Xenophon was a Greek philosopher, soldier, historian, memoirist, and the author of numerous practical treatises on subjects ranging from horsemanship to taxation. While best known in the contemporary philosophical world as the author of a series of sketches of Socrates in conversation, known by their Latin title Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology which present a set of vivid and intriguing portraits of Socrates and display some sharp contrasts to the better known portraits in the works of Xenophon’s contemporary, Plato. Xenophon’s influence in Antiquity, the Middle Ages, and in Early Modern intellectual circles was considerable; he was a pioneer in several literary genres including the first-person military memoir (Anabasis) , the biographical novel (Education of Cyrus), and the continued history (Hellenica). The range of his areas of expertise and the glancing charm of his down-to-earth writing style continue to fascinate and repay our study. For one example of his work in moral philosophy, he emphasized the importance of self-control, which comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality. This is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways. Socrates is often said by Xenophon to have exemplified it in the very highest degree. Cyrus displays it when he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; but his general Araspas stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor, and ignites a chain of events described by Xenophon that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.
Xenophon was born during the early years of the Peloponnesian War, in the outlying deme of Athens called Erchia. Located in the fertile plain known as “Mesogeia” (literally “middle earth”) and overlooked by the beautiful mountains Hymettus and Penteli, Erchia was about 20 kilometers (12 miles) from the bustling center of Athens–about a three hour walk or one hour brisk horseback ride. His father Gryllus owned and supervised an estate whose income derived chiefly from farming. Thus, Xenophon will have grown up surrounded by a combination of small hold-farming and urban influences. Coming of an age in turbulent political times, Xenophon is thought to have been in Athens and personally present at the return of Alcibiades (408), the trial of the Generals, and the overthrow of the 30 Tyrants, all signal events in the rough history of Athenian civic life.
Little else is known about Xenophon’s earliest years. From his later writings it can be safely inferred that he received a good basic education and military training as befitted a young member of the Equestrian class, that he was able to ride and hunt extensively, and that in his formative years he observed the careful work needed to keep a modest farm maintained and productive.
In 401. B.C.E at the age of 29, Xenophon was invited by his friend Proxenus to join him on a mercenary military venture to Persia, ostensibly to protect the territory of a minor satrap who was under threat. In fact, though this was not known to Xenophon or Proxenus, the campaign was rather more ambitious than that: it was a game of thrones, nothing less than an assault on the claim of the Persian king Artaxerxes II, by his brother Cyrus the Younger. The unfolding of this journey into foreign territory, with its adventures and mortal hazards, was a formative event in Xenophon’s life. In the very first engagement, Cyrus was himself killed. In a peace parley that followed, the generals of the expeditionary force were executed by treachery, leaving the army stranded, leaderless and surrounded by hostile peoples whose languages they did not speak, and winter was coming. Xenophon eventually assumed leadership of this stranded and confused army, and led them to safety – as many as survived. The book which Xenophon later wrote about their harrowing travels ‘up country’, Anabasis, is a hair-raising and brutally graphic soldier’s journal, of which more will be said later.
Upon his return to Greece, Xenophon continued his mercenary work under a Spartan general named Agesilaus. He even went fighting, with Agesilaus’ “10,000” soldiers who returned from the battle of Coroneia in Persia, against a combined Athenian and Theban force. Athens issued a decree of exile against Xenophon as a result. . Even though it is possible that his banishment was revoked in later years, Xenophon never returned to Athens.
In gratitude for his service in this decisive Lacedaimonian victory, the Spartans gave Xenophon an estate in Elis, about 2 miles from Olympia – a region of the Peloponnese which was known for its unparalleled beauty and richness. Here in Elis over the next 23 years, Xenophon would live a life of semi-retirement and quiet rural pursuits. Here also he would write the bulk of his works, raise a family, and keep a distanced and reflective historical eye on the political fortunes of Athens. Nothing is known of his wife beyond her name: Philesia. He had two sons, Gryllus and Diodorus. The Former was killed in the battle of Mantinea in 362 B.C., and Xenophon received many carefully written eulogies, a testament to his prominence in his own time.
When his adoptive city of Sparta was defeated in the Battle of Leuctra in 371 B.C., Elians drove Xenophon from his rural retreat and confiscated it. Xenophon then moved to “flowery Corinth” where he ended his days.
Xenophon’s portrait of Socrates in four loosely topic-organized books is known as Memorabilia. Any reader who comes across of this work after even a minimal exposure to the better-known Socrates of Plato’s dialogues is in for a shock. One rare reader who encountered Xenophon’s Socrates first was John Stuart Mill, who refers to it in the context of a description of Mill’s own father:
My father’s moral convictions, wholly dissevered from religion, were very much of the character of those of the Greek philosophers; and were delivered with the force and decision which characterized all that came from him. Even at the very early age at which I read with him the Memorabilia of Xenophon, I imbibed from that work and from his comments a deep respect for the character of Socrates; who stood in my mind as a model of ideal excellence: and I well remember how my father at that time impressed upon me the lesson of the “Choice of Hercules.” At a somewhat later period the lofty moral standard exhibited in the writings of Plato operated upon me with great force. (Autobiography, ch.2.)
Xenophon’s Socrates is shown in conversation with various people from a wide variety of walks of life and with quite starkly different moral characters; one of his conversation partners is a famous prostitute, another is an aspiring young politician who knows little about life, another is a son of Pericles, and yet another is a grump; the colorful list goes on. The individual books of the “Memorabilia” each contain many different conversational vignettes and set pieces, yet they consistently show a Socrates who is above all committed to helping people improve their lives in all practical dimensions; “Socrates was so useful in all circumstances and in all ways…” Memorabilia IV.i.1). In contrast to Plato’s Socrates, who is committed to “follow the argument wherever, like a wind, it may lead us” (Plato, Republic 394D), Xenophon’s Socrates strives always to send his conversation partners away with some nuggets of practical advice which they may put to use right away.
A brief and selective thematic summary of each book follows:
Memorabilia I: The book begins with a defense of Socrates against the legal charges which led to his execution, in a long initial section narrated by the author in his own voice. Socrates enjoined piety and respect for divination, which should be consulted before every momentous life-choice. He avoided speculation about the nature of the cosmos; “…(h)is own conversation was ever of human things. The problems he discussed were: what is godly? What is ungodly; what is just, what is unjust; what is prudence; what is madness; what is courage, what is cowardice; what is a state, what is a statesman; what is government, and what is a governor; – these, and others like them…” (Memorabilia.I.1.16). In a conversation with Aristodemus, Socrates presents an extended ‘argument from design’ to strengthen religious faith; the concept of God here manifested is strikingly monotheistic and is also woven throughout the natural world (Memorabilia I.iv.3-19). To the charge of corrupting the youth, Xenophon writes, “…in control of his own passions and appetites he was the strictest of men” (Memorabilia II.ii.1). (The theme of self-control, both in the sense of restraint of the appetites and in that of autonomy, is strong throughout the Memorabilia.) Socrates “led men up” to self-control, motivated by his love of humanity (Memorabilia I.v, I.2.60).
Memorabilia II: The theme of self-control is here pursued, and the famous set-piece called “Choice of Herakles” is presented (Memorabilia II.i.21-33), in a version ascribed to Prodicus. Here, while meditating in a quiet place, the young Herakles is approached by two women who represent the lives of Virtue and Vice respectively. Each lady tries to persuade Herakles to choose her way, with Vice offering a life of pleasures and self-indulgence, and Virtue offering the rigors of self-control which she argues will lead to true happiness. (Oddly, the anecdote ends before Herakles chooses.) There then follows a series of forays into the topic of human relationships as components of the good life; parents give selflessly to their children (a poignant passage describes the tireless work of mothers in particular – Memorabilia II.ii.5); friends are “more useful than any possession”, and are humorously described as being ‘hunted’ and ‘seduced by Siren song’ into one’s life, but the bottom line is that friendship is a good thing based on goodness (Memorabilia II.ii.x). The value of work as a component of the good life is underscored by a lengthy discussion between Socrates and Aristarchus (Memorabilia II.vii), who has 14 female relatives living under his roof. Socrates advises him to start a home textile business putting these ladies to work. They’ll be happier, and work makes for virtue. This scheme is represented as successful. (The importance of toil, work, even rough manual labor, to virtue is a continuing theme for Xenophon, and a topic on which his views run counter to the aristocratic mentality of his time.)
Memorabilia III: Here Socrates offers practical advice to several different individuals concerning military leadership and what it takes to become a successful general. The end goal, he maintains, is to make the soldiers better human beings. Thus the type of knowledge and expertise required is rather generally found in many different pursuits; even in business (for which one conversation partner has expressed contempt), the goal is the betterment of all individuals concerned; “Don’t look down on business”, Socrates warns (Memorabilia III.iv). (The idea that there are very general skills which lead to success in a huge variety of human endeavors is a strong theme in Xenophon’s works elsewhere as well.) General knowledge about human nature and how to be a good leader should combine with the requisite practical knowledge about one’s chosen field, and in all fields moderation and self-control are crucially valuable traits. Eupraxia, being a good and good-oriented practitioner, is valuable in every field, whether one is a farmer, physician, or politician (Memorabilia III.ix). In a long set-piece, Socrates is shown visiting a beautiful and famous prostitute named Theodote, and conversing with her about friendship and how to treat one’s friends. This highly interesting passage, unique in ancient philosophy in presenting a conversation between a working woman (of dubious social standing even!) and a well-known male philosopher, is full of humor and double-entendre but ends with Socrates inviting Theodote to come philosophize with him and his ‘girlfriends’ any time (Memorabilia III.xi). Finally, Socrates is here something of a fitness guru, advising Epigenes to get out and get some exercise; “…(t)here is no kind of struggle, apart from war, and no undertaking in which you will be worse off by keeping your body in better fettle” (Memorabilia III.xii.5). (An emphasis on physical fitness achieved through vigorous exercise is a very significant theme throughout Xenophon’s works.)
Memorabilia IV: The importance of self-control to success in every field of endeavor is again underscored and argued for; talented youths and high-bred horses alike need careful training and structure in order to avoid running off the rails with maturity. The moral quality of sophrosyne, moderation, prudence, and good habits combined, is said to be most needful in our behavior toward the gods. For the gods are such benefactors to us that it is asked: How is it possible to be grateful enough? Socrates offers a translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”, as follows: a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25). Socrates is described as having the mission of making his companions more law-abiding, more efficacious in their chosen work, more prudent or moderate, and more self-controlled. Self-control is integral to that precious quality freedom, because no one is free who is ruled by bodily pleasure (Memorabilia IV.v). This book ends with a beautiful encomium to Socrates spoken in what seems to be Xenophon’s own most authentic voice (Memorabilia IV.viii.11):
All who knew what manner of man Socrates was and who seek after virtue continue to this day to miss him beyond all others, as the chief of helpers in the quest for virtue. For myself, I have described him as he was: so religious that he did nothing without counsel from the gods; so just that he did no injury, however small, to any man, but conferred the greatest benefits on all who dealt with him…To me then he seemed to be all that a truly good and happy man must be.
In addition to the Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology.
Xenophon’s Symposium depicts an avowedly lighthearted group of friends attending a spontaneous dinner-party in honor of young Autolycus’ victory in an Olympic event. Entertainment is provided by young talent dancing, singing, and performing feats of agility, while the conversation turns on each guest explaining what he values most about himself: beauty, wealth, poverty, friends, and traits of character are all offered and discussed. Socrates presents his central attribute as the ability to be a “procurer” (essentially, a pimp); he explains that he is able to improve people and make them better, more useful, more valuable to the city, and is in this analogous to a successful pimp who is able to bring out the best in his stable of prostitutes. In a more serious vein, Socrates explains the superior value of spiritual love over physical love, and the centrality of virtue to genuine love. “(T)he greatest blessing that befalls the man who yearns to render his favorite a good friend is the necessity of himself making virtue his habitual practice” (Symposium viii.27). Weirdly, the evening ends with a demonstration of smooching between two of the young musicians which is so hot that everyone rushes off home to his wife (if he has one) or professes the intention to acquire a wife as soon as possible, if he is still single.
Xenophon’s Apology begins with Socrates explaining to his friend Hermogenes why he has not been working on his defense speech: he has been hindered by his divine sign, and moreover is quite ready to die. Socrates justifies his readiness by noting the evils of old age that he will avoid, and the blamelessness of his life. When at trial, he defends himself from the charge of impiety by noting his regular participation in all sacrifices and other public religious rituals. Against the charge of corrupting the youth, he notes that through the oracle at Delphi, “…Apollo answered that no man was more free than I, or more just, or more prudent” (Apology 14). After his condemnation to death, Socrates comforts his tearful friends with a Stoic-sounding thought: “Have you not known all along that from the moment of my birth nature had condemned me to death?” (Apology 27). Xenophon concludes in his own voice (Apology 34):
And so, in contemplating the man’s wisdom and nobility of character, I find it beyond my power to forget him or, in remembering him, to refrain from praising him. And if among those who make virtue their aim any one has ever been brought into contact with a person more helpful than Socrates, I count that man worthy to be called most blessed.
Xenophon’s political philosophy is a matter of interpretation and some controversy. Did his relationship with Sparta incline him away from Athenian democratic values? Was his evident admiration for Persian kings indicative of an allegiance to absolute monarchy? The main works examined in an effort to reconstruct this aspect of his thought are The Education of Cyrus (also known as Cyropaedia;) a partial biography of a Persian king building an empire, the Anabasis (account of the ill-fated Greek mercenary expedition in Persia), Hiero (a conversation about tyranny), Agesilaus (biography of a Spartan general),the Constitution of the Lacedaimonians (description of the system of laws and social practices of Sparta), and Hellenica (history of Greece from 411 – 362 B.C.E., taking up where Thucydides ends). One thing is clear and beyond controversy: Xenophon has an abiding interest in describing leadership, the constellation of qualities that enables a person to function as a leader in groups, whether military, civic, or familial.
That Xenophon admires the Spartan system and the individuals it produces is evident from both the portrait of Agesilaus and the description of the Spartan political system developed by the legendary Lycurgus (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians). Agesilaus is a ferocious military tactician and fighter who waged campaigns in Persia and on Greek soil. Xenophon gives minute descriptions of the strategies Ageilaus used against the deceptive Persian general Tissaphernes, the successes of which resulted in the latter losing his head (literally). It is thought that Xenophon was among the soldiers serving under Agesilaus at the battle of Coronea, judging from the immediacy of descriptions like this word picture of the aftermath of this particularly gruesome clash (Agesilaus II.14):
Now that the fighting was at an end, a weird spectacle met the eye, as one surveyed the scene of the conflict – the earth stained with blood, friend and foe lying dead side by side, shields smashed to pieces, spears snapped in two, daggers bared of their sheaths, some on the ground, some embedded in the bodies, some yet gripped by the hand.
What Xenophon admires most about Agesilaus though is the way his character shines through in his leadership (Agesliaus II. 8).
(H)e took care to render his men capable of meeting all calls on their endurance; he filled their hearts with confidence that they were able to withstand any and every enemy; he inspired them all with an eager determination to out-do one another in valour; and lastly he filled all with anticipation that many good things would befall them, if only they proved good men. For he believed that men so prepared fight with all their might; nor in point of fact did he deceive himself.
Here is that general who eats with the common soldiers, fights as hard as they do or harder, sleeps on the rudest bed in the battalion, and is tireless in care for their welfare. Here too, we find Xenophon noting the Spartan’ general’s “love of toil” (he is philoponos, AgesilausIX.3), and the fact that he had fortified his soul “against all the assaults of lucre, of pleasure, and of fear” (Agesilaus VIII.8). Thanks to all of this and more, the Spartan remained a formidable and gnarly opponent into his eighties, and left behind him the best type of monument: the admiration of all who had known him or known of him.
The Constitution of the Lacedaimonians draws a mostly admiring portrait of the creation of distinctively Spartan social customs and military might, by a (probably mythical) genius social engineer named Lycurgus. Like the inscription over the ant-colony entrance in T. H. White’s The Sword in the Stone, (White 1938, ch.13) “EVERYTHING NOT FORBIDDEN IS COMPULSORY,” Spartan society is legislated down to the most personal details (where men are allowed to eat supper, how much female children get fed, whether an unused horse can be borrowed, etc.) to produce an efficient warrior-making machine in which accumulations of wealth and private property were rendered impossible and the famous “equality’ which made Sparta so stable (in Xenophon’s apparent view at any rate) was forged. Spartan soldiers were required by law to practice gymnastics while out on campaign, “…and the result is that they take more pride in themselves and have a more dignified appearance than other men” (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians XII.5). Extreme measures are taken with young boys, to ensure that they will develop the proper level of discipline and collectivist thinking that will produce obedient and happily equal adult citizens: they are taken from their homes at age 7 and from thenceforth live in military-like barracks, subject to discipline by any adult male who might see them transgress in any way.
Should we infer that Xenophon endorses this radical social engineering program and its collectivist political philosophy, or only that he finds it a fascinating and impressive experiment which did in fact make Sparta the most feared military force in the Greek world of its time? Whichever interpretation we choose, it is clear at the end of the treatise that the experiment was not a lasting and unambiguous success; Xenophon writes that Spartan citizens have in fact gone over to the accumulation of individual wealth, have grown fond of wielding power over remote cities, and have lost that unanimity which was Lycurgus’ energetically-sought goal.
Did Xenophon provide an answer to the question about an Ideal Polis, a most desirable form of political organization? Some scholars have argued that we can look for glimmerings of this in the Anabasis, where the Greek army in its struggle to reach the sea can be viewed as a “polis on the move” (Waterfield 2006, p.147). As the shattered mercenary troops struggle to stay organized and to survive their pitiless march through the foodless deserts of Assyria and the freezing mountains of Armenia, various forms of political organization surface at various times. While an army is most naturally understood as an oligarchy, with orders coming from a few and being followed by the many, there are also moments of democracy: soldiers hold general assemblies and agree upon resolutions which they will represent to their commanding officers. Xenophon himself is elected by popular acclaim early in the march. As leader, he keeps his eye on the welfare of the troops: defusing anarchy, strategically seeking out food and safety, and making the tough decisions necessary for the good of all, such as abandoning the camp followers and horses in deep mountain snow when it became clear they were a mortal liability. During its course, Xenophon emphasizes the importance of piety and ritual which bind a polis together in homonoia or like-mindedness. At the climactic moment when the lead troops crest a rise and spot the sea, immediately after dancing for joy and famously shouting, “Thalatta! Thalatta!” (the sea, the sea), they build a cairn of stones to honor the gods.
The political philosophies which can be discerned in Xenophon’s largest and perhaps strangest work, The Education of Cyrus, are a matter of great controversy. Some paradoxical aspects of the work fuel the arguments about how it should be interpreted. Cyrus is undoubtedly a terrific leader and a daunting empire-builder, but he is seen to have some off-putting traits such as arrogance, a tendency to fear his own sensuality, and questionable judgment from time to time. Does this mean Xenophon is implicitly criticizing the Persian model of monarchy? Yet he takes pains, in this massive book, to show Cyrus’ uncanny ability to mobilize support and suppress resistance, and his dedication to both recognizing and rewarding nobility and virtue. Cyrus is repeatedly seen to emphasize that the best army consists of soldiers serving of their own free will, being rewarded for their merits, and feeling respect and gratitude to their leaders.
They came not from compulsion but from their own free will, and out of gratitude. (Cyropaedia IV.iii.11)
Perhaps we should conclude that Xenophon’s political theory is flexible, and that the most key element of any polis revolves around the leadership skills of those in charge, alongside their self-control and devotion to the good of the whole.
As seen above in the discussion of Xenophon’s Socrates and of the ideal leader, certain themes recur in Xenophon’s moral reflections. Some of the most frequently recurring ideas are:
The woman conceives and bears her burden in travail, risking her life, and giving of her own food; and, with much labor, having endured to the end and brought forth her child, she rears and cares for it, although she has not received any good thing, and the babe neither recognizes its benefactress nor can make its wants known to her; still she guesses what is good for it, and what it likes, and seeks to supply these things, and rears it for a long season, enduring toil day and night, nothing knowing what return she will get.
He writes admiringly of the general who eats with his men and eats the same food, of the king who works in his garden, of Socrates chatting with a prostitute, of the virtue of Panthea and her noble death (Cyropaedia VII.iii.14). He admires the Spartan ideal of equality and laments its erosion.
Xenophon’s collected works include several shorter dialogues and essays in which he (like his Socrates) provides useful and practically applicable advice on topics like choosing and training a war-horse (On Horsemanship), being a cavalry commander (The Cavalry Commander), hunting (On Hunting), taxation (Ways and Means), and home economics (Oeconomicus). These treatises are not flatly how-to manuals but also are infused with a distinctive world-view and a definite value-scheme.
So for example, in the treatise on horsemanship, Xenophon presents a definite equine psychology and a training ethic; the training should not be harsh, because “…nothing forced can ever be beautiful”. The horse
must follow the indication of the aids to display of his own free will all the most beautiful and brilliant qualities (On Horsemanship XI.6).
Xenophon stresses commonalities between horses and humans. Old saws apply equally to horses and to humans, as in the following text concerning the length of galloping sets: “In excess of the proper limit, nothing whatsoever is enjoyable, either to a horse or a man” (X.14). It is noticeable that Xenophon does not simply say that running a horse ragged is counterproductive in training. His point differs from this claim in two ways: he stresses again the commonality between horse and human; and he places the emphasis of the training advice upon what is pleasing (‘edu) to the horse. Thus the horse is conceived as a partner, rather than an object, in the training project, and a partner whose willing and appreciative participation in the project is essential to its success.
So also, in the Oeconomicus, there is not simply practical instruction about running a successful small farm, but a general theme of praise for engagement, orderliness, and system that has sometimes a definite political ring, as in the following passage (Oeconomicus V.i):
For the pursuit of (farming) is in some sense a luxury as well as a means of increasing one’s estate and of training the body in all that a free man should be able to do.
Sometimes however it just sounds quaint; “What a beautiful sight is afforded by boots of all sorts arranged in rows!” (Oeconomicus VIII.19).
Thus, Xenophon’s philosophical projects were infused with a commitment to practical usefulness just as his practical treatises convey a philosophy that is still of interest today, with its emphasis on engagement in the world, on knowing who we are and how we can help. Recall Socrates’ translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”; a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).
Eve A. Browning
University of Minnesota Duluth
U. S. A.
Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/xenophon/
Copyright © The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy. All rights reserved.