The Chinese term wuxing (wu-hsing, “five processes” or “five phases”) refers to a fivefold conceptual scheme that is found throughout traditional Chinese thought. These five phases are wood (mu), fire (huo), earth (tu), metal (jin), and water (shui); they are regarded as dynamic, interdependent modes or aspects of the universe’s ongoing existence and development. Although this fivefold scheme resembles ancient Greek discourse about the four elements, these Chinese “phases” are seen as ever-changing material forces, while the Greek elements typically are regarded as unchanging building blocks of matter. Prior to the Han dynasty, wuxing functioned less as a school of thought and more as a way of describing natural processes hidden from ordinary view. During the period of the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.), wuxing thought became a distinct philosophical tradition (jia, “family” or “school”). Since that time, the wuxing system has been applied to the explanation of natural phenomena and extended to the description of aesthetic principles, historical events, political structures, and social norms, among other things. Cosmology, morality, and medicine remain the chief arenas of wuxing thought, but virtually every aspect of Chinese life has been touched by it. As such, wuxing has come to be inseparable from Chineseness itself and belongs to no single stream of classical Chinese philosophy.
When seeking to understand the wuxing system, we encounter multiple uses of this term in pre-Han and Han sources that may signal the need for more than one translation from Chinese into any differing target language. We may ask, are we speaking about five elements, five phases, five movements, five actions, or something altogether different? The truth is that, depending on the use and context, any one of these might be an appropriate translation.
It has become routine in recent decades to insist that, in its cosmological uses, wuxing should be rendered into English as “five phases” rather than “five elements”, and to make a deliberate distinction between the role of these five in Chinese cosmology and the notion of the four elements in Greek thought, according to which the Greek notions of earth, air, fire, water are generally thought to represent actual fixed material substances. Sometimes wuxing has been translated into English as “five elements”, but when we actually watch the work that xing does in the Chinese language, it is used to describe movement (e.g. walking), alteration, changing states of being, permutations or metamorphoses. To back translate, then, the Chinese conception of “element” is quite different from the Western one, in that it does not imply a fixed substantial essence that remains unchanged and constitutes the discrete difference between one object and all others. Whereas the four elements in Western Greek thought were understood as the basic building blocks of matter, the Chinese, by contrast, viewed objects as ever-changing and moving forces or energies of five sorts. These five phases work interactively and have identifiable correlations that instantiate both objects and natural processes as we know them.
Although not developed into its present form until the Han dynasty, the origins of wuxing extend far back into the earliest records of Chinese intellectual history. In the Shang dynasty (1600-1046 B.C.E.), oracle bone inscriptions (used in divination rituals to predict and discern outcomes in nature and human affairs) rely on the number five. Typically, this is the pattern of four around a center, where the four represent the cardinal directions expressed in the territories around the central area in which the ruler resides and from which he governs. But this pattern of five is not yet any comprehensive theory or cosmology, and there is no evidence of belief that some five phases or elements interpenetrate and mutually influence each other correlatively. However, there are already, in very rough form, associations of the territories with directions, colors, spirits, and proper rituals that are suggestive of the later correlational developments in Han wuxing thought. For example, in the West an ox of a certain color must be sacrificed at a specified time of a year in order to insure an auspicious future. Accordingly, even in the Shang there is fragmentary evidence that the number five is of explanatory significance, and there is some preliminary correlative association between territories, colors, rituals, and deities.
Between the Shang and Han dynasties, a number of texts were compiled that collectively shed light on the development of what became wuxing thought. Chief among these are some of the “Five Classics” alleged to have been written during the Zhou dynasty (1045-256 B.C.E.) and later enshrined as the earliest Confucian canon, although portions of some or all of these texts may well reflect the concerns and contexts of later rather than earlier periods: Shijing (Classic of Poetry), Shujing (Classic of History), Liji (Record of Ritual), Yijing (Classic of Changes), and Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals) with its commentary, Zuozhuan (Chronicles of Zuo). Despite the uncertain dating, it can be assumed that these texts contain a substantial amount of material that is traceable to the pre-Qin (pre-221 B.C.E.) period and even reaching back to Confucius’s era or before.
In Zuo Zhuan’s record on the 27th year of the reign of Duke Xiang (590-573 B.C.E.), the text says: “Heaven has produced the five elements which supply humankind’s requirements, and the people use them all. Not one of them can be dispensed with.” Although English translations of this passage usually say “five elements” and we would expect the Chinese text to say wuxing, actually the text uses wu cai (“five materials” as in “raw materials”). Accordingly, we may have here good evidence for the antiquity of this passage, because there is no reformatting of the passage to use the character xing as later scholars (who edited these texts into their final form) interested in fostering the wuxing cosmology might have been presumed to have done. The text is saying that life depends on the ability of the people to understand and use the five raw materials of reality, but it is probably not drawing any significant distinction between xing and cai.
In the 7th year of the reign of Duke Wen (626-609 B.C.E.), the text says: “Water, fire, metal, wood, earth, and grains are called the six natural resources (or treasures) (liu fu).” The character fu is used for the treasures of nature; the natural resources for life. This list of six such resources contains the wuxing as we see them in later works, but with the addition of the grains. Again, we might infer that the text may record authentically pre-Han material and it may reflect rather accurately the fact that the pattern of five as the number of elements had not yet been firmly established in the time of the Zuo Zhuan.
In its remarks on Duke Zhao, 1st year, the Zuo Zhuan says Heaven generates the five tastes (wu wei – sour, sweet, salty, bitter and acrid), five colors (wu se - green, yellow, black, red, and white), and five sounds (wu sheng – corresponding to the Western musical tones mi, so, do, re, and la). In the passage on Duke Zhao’s 25th year, tastes, colors, and sounds are a result of the wuxing. The wuxing are understood as expressions of Heaven’s patterns (jing), and the character for patterns is the same one later used for the qi (vital energy) meridian lines in the body traced by practitioners of traditional Chinese medicine, suggesting that the wuxing are to Heaven as the qi meridians are to our bodies.
The Zuo Zhuan does not provide an account of correlation and intermingling of the five elements such as we see in later works. Instead, it puts forward a teaching about five officials (wu guan) who exercise their will in order to arrange the xing into phenomenal reality. In the material on the Duke of Zhao’s 29th year, the striking question is posed, “Why are there no more dragons?” The answer provided for the absence of dragons is that each element is directed by its own official, but if the official neglects his task or the persons on earth distort or mismanage the five elements which are the patterns of earth, animals that depend on the order of these patterns will hide and stop reproducing correctly. The species will disappear. These officials are presented as spirits or deities which require veneration and offerings to be made to them. The text gives the name of each official and the element over which he has charge.
The Shujing is a collection of documentary materials related to the ancient history of China. The fragments that survive are a mixture of myth and history. The earliest five chapters reach back to the legendary sage emperors Yao and Shun (c. 2400 B.C.E.?), and the last 32 chapters cover the period of the Zhou dynasty down to Duke Mu of Qin (r. 660-621 B.C.E.). In this work, the chapter entitled Hong Fan (“Comprehensive Order” or “The Order of Everything”) provides an account of how society should follow the patterns of Earth and Heaven. The first of the nine sections of this chapter is devoted to the wuxing system, indicating that it must be understood before the remaining eight sections can be grasped. The chapter is constructed in the style of a dialogue between Wu Wang and a sage. Wu states that he knows human society and that government and relationships must follow the patterns of Heaven, but he wonders how to fully grasp these patterns. The sage tells him that whenever the wuxing are in disorder, the constant norms of Heaven will disappear and chaos will follow.
We notice now that human behavior can contribute to the harmonious operation of nature, or disrupt it causing chaos and disorder. The moral patterns for humanity and those of the natural cosmos are all interconnected and correlated. For the first time, each of the elements has its nature more fully explained: water moistens and descends (run xia); fire burns and ascends (yan shang); wood bends and straightens (qu zhi); metal yields and changes (cong ge); earth receives and gives (jia se), such as through seeds and crops. While fire and water are presented as opposites, wood and metal are not. Perhaps more interestingly, we notice the correlational mechanisms of the system becoming more obvious. The five elements are tied to the five tastes: that which moistens and descends produces saltiness; that which burns and ascends produces bitterness; that which bends and straightens produces sourness; that which yields and changes produces pungency; that which seeds and gives crops produces sweetness. The five elements are correlated to the five ways or powers of a human being: appearance, speech, sight, hearing, and thinking.
Hong Fan does not spell out how the correlations work, only that they exist. Likewise, in sections two and eight of this chapter, the five elements and the five conducts (also called wuxing) are related. The sections say that if humans do not behave in the proper manner, they throw the five elements out of harmonious operation, illness and weakness arise in the body and disorder shows up in nature and the human world of history. But the chapter does not make a direct correlation to explain how an individual element produces an action, as it does when commenting on the five tastes. Still, the obvious point of a chapter entitled “The Order of Everything” is that a ruler who is not able to order these processes will throw all things into chaos, and even the rains will not come on time.
In Liji, the number of five-set processes of arrangement and change is sixty-two. These are used as explanations for matters including not only politics, family, and medicine, but colors, seasons, plants, planets, and rituals for performing various actions. Consider that in wearing ritual vestments of green and eating from vessels of wood (not metal), the sovereign could promote the powers of spring because the associations of the wuxing with various correlates sometimes make some sense (wood, green, spring; or fire, red, summer).
Later, during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.), there is evidence of intellectual activity that explicitly concerned wuxing thought as a comprehensive system. According to the Records of the Historian by Sima Qian (145–90 B.C.E.), beginning in the reign of King Wei (358–320 B.C.E.) and continuing during the reign of King Xuan (319–309 B.C.E.), an intellectual exchange was fostered by convening scholars in the capital city of Linzi next to the Ji Gate, which gave its name to what became known as the Jixia Academy. Figures named as master teachers in this place include Zou Yan (305–240 B.C.E.), who is considered the systematizer of wuxing cosmology; Zhuang Zhou (Zhuangzi, c. 365–290 B.C.E.), an early Daoist thinker; and both Mengzi (“Mencius,” c. 372–289 B.C.E.) and Xunzi (Hsün-tzu, c. 310-220 B.C.E.), who are among the first interpreters of Confucius’s thought. If all this is taken as accurate, it is possible that the careers of Mengzi, Zhuang Zhou and Zou Yan could have overlapped at Jixia, and Xunzi might have been there at the same time as a young student before later returning as a master himself. We are likely on safe ground in concluding that wuxing thought was a subject of the exchanges and debates of figures at Jixia. There are passages even in the so-called “Inner Chapters” of the Zhuangzi which seem to have wuxing cosmological assumptions underlying them (for example, chapters 2, 6, and 7).
Xunzi is very critical of wuxing explanations and the teachers who are using “ancient lore” to “concoct their new theory” called wuxing. He calls the theory perverse and bizarre and characterizes it as obscure and impenetrable nonsense. He is particularly critical of the stream of Confucian thought, found in the tradition of Mengzi, which has appropriated these ideas but is oblivious to where it all goes wildly wrong (Xunzi 16/6/10; Ames and Hall, pp. 137-38). Xunzi is not making a distinction between wuxing as a cosmological theory and wuxing as a moral doctrine, evidence of which may be seen in the Wuxing pian (Five Modes of Proper Conduct), a text discovered in the tomb of “the tutor of the Eastern palace” at Guodian in China’s Hubei province in 1993, which dates to 300 B.C.E.. Despite Xunzi’s criticims, a wuxing system was growing and extending itself from cosmology to morality, aesthetics, medicine, and so forth.
During the Han dynasty, one of the most fundamental texts containing material on wuxing theory was the Huainanzi (The Masters of Huainan, 139 B.C.E.). This text says: “The natural qualities of Heaven and Earth do not exceed five. The sage is able to use wuxing correctly in order to govern without waste.” The Huainanzi shows the move to standardize the number five. It continues to draw out the correlations between wuxing in cosmology and morality, and it extends the medical implications of the system. Sages who know what to do with the wuxing are able to rule the country, heal patients, and manage the transformations of life and longevity. It seems that this text conflates Daoist notions of immortals (xian) with those who possess the skill necessary to master the five elements.
Han thinkers used the system to account for an ordered sequence or cycle of change. For example, in the “mutual production” (xiangsheng) series, wood produced fire, fire produced earth, earth produced metal, metal produced water, and water produced wood. In the “mutual conquest” (xiangke) series, wood conquered earth, metal conquered wood, fire conquered metal, water conquered fire, and earth conquered water. If a ruling dynasty’s emblem was water, one might anticipate it being overcome by a dynasty whose emblem was earth. This schema was appropriated as the Han was thought to rule under the red phase of fire, and their most formidable revolutionary challengers employed this ideology in constructing their movement and its symbols, such as the rebel movement known as the Yellow Turbans (184 C.E.), which attempted to exploit the ideas that red would be conquered by yellow and fire by water.
Although most of its ideas are already evident in the Huainanzi, the Chunqiu fanlu (Luxuriant Dew of the Spring and Autumn Annals) traditionally ascribed to Dong Zhongshu (179-104 B.C.E.), is a sustained effort to incorporate the wuxing system into Confucian thought, even connecting it to the Confucian five relationships of filiality. This application was continued in the work of Yang Xiong (53 B.C.E.-18 C.E.), whose text Tai Xuan (The Supreme Mystery, c. 2 B.C.E.) represents an example of Confucian syncretism and appropriation of the wuxing cosmology. In Baihu tongyi (Comprehensive Discussions in White Tiger Hall, c. 80 C.E.), the record of state-sponsored debates held in 58 C.E., the following explanation for the way a mature son should remain with his parents while a daughter should leave home is given: “The son not leaving his parents models himself on what? He models himself on fire that does not depart from wood. The daughter leaving her parents models herself on what? She models herself on water which by flowing departs from metal.”
Not all Confucian thinkers accepted the wuxing cosmology or its extended explanatory devices, however. Wang Chong (27-100 C.E.) was a critic of the theory in its broadest forms, and of the application of it in the realms of natural and physical phenomena, morality, and political history. In his Critical Essays (Lunheng), he used argument, sarcasm, and what we would call empirical evidence, to criticize the work of Dong Zhongshu and attempt to debunk the evidential basis for the wuxing system.
By the first century B.C.E., Huangdi Neijing (The Yellow Emperor’s Inner Classic), arguably the most significant of the classical Chinese documents on wuxing as related to medicine, attained its final form. It most likely developed in a lineage of teachers associated with what is now called Huang-Lao (“Yellow Emperor-Laozi”) Daoism, which also influenced portions of the Zhuangzi. The work has two parts. The first is the Suwen (Basic Questions), devoted to the wuxing foundation of Chinese medicine and the diagnostic methods for ailments, and the second is the Lingshu (Spiritual Pivots), which is largely concerned with very technical and thorough explanations of acupuncture. Lingshu 24 has the Yellow Emperor say that the qi energy meridians of the body (jing mai) are divided according to the wuxing and these lines convey energy to the five organs (wu zang) of the body. The Suwen relies largely on the “mutual conquest” series as the preferred explanatory language for medical ailments and their remedies. In thinking of the wuxing system related to the body, we must always remember that, in traditional Chinese thought, the body is a microcosm of the universe that recapitulates the patterns of the macrocosm (i.e. Heaven and Earth). A disease considered energetic or fiery could be overcome by a medicine correlated with cooling associated with water. Likewise, since wood xing suffuses throughout the spleen and also gives rise to sour flavor, then eating sour foods will increase the wood internally and strengthen the spleen. Wood is also correlated with the color blue-green, the spring season, the direction east, and the musical note jue (Western mi), and can be increased or conquered based on these correlations.
Medical understandings of wuxing have been applied to non-philosophical arenas, such as astrology. Chinese astrology relies heavily upon wuxing notions. Each astrological or zodiac sign is ruled by one or more of the five elements and its yin or yang energies. According to the lore of Chinese astrology, the signs and energies we are born under impact our entire lives and our personalities. For example, being born under the wood sign means one is influenced by yang energy. Such a person is said to be strong and self-reliant. He is associated with the East, the astrological signs of the Tiger, Rabbit, and Dragon, and the spring season; his health is governed by the condition of his liver and gallbladder; and he both favors and prospers under the colors blue and green. Similar explanations and prognostications are given for the other four of the five xing as well.
Both military and literary texts in traditional China have incorporated the wuxing system. The Liu Tao (Six Strategies, also known as Tai Gong’s Six Strategies [for conducting war]), is a well-known tactical manual of ancient China. It asserts that, by knowing the enemy’s posture with respect to wuxing, one can then, through the “mutual conquest” series, know how to select the attacking phase to defeat him. Novels such as Xiyou ji (Journey to the West, 16th century C.E.) present main characters in five-phase terms, and the structure of Hong Lou Meng (Dream of the Red Chamber, 18th century C.E.) may be described in terms of wuxing, as Andrew Plaks has shown.
Beyond the world of Chinese texts, traditional Chinese visual arts have embraced wuxing, including the style of painting known by that very name. This style is a synthesis of traditional landscape painting with wuxing cosmology. Wuxing painting has a total of five brush strokes, five movements, and five types of composition, each corresponding to the five elements. The goal of such painting is to create an image harmoniously balanced, often depicting a landscape, but even when not doing so, nevertheless playing on the connection between objects or directions and wuxing.
As wuxing thought has continued to become ever more labyrinthine, the five elements have been incorporated into many arenas of Chinese life, from the way space is arranged (fengshui) to the art of cooking (sweets, sours, bitters, etc). Having become a distinct philosophical tradition (jia, “family” or “school”) during the Han, wuxing gradually developed into a conceptual device that is used to explain not only cosmology, morality, and medicine, but virtually every aspect of Chinese life and thought. As such, wuxing has come to be inseparable from Chineseness itself and belongs to no single stream of classical Chinese philosophy.
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Last updated: March 10, 2012 | Originally published: