problem of Relations,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 16, No. 4 (Fall): pp. 293-308.
  • Giuffrida, Robert Jr., 1988. “The Philosophical Thought of Chauncey Wright: Edward Madden’s Contribution to Wright Scholarship,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 24, No. 1, (Winter): pp. 37-43.
  • Hawkins, Hugh, 1972. Between Harvard and America: The Educational Leadership of Charles W. Eliot, NewYork: Oxford University Press.
  • Hill, George B., 1895. Harvard College by an Oxonian, New York: Macmillan and Co.
  • Huler, Scott, 2004. Defining the Wind: The Beaufort Scale, and How a Nineteenth-Century Admiral Turned Science into Poetry, New York: Crown Publishers.
  • James. Henry, 1930. Charles W. Eliot: President of Harvard University 1869-1909, Vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • James, William, 1952. Principles of Psychology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • James, William, 1975. Pragmatism, and The Meaning of Truth, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • James, William, 1992, 1995, 1999, 2000, 2003. The Correspondence of William James, Vols. 1, 4, 7, 8, 11, Edited by Ignas K. Skrupskelis and Elizabeth M. Berkeley, Charlottesville: University of Virginia Press.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 1977. The Rise of American Philosophy: Cambridge, Massachusetts 1860-1930, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 2001. A History of Philosophy in America 1720-2000, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lowell, A. Lawrence, 1962. At War with Academic Traditions in America, Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1955. “The Cambridge Septem,” Harvard Alumni Bulletin, LVII, (January): 310-315.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1958.The Philosophical Writings of Chauncey Wright: Representative Selections, New York: The Liberal Arts Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1963.Chauncey Wright and the Foundations of Pragmatism, Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1972. “Chauncey Wright and the Concept of the Given,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 8, No. 1 (Winter): 48-52.
  • Madden, Edward H., 2000.Introduction, Influence and Legacy, Vol.3 The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, Frank X. Ryan, (ed.) London: Thoemmes Press.
  • Menand, Louis, 2001. The Metaphysical Club: A Story of Ideas in America, New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Morison, Samuel E., 1937. Three Centuries of Harvard (1636-1936), Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Perry, Ralph B., 1935. The Thought and Character of William James, Boston: Little Brown and Company.
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Author Information

Lucio Angelo Privitello
Richard Stockton College of New Jersey

Last updated: May 27, 2007 | Originally published: