Xenophanes of Colophon was a traveling poet and sage with philosophical leanings who lived in ancient Greece during the sixth and the beginning of the fifth centuries BCE. There are a significant number of surviving fragments for such an early figure, and the poetic verses available to us indicate a broad range of issues. These include comments on religion, knowledge, the natural world, the proper comportment at a banquet, as well as other social teachings and commentary.
Despite his varying interests, he is most commonly remembered for his critiques of popular religion, particularly false conceptions of the divine that are a byproduct of the human propensity to anthropomorphize deities. According to Xenophanes, humans have been severely mislead by this tendency, as well as the scriptures of the day, and he seemed intent on leading his audience toward a perspective on religion that is based more on rationality and less on traditionally held beliefs. His theological contributions were not merely negative, however, for he also presented comments that support the notion of divine goodness, and many have speculated that he may have been the first monotheist, or even pantheist, in the Western intellectual tradition. The possibility that Xenophanes endorsed the perspective of divine unity led Plato and Aristotle to designate him as the founder of the Eleatic school of philosophy, and some have classified him (though probably erroneously) as having been Parmenides’ teacher.
Many of Xenophanes’ poetic lines are concerned with the physical world and the fragments show some very inventive attempts to demythologize various heavenly phenomena. An example of this is his claim that a rainbow is nothing but a cloud. He also postulated that earth and water are the fundamental “stuffs” of nature and, based in part on his observations of fossils, he held the view that our world has gone through alternating periods of extreme wetness and dryness.
Another area in which Xenophanes made some seminal comments is epistemology. In addition to endorsing a critical rationality toward religious claims, he encouraged a general humility and skepticism toward all knowledge claims and he attempted to discourage dogmatic arrogance.
Xenophanes was from a small town of Colophon in Ionia and most recent scholars place the date of his birth sometime around 570-560 BCE. He appeared to live into his nineties, thereby placing his death sometime after 478 BCE. This is indicated by the following lines from one of Xenophanes’ remaining fragments, which shows him to still be writing poetry at ninety-two years of age:
Already there are seven and sixty years
tossing about my counsel throughout the land of Greece,
and from my birth up till then there were twenty and five to add to these,
if I know how to speak truly concerning these things. (frag. 8)
He seems to have left his home at an early age and spent much of his life wandering around Greece, often reciting his poetry at the appropriate functions and gatherings.
There are 45 remaining fragments of Xenophanes’ poetry and testimonia about Xenophanes that have been collected from a wide range of sources. The fragments are in the form of poetic verse, primarily in hexameters and elegiac meter. A few ancient authors contend that Xenophanes also wrote a treatise entitled, “On Nature,” but such sources do not appear to be credible. Nonetheless, the existing fragments comprise a rather significant collection of work for an early Greek philosopher. In fact, Xenophanes is the first Pre-Socratic philosopher for whom we have a significant amount of preserved text. While this amount of material has been helpful in determining the various themes and concerns of Xenophanes, there are still wide ranging opinions on the fundamental tenets of his philosophy. “Perhaps the greatest impediment to a consistent understanding of Xenophanes’ philosophy,” states J.H. Lesher, “is the frequent disparity between the opinions he expressed in his poems and those attributed to him in the testimonia.” (7)
There is some debate as to whether Xenophanes ought to be included in the philosophical canon and it is the case that in some surveys of ancient Greek or Pre-Socratic philosophy, Xenophanes is left out altogether. Many scholars have classified him as basically a poet or a theologian, or even an irrational mystic. There are several issues working against Xenophanes in this regard. He apparently did not attract a large number of followers or disciples to his philosophy. He was not treated particularly favorably by Plato or Aristotle. Plus, given the poetical and polemical nature of the various fragments, it is also true that Xenophanes did not leave us with anything resembling a rational justification or argument for some of his claims, which is the sort of thing one would expect from a philosopher, no matter how early. Nonetheless, to disregard Xenophanes as a serious philosophical figure would be shortsighted. He did leave us with some rather seminal and interesting contributions to the history of thought. While it is true that Xenophanes may not fit into any precise mold or pattern of justification which would classify him as a philosopher of note, the man and his fragments are deserving of serious philosophical consideration.
Much like Socrates, the “gadfly of Athens,” whom he preceded by over one hundred years, one picture of Xenophanes that emerges in several of the fragments is that of social critic. Much of Xenophanes’ verse was likely intended for performance at social gatherings and functions as he “tossed about, bearing [him]self from city to city” (frag 45). In fragment 1 we find a detailed account of a feast that ends with a call to proper behavior.
And having poured a libation and prayed to be able to do
what is right—for these are obvious—
it is not wrong to drink as much as allows any but an aged man
to reach his home without a servants aid.
Praise the man who when he has taken drink brings noble deeds to light,
As memory and a striving for virtue bring to him.
This suggests that while he was welcome among circles of people who had access to the finer things in life he also felt it his duty to encourage them to comport themselves with piety and moderation. Elsewhere, we find Xenophanes implying a connection between the downfall of his hometown with her citizen’s ostentatious displays of wealth (frag 3). In another of the lengthy surviving fragments, we find a critique of cultural priorities that like minds have echoed throughout history. Here Xenophanes bemoans the rewards and reverence afforded champion athletes while the expertise of the learned and the poets goes unheeded and unappreciated.
For our expertise is better than the strength of men and horses.
But this practice makes no sense nor is it right
to prefer strength to this good expertise.
For neither if there were a good boxer among the people
nor if there were a pentathlete or wrestler
nor again if there were someone swift afoot—
which is most honoured of all men’s deeds of strength—
would for this reason a city be better governed.
Small joy would a city have from this—
If someone were to be victorious in competing for a prize on Pisa’s banks—
For these do not enrich a city’s treasure room. (frag. 2)
Xenophanes is the first Greek figure that we know of to provide a set of theological assertions and he is perhaps best remembered for his critique of Greek popular religion, specifically the tendency to anthropomorphize deities. In rather bold fashion, Xenophanes takes to task the scripture of his day for rendering the gods in such a negative and erroneous light.
Homer and Hesiod have attributed to the gods
all sorts of things which are matters of reproach and censure among men:
theft, adultery and mutual deceit. (frag. 11)
This line of criticism against the primary teachers of Greece clearly resonated with Socrates and Plato where Xenophanes’ influence can especially be seen in the Euthyphro and book two of the Republic. In another set of passages, which are probably the most commonly cited of Xenophanes’ fragments, we find a series of argumentatively styled passages against the human propensity to create gods in our own image:
But mortals suppose that gods are born,
wear their own clothes and have a voice and body. (frag. 14)
Ethiopians say that their gods are snub-nosed and black;
Thracians that theirs are blue-eyed and red-haired. (frag. 16)
But if horses or oxen or lions had hands
or could draw with their hands and accomplish such works as men,
horses would draw the figures of the gods as similar to horses, and the oxen as similar to oxen,
and they would make the bodies
of the sort which each of them had. (frag. 15)
While Xenophanes is obviously targeting our predisposition to anthropomorphize here, he is also being critical of the tendency of religiously-minded people to privilege their own belief systems over others for no sound reasons. This would have been particularly true of the Greeks of Xenophanes’ time who considered their religious views superior to those of barbarians. As Richard McKirihan notes, when held up to the critical light of reason, “Greek, ‘barbarian’, and hypothetical bovine views of the gods are put on an even footing and cancel each other out, leaving no grounds to prefer one over the others. This brings them all equally into question.” (74) This does not imply that Xenophanes considered all religious views to be equivalent, but rather it seems to indicate that he is concerned with leading his Greek audience toward a perspective on religion that is based more on rationality and less on traditionally held beliefs. So then, what would a more rational perspective on religion entail? Here Xenophanes offers up a number of theological insights, both negative and positive.
As we have seen in fragment 11, Xenophanes upheld the notion that immorality cannot be associated with a deity. But while Xenophanes is clearly against the portrayals of the Olympian gods performing illicit deeds, it is less clear as to why he would maintain such a thesis. There are two possible readings of this. One could first say that, given Xenophanes critique of anthropomorphizing that is discussed above, he believes that it would make no sense to ascribe to the gods any sort of human behaviors or characteristics, be they illicit or praiseworthy. On this reading, Xenophanes should be seen as a type of mystic. Another interpretation, which is more likely, is that Xenophanes upheld the notion of divine perfection and goodness. It is true that Xenophanes never explicitly states such a position. However, as Lesher points out, such a thesis is attributed to him by Simplicius, and the belief in the inherent goodness of the gods or god was a widely shared conviction among many Greek philosophers. (84) Furthermore, such an interpretation would square with Xenophanes’ assertion that it is “good always to hold the gods in high regard.” (frag. 1)
While it seems clear that Xenophanes advocated the moral goodness of the divine, some of his other theological assertions are more difficult to discern. There have been a rather wide range of arguments by scholars that commit Xenophanes to any number of theological positions. Some scholars have maintained that he was the first Greek philosopher to advocate monotheism while others have argued that Xenophanes was clearly supporting Olympian polytheism. Some have attributed pantheism to Xenophanes while others have maintained that he is essentially an atheist or materialist. Given such a wide discrepancy, it will perhaps be helpful to first list the fundamental fragments and then move on to the possible specifics of Xenophanes’ theology.
One god is greatest among gods and men,
Not at all like mortals in body or in thought. (frag. 23)
…whole he sees, whole he thinks, and whole he hears. (frag. 24)
…but completely without toil he shakes all things by the thought of his mind. (frag. 25)
…always he abides in the same place, not moving at all,
nor is it seemly for him to travel to different places at different times. (frag. 26)
At first glance, the opening line of fragment 23 could be read as a pronouncement of monotheism and a rejection of Greek polytheism. If so, Xenophanes would have been the first Greek thinker to espouse such a revolutionary theological perspective. While the phrasing “one god greatest among gods” [emphasis mine] would seem to contradict monotheism on the face of it, scholars from both sides of the debate recognize that this is not an endorsement of polytheism by Xenophanes. Rather it should be seen as a “polar expression,” which is a poetic device used to emphasize a point and does not imply the existence of things at either pole. Nor should the fact that Xenophanes utilizes the term “gods” throughout the available fragments be seen as an endorsement of polytheism in and of itself. It is highly likely that Xenophanes is simply utilizing the common vernacular to speak of the divine. So the question remains, was Xenophanes a monotheist?
A great number of traditional and modern sources have attributed monotheism to Xenophanes and fragments 23-26 would seem to indicate the potential merit of such an assumption. Some have gone as far as to say that not only was he the first monotheist, but he was also the first to advocate a radical form of monotheism which insists that the one god is pure spirit and is completely distinct from the world. In recent years, the staunchest advocate of the monotheistic interpretation has been Jonathan Barnes who extends Xenophanes’ rationalistic critique of religion to its natural end: “Xenophanes, I conclude, was a monotheist, as the long tradition has it; and he was an a priori monotheist; like later Christian theologians, he argued on purely logical grounds that there could not be a plurality of gods.” (92) Given such an interpretation, Barnes maintains that the enigmatic opening line of fragment 23 should be paraphrased to read, “There is one god, since (by definition) a god is greater than anything else, whether god or man.” (92) Other scholars have ascribed a softer form of monotheism to Xenophanes, maintaining that while he does not seem to completely abandon polytheism explicitly, he does so implicitly.
While the designation of Xenophanes as a monotheist is warranted in many respects, such an interpretation ultimately presumes too much. Given the fact that monotheism would have been a radical departure from traditional Greek beliefs, we would assume that Xenophanes would have taken more pains to differentiate and clarify his viewpoint. For one thing, it is highly suspicious that, while he takes Homer and Hesiod to task for their portrayal of the nature of the gods, he never bothers to comment on the number of their gods. Furthermore, a true monotheist would not likely be so cavalier about his use of the plural ‘gods’ in a polythesitic society. It is likely that later commentators and scholars have been somewhat biased in their attempts to find in Xenophanes the early articulations of a now commonly held religious perspective. Guthrie puts the matter in perspective: “…it must be understood that the question of monotheism or polytheism, which is of vital religious importance to the Christian, Jew or Muslim, never had the same prominence in the Greek mind.” (375) As such, the best summary of the complexity of the monotheistic question is presented to us by Lesher: “The fragments warrant attributing to Xenophanes the novel idea of a single god of unusual power, consciousness, and cosmic influence, but not the stronger view that beyond this one god there could be nothing else worthy of the name.” (99)
In the second line of fragment 23, Xenophanes declares that god is unlike mortals “in body and thought.” Although some of the ancient testimonia have interpreted this to mean that god lacks a body, this should not be read as an attempt by Xenophanes to put forth the claim that the divine is incorporeal, for it would be some time before the concept of an existing thing that is completely immaterial would develop. As McKirahan, notes, “the fifth-century atomists were the first presocratics clearly to conceive of an immaterial, noncorporeal existing thing, and this idea came only with difficulty.” (63) Rather than reading these lines as an expression of the incorporeal nature of the divine, these passages should be interpreted as a continuation of Xenophanes’ efforts to correct the mistaken conceptions of divine nature that have been passed on from Homer and Hesiod. In fragment 25, for example, Xenophanes introduces a god who effortlessly, “shakes all things by the thought of his mind.” Readers or hearers of this passage would immediately recognize Xenophanes’ dramatic corollary to a famous portrayal of Zeus in the Illiad who simply shakes his head to display his will and power. By contrast, a truly supreme god exerts will and power without any toil whatsoever, according to Xenophanes.
If Xenophanes cannot be read as an immaterialist then we may rightly question what sort of body “unlike mortals” can be attributed to the divine? Numerous writers, both ancient and modern, attribute to Xenophanes the viewpoint that god is spherical and identical with the universe. In Cicero’s Prior Academics, for example we find the following passage: “(Xenophanes said that) all things are one, that this is unchanging, and is god, that this never came into being and is eternal, and has a spherical shape.” (2.18) In another source, Theodoretus’ Treatment of Greek Afflictions, we find this statement: “Accordingly Xenophanes, the son of Orthomenes from Colophon, leader of the Eleatic School, said that the whole is one, spherical, and limited, not generated but eternally and totally motionless.” (4.5) More recently, Guthrie concludes after a careful analysis of recent texts that, “for Xenophanes the cosmos was a spherical body, living, conscious, and divine, the cause of its own internal movements and change. He was in the Ionian tradition.” (382)
One should not contradict such formidable scholarship lightly, but the fact of the matter is that there is no basis for the spherical/pantheistic interpretation in the fragments that are available to us. In fact, it is difficult to square the claims of pantheism with fragment 25, in which god “shakes all things by the thought of his mind;” it is perhaps even trickier to square the notion of a spherical god with another one of Xenophanes’ fragments in which he declares, “The upper limit of the earth is seen here at our feet, pushing up against the air, but that below goes on without limits” (frag. 28). Lesher, who has provided us with the most balanced and careful analysis of this question in recent years, makes a convincing case that the development of the spherical/pantheistic interpretation was “spawned in part by a confused assimilation of Xenophanes’ philosophy with that of Parmenides, misled by superficial similarities between Xenophanes’ god and Parmenides’ one ‘Being,’ and relying on an overly optimistic reading of some cryptic comments by Plato (Sophist 242c-d) and Aristotle (Metaphysics 986b10ff)” (100-101). In other words, the doxographical tradition seems to be guilty of viewing Xenophanes’ conception of the divine through a series of lenses that, when stacked upon each other, distort the original picture.
The physical theories of Xenophanes have been ignored in much of the ancient literature, due in large part to the influence of Aristotle. According to The Philosopher, Xenophanes is to be classified as a theological theorist rather than a student of nature. As the fragments indicate, however, Xenophanes was indeed quite interested in theorizing about the natural world, and while his ideas are rather rudimentary by current standards, they do show a level of sophistication and coherence not always appreciated by his successors. As Lesher indicates: “We must then recognize the distinct possibility that Aristotle failed to mention Xenophanes’ physical views not because there were none to mention but because Aristotle regarded Xenophanes as insufficiently interested and engaged in physical theorizing to warrant discussion.” (127) Another reason for the disregard is that Xenophanes did not provide the kind of teleologically based insights into the natural phenomena that successors such as Plato and Aristotle would have desired. In any case, the physical theories of Xenophanes deserve more serious attention than they have been afforded historically.
Xenophanes’ speculations on the physical world need to be understood within the context of his predecessors, the Milesian philosophers (Thales, Anaximenes, Anaximander). As the first metaphysicians, the Milesians attempted to determine the first principle or arche of reality. To briefly summarize for our purposes here, each of the Milesians postulated one primary principle (arche) as the source of everything else. For Thales, the arche was water. For Anaximenes, air was fundamental and all the other apparent “stuffs” of reality could be accounted for by a principle of condensation and rarefaction. For Anaximander, none of the traditional elements would suffice, and he identified the source of all things as a boundless or indefinite stuff termed apeiron.
Xenophanes sought to expand and improve upon the work of his predecessors, and instead of limiting his speculations to one stuff, or substance, his theory is based upon the interplay of two substances, earth and water. “All things that come into being and grow are earth and water.” (frag. 29) According to the historical sources, Xenophanes seems to have held that the opposition of wet and dry in the world is the preeminent explanatory basis for the phenomena of the natural world. In Hippolytus’ Refutation of All Heresies (1.14), for example, we are told that Xenophanes held that the history of the natural world has been a continually alternating process of extreme dryness and wetness. At the point of extreme wetness, the earth sinks completely into mud and all humans perish. Once the world begins to dry out there is a period of regeneration in which life on earth begins again. Xenophanes developed this theory based upon a wide variety of empirical evidence, particularly his examination of fossils. Again, a key source for this is Hippolytus, who discussed how Xenophanes gathered the proof for this thesis from the existence of various fossilized imprints of sea creatures as well as sea shells that are found far inland. It should be noted that what is significant about his viewpoint is not so much the conclusion at which he arrives, but rather the process he utilizes to support it. Prior thinkers had speculated on the possibility that the earth had been reduced to mud, but Xenophanes seems to have been the first to provide empirical evidence coupled with deduction to support and develop his theory. Thus, not only was Xenophanes probably “the first to draw attention to the real significance of fossils” (Kirk 177), we also find in him the beginnings of a scientific methodology.
Although we do not have much by way of direct statements from Xenophanes, there is a good deal of ancient testimonia that references his astronomical and meteorological views, particularly his emphasis on the clouds and their explanatory role for various phenomena. According to a variety of sources, Xenophanes seems to have held the view that the sun comes into being—perhaps newly each day—either by a collection of ignited clouds (according to some) or by pieces of fiery earth. Students of early Greek philosophy will recognize the similarity to Heraclitus in this theory. It is commonly accepted that Xenophanes was an influential figure in the development of Heraclitus’ ideas. As such it is somewhat difficult to determine whether Xenophanes position here is authentic, or whether the ancient sources are reading Xenophanes through Heraclitus. Nevertheless, the historical speculation seems somewhat justified, particularly given the fact that Xenophanes proposed the view that the clouds were responsible for various heavenly phenomena. A key passage in this regard is fragment 32, where Xenophanes explains a rainbow: “And she whom they call Iris, this too is by nature a cloud, purple, red and greenish-yellow to behold.” Other instances where Xenophanes provides a natural explanation for what had been considered supernatural manifestations are in reference to stars as well as the phenomenon known as St. Elmo’s Fire (or Dioscuri) which is produced by glimmering clouds.
Further evidence of Xenophanes’ demythologizing tendencies occurs in the following passage:
The sea is the source of water and of wind,
for without the great sea there would be no wind
nor streams of rivers nor rainwater from on high;
but the great sea is the begetter of clouds, winds,
and rivers. (frag. 30)
It would have been natural for someone who had lived his life around bodies of water to make several observations about streams, winds and mists. What is lacking from Xenophanes and the traditional accounts is any clear explanation for why he held these beliefs. Why, for instance, did he think that the sea produced clouds and wind? Thus, as a purely scientific account, Xenophanes’ theory is lacking. Nevertheless, the true significance of this fragment becomes evident when it is read against the backdrop of Homeric poetry. As such, the true significance lies not in what the lines attempt to explain, but rather in what they attempt to explain away. “Without explicitly announcing their banishment,” As Lesher indicates, “Xenophanes has dispatched an array of traditional sea, river, cloud, wind, and rain deities (hence Zeus himself) to the explanatory sidelines.” (137) While Xenophanes is repeating ideas that had earlier been developed by Anaximander and Anaximenes, it is significant that he is carrying forward the criticism of traditional Homeric notions, particularly lines in the Iliad, “which characterize Oceanus as the source of all water—rivers, sea, springs and wells—and they declare that the sea is the source not only of rivers but also of rain wind and clouds.” (Guthrie 391). Ironically, Xenophanes’ value free speculations on the natural world, while a goal of scientific inquiry today, guaranteed that his physical theorizing would be disregarded by Plato and Aristotle.
According to many scholars, none of what Xenophanes has said up to this point would qualify him as a philosopher in the strict sense. It is Xenophanes’ contribution to epistemology, however, that ultimately seems to have earned him a place in the philosophical canon from a traditional standpoint. We have already seen how Xenophanes applies a critical rationality to the divine claims of his contemporaries, but he also advanced a skeptical outlook toward human knowledge in general.
…and of course the clear and certain truth no man has seen
nor will there be anyone who knows about the gods and what I say about all things.
For even if, in the best case, one happened to speak just of what has been brought to pass,
still he himself would not know. But opinion is allotted to all. (frag. 34)
If these statements are to be read—per many of the later skeptics—as a blanket claim that would render all positions meaningless, then it is difficult to see how anything Xenophanes has said up to this point should be taken with any seriousness or sincerity. How could Xenophanes put forth this kind of skepticism and be assured that the poets were wrong to portray the gods the way that they have, for instance? As such, a more charitable interpretation of these lines would seem to be in order.
A better reading of Xenophanes’ skeptical statements is to see them not as an attack on the possibility of knowledge per se, but rather as a charge against arrogance and dogmatism, particularly with regard to matters that we cannot directly experience. The human realm of knowledge is limited by what can be observed. “If,” for example, “god had not made yellow honey [we] would think that figs were much sweeter.” (frag. 38) Therefore, broad based speculations on the workings of the divine and the cosmos are ultimately matters of opinion. Although some “opinions” would seem to square better with how things ought to be understood through rational thinking and our experiences of the world (keeping with Xenophanes’ earlier statements against the poets), any thoughts on such matters should be tempered by humility. Accordingly, F.R. Pickering notes, “Xenophanes is a natural epistemologist, who claims that statements concerning the non-evident realm of the divine as well as the far-reaching generalizations of natural sciences cannot be known with certainty but must remain the objects of opinion.” (233) Unfortunately, Xenophanes does not develop his critical empiricism, nor does he explain or examine how our various opinions might receive further justification. Still, just as the poet philosopher has provided us with some meaningful warnings toward our tendency to anthropomorphize our deities, the poet philosopher is also warning us against our natural human proclivity to confuse dogmatism with piety.
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Last updated: December 14, 2009 | Originally published: