Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Xenophon (c.430—c.350 BCE)

XenophonWith a number of existing writings, Xenophon is noted for his accounts of life in Greece, both in ancient times and during the 4th and 3rd centuries BCE. Formally a young student of Socrates, he would later record a number of Socratic dialogues as well as personal accounts of Socrates, whom he admired greatly. As a young adult, Xenophon informally served in the army under the Persian prince Cyrus the Younger, helping to lead his contingent over land back to the Black Sea after Cyrus’ death in battle. His account of this journey, recorded in his Anabasis, is read in academia today, though more for its language than its testimony. Later joining the Spartan army, Xenophon, not at all a nationalist, was exiled from Athens after fighting against them in their war with Sparta. Eventually settling in Scillus in southern Greece, Xenophon began a long trajectory of writing–historical tracts, generalized works of instruction (specifically on training and rearing animals), essays on the military, politics and economics, as well as the aforementioned Socratic works.  These latter works were both a recording of some of Socrates’ dialogues, as well as a general history of Socrates’ methods of teaching. Though Xenophon’s Socratic tracts are largely disregarded, Xenophon’s Memorabilia is often referenced as an account of Socrates’ religious views.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Xenophon’s Account of Socrates

1. Life

An Athenian, the son of Gryllus, Xenophon was born about 444 BCE. In his early life he was a pupil of Socrates; but the turning point in his career came when he decided to serve in the Greek contingent raised by Cyrus against Artaxerxes in 401. Xenophon himself mentions the circumstances under which he joined this army (Anab. 3:1). Proxenus, a friend of Xenophon, was already with Cyrus, and he invited Xenophon to come to Sardis, and promised to introduce him to the Persian prince. He accompanied Cyrus into Upper Asia. In the battle of Cunaxa (401 BCE.) Cyrus lost his life, his barbarian troops were dispersed, and the Greeks were left alone on the wide plains between the Tigris and the Euphrates. It was after the treacherous massacre of Clearchus and others of the Greek commanders by the Persian satrap Tissaphernes that Xenophon came forward. He had held no command in the army of Cyrus, nor had he, in fact, served as a soldier, yet he was elected one of the generals, and took the principal part in conducting the Greeks in their memorable retreat along the Tigris over the high table-lands of Armenia to Trapezus (Trebizond) on the Black Sea. From Trapezus the troops were conducted to Chrysopolis, which is opposite to Byzantium. The Greeks were in great distress, and some of them under Xenophon entered the service of Seuthes, king of Thrace. As the Lacedaemonians under Thimbrou (or Thibron) were now at war with Tissaphernes and Pharnabazus, Xenophon and his troops were invited to join the army of Thimbron, and Xenophon led them back out of Asia to join Thimbron (399). Xenophon, who was very poor, made an expedition into the plain of the Caicus with his troops before they joined Thimbrou, to plunder the house and property of a Persian named Asidates. The Persian, with his women, children, and all his movables, was seized, and Xenophon, by this robbery, replenished his empty pockets (Anab. 7:8, 23). He tells the story himself, and is evidently not ashamed of it.

In other ways he also showed himself the prototype of an adventurous leader of condottieri, with no ties of country or preference of nationality. He formed a scheme for establishing a town with the Ten Thousand on the shores of the Euxine; but it fell through. He joined the Spartans, as has been seen, and he continued in their service even when they were at war with Athens. Agesilaus, the Spartan, was commanding the Lacedaemonian forces in Asia against the Persians in 396, and Xenophon was with him at least during part of the campaign. When Agesilaus was recalled (394), Xenophon accompanied him, and he was on the side of the Lacedaemonians in the battle which they fought at Coronea (394) against the Athenians. As a natural consequence a decree of exile was passed against him at Athens. It seems that he went to Sparta with Agesilaus after the battle of Coronea, and soon after he settled at Scillus in Elis, not far from Olympia, a spot of which he has given a description in the Anabasis. Here he was joined by his wife, Philesia, and his children. His children were educated in Sparta.

Xenophon was now a Lacedaemonian so far as he could become one. His time during his long residence at Scillus was employed in hunting, writing, and entertaining his friends. Perhaps the Anabasis and part of the Hellenica were composed here. The treatise on hunting and that on the horse were probably also written during this time, when amusement and exercise of this kind formed part of his occupation. On the downfall of the Spartan supremacy, at Leuctra in 371, Xenophon was at last expelled from his quiet retreat at Scillus by the Elans, after remaining there about twenty years. The sentence of banishment from Athens was repealed on the motion of Eubulus, but it is uncertain in what year. There is no evidence that Xenophon ever returned to Athens. He is said to have retired to Corinth after his expulsion from Scillus, and as we know nothing more, we assume that he died there some time around 357.

2. Writings

The following is a list of Xenophon’s works. (1) The Anabasis, a history of the expedition of the Younger Cyrus, and of the retreat of the Greeks who formed part of his army. It is divided into seven books. As regards the title, it will be noticed that under the name “The March Up” (ana, i.e., inland from the coast of Cunaxa) is included also the much longer account of the return march down to the Euxine. This work has immortalized Xenophon. It was the first work which made the Greeks acquainted with some portions of the Persian Empire, and it showed the weakness of that extensive monarchy. The skirmishes of the retreating Greeks with their enemies, and the battles with some of the barbarian tribes, are not such events as to elevate the work to the character of a military history. (2) The Hellenica is divided into seven books, and covers the forty-eight years from the time when the History of Thucydides ends to the battle of Mantinea. (3) The Cyropadia, in eight books, is a kind of political romance, the basis of which is the history of the Elder Cyrus, the founder of the Persian monarchy. The Agesilaus is a panegyric on Agesilaus II, king of Sparta, the friend of Xenophon. (5) The Hipparchicus is a treatise on the duties of a commander of cavalry, containing military precepts. (6) De Re Equestri is a treatise on the horse; it is not limited to horsemanship, but also shows how to avoid being cheated in buying a horse, and how to train a horse. (7) The Cynegeticus is a treatise on hunting, and on the breeding and training of hunting dogs. (8) The Respublica Lacedaemoniorum is a treatise on the Spartan states, and (9) the Atheniensium on the Athenian States. (10) The De Vectigalibus, a treatise on the revenues of Athens, is designed to show how the public revenue of Athens may be improved. (11) The Memorabilia of Socrates, in four books, was written by Xenophon to defend the memory of his master against the charge of irreligion and of corrupting the Athenian youth. Socrates is represented as holding a series of conversations, in which he develops and inculcates his moral doctrines. It is entirely a practical work such as we might expect from the practical nature of Xenophon, and it professes to show Socrates as he taught. (12) The Apology of Socrates is a short speech, containing the reasons which induced Socrates to prefer death to life. (13) The Symposium, or Banquet of Philosophers, delineates the character of Socrates. The speakers are supposed to meet at the house of Callias, a rich Athenian, at the celebration of the Great Panathenaea. Socrates and others are the speakers. It is possible that Plato wrote his Symposium later, to some extent as a corrective. (14) The Hiero is a dialogue between King Hiero and Simonides, in which the king speaks of the dangers and difficulties inherent in an exalted station, and the superior happiness of a private man. The poet, on the other hand, enumerates the advantages which the possession of power gives, and the means which it offers of obliging and doing services. (15) The Oeconomicus (“The Complete Householder”) is a treatise in the form of a dialogue between Socrates and Critobulus, in which Socrates gives instruction in the administration of a household and property.

3. Xenophon’s Account of Socrates

Four of Xenophon’s works listed above purport to record actual conversations of Socrates, whom he had known as a young man. In the Anabasis, Xenophon consulted Socrates on his decision to join Cyrus. Socrates advised him to consult the oracle of Delphi, as it was a hazardous matter for him to enter the service of Cyrus, who was considered to be the friend of the Lacedaemonians and the enemy of Athens. Xenophon went to Delphi, but he did not ask the god whether he should go or not; he probably had made up his mind. He merely inquired to what gods he should sacrifice so that he might be successful in his intended enterprise. Socrates was not satisfied with his pupil’s mode of consulting the oracle; but as he had got an answer, he told him to go. He tells us frankly that Socrates rebuked him for this evasion, and that is all we know of their discussion. If there had been more to tell, Xenophon would have told it, for he was not averse to talking about himself. At this time Xenophon was under thirty, and Socrates had passed away before his return from Asia. Several of the Socratic conversations he records are on subjects we know Xenophon was specially interested in, and the views he offers in them are just those he elsewhere expresses in his own name or through the mouth of Cyrus in the Cyropadia. Accordingly, no one appeals to such works as Oeconomicus for evidence regarding the historical Socrates. His Apology and Symposium are similarly disregarded as sources of information on Socrates.

Since the eighteenth century, however, it has been customary to make an exception in favor of a single work, the Memorabilia, composed by the exiled Xenophon with the professed intention of showing that Socrates was not irreligious, and that, so far from corrupting the young, he did them a great deal of good by his conversations. It makes sense that the eighteenth-century should have preferred the Socrates of the Memorabilia to that of the Platonic dialogues, for he comes nearer to their idea of what a philosopher ought to be. In other respects it is hard to see what there is to recommend Xenophon. It is recognized that he is far from being a trustworthy historian, and the Cyropaedia shows his turn for philosophical romance. It is methodologically unsound to isolate the Memorabilia from Xenophon’s other Socratic writings, unless there are strong reasons to do so. Thus, since it is impossible to get anything like a complete picture of Socrates from the Memorabilia alone, Xenophon supporters fill their outline with Plato’s account.

Nevertheless, one of the Memorabilia‘s chief arguments for the soundness of Socrates’ religious attitude is that he refused to busy himself with natural science and dissuaded others from studying it. What Plato tells us of the disappointment of Socrates with Anaxagoras, and his renunciation of physical speculations at an early age is enough to explain Xenophon’s contention. Xenophon continues, though, maintaining that Socrates was not unversed in mathematical and astronomical subjects. Further, he knew that what Aristophanes burlesqued in the Clouds was true, since Xenophon makes Socrates tell the Sophist Antophon, who was trying to rob him of his disciples, that he does in fact study the writings of the older philosophers “unrolling the treasures… which they have written down in books and left behind them” (Mem 1:6:14). Admissions like these are more important than the words put into Socrates’ mouth denying scientific study. It would be possible to find other admissions of this sort in Xenophon, but it is not clear how far the Memorabilia can be regarded as independent testimony at all. In fact, it is likely that Xenophon relied on Plato’s dialogues for his information about Socrates. Otherwise, it would be significant that he has heard of the importance of “hypothesis” in Socrates’ dialectic system.

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Last updated: August 30, 2004 | Originally published: