Xuanzang, world-famous for his sixteen-year pilgrimage to India and career as a translator of Buddhist scriptures, is one of the most illustrious figures in the history of scholastic Chinese Buddhism. Born into a scholarly family at the outset of the Tang (T'ang) Dynasty, he enjoyed a classical Confucian education. Under the influence of his elder brother, a Buddhist monk, however, he developed a keen interest in Buddhist subjects and soon became a monk himself at the age of thirteen. Upon his return to Chang'an in 645, Xuanzang brought back with him a great number of Sanskrit texts, of which he was able to translate only a small portion during the remainder of his lifetime. In addition to his translations of the most essential Mahayana scriptures, Xuanzang authored the Da tang xi yu ji (Ta-T'ang Hsi-yu-chi or Records of the Western Regions of the Great T'ang Dynasty) with the aid of Bianji (Bian-chi). It is through Xuanzang and his chief disciple Kuiji (K'uei-chi) (632-682) that the Faxiang (Fa-hsiang or Yogacara/Consciousness-only) School was initiated in China. In order to honor the famous Buddhist scholar, the Tang Emperor Gaozong (Gao-tsung) cancelled all audiences for three days after Xuanzang's death. (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.)
Born of a family possessing erudition for generations in Yanshi prefecture of Henan province, Xuanzang, whose lay name was Chenhui, was the youngest of four children. His great-grandfather was an official serving as a prefect, his grand-father was appointed as Professor in the National College at the capital, and his father was a Confucianist of the rigid conservative type who gave up office and withdrew into seclusion to escape the political turmoil that gripped China at that time. According to traditional biographies, Xuanzang displayed a precocious intelligence and seriousness, amazing his father by his careful observance of the Confucian rituals at the age of eight. Along with his brothers and sister, he received an early education from his father, who instructed him in classical works on filial piety and several other canonical treatises of orthodox Confucianism.
After the death of Xuanzang's father in 611, his older brother Chensu, later known as Changjie, became the primary influence on his life. As a result, he commenced visiting the monastery of Jingtu at Luoyang where his brother dwelled as a Buddhist monk, and studying sacred texts of the faith with all the ardor of a young convert. When Xuanzang requested to take Buddhist orders at the age of thirteen, the abbot Zheng Shanguo made an exception in his case because of his precocious sapience.
In 618, due to the civil war breaking out in Henan, Xuanzang and his brother sought refuge in the mountains of Sichuan, where he spent three years or so in the monastery of Kong Hui plunging into the study of various Buddhist texts, such as the Abhidharmakosa-sastra (Abhidharma Storehouse Treatise. In 622, he was fully ordained as a monk. Deeply confused by myriad contradictions and discrepancies in the texts, and not receiving any solutions from his Chinese masters, Xuanzang decided to go to India and study in the cradle of Buddhism.
An imperial decree by the Emperor Taizong (T'ai-tsung) forbade Xuanzang's proposed visit to India on the grounds on preserving national security. Instead of feeling deterred from his long-standing dream, Xuanzang is said to have experienced a vision that strengthened resolve. In 629, defying imperial proscription, he secretly set out on his epochal journey to the land of the Buddha from Chang'an.
Xuanzang reports that he travelled by night, hiding during the day, enduring many dangers, and bereft of a guide after being abandoned by his companions. After some time in the Gobi Desert, he arrived in Liangzhou in modern Gansu province, the westernmost extent of the Chinese frontier at that time and the southern terminus of the Silk Road trade route connecting China with Central Asia. Here he spent approximately a month preaching the Buddhist message before being invited to Hami by King Qu Wentai (Ch'u Wen-tai) of Turfan, a pious Buddhist of Chinese extraction.
It soon became apparent to Xuanzang that Qu Wentai, although most hospitable and respectful, planned to detain him for life in his Court as its ecclesiastical head. In response, Xuanzang undertook a hunger strike until the king relented, extracting from Xuanzang a promise to return and spend three years in the kingdom upon his return. After remaining there for a month more for the sake of the dharma, Xuanzang resumed his journey in 630, well provided with introductions to all the kings on his itinerary, including the formidable Turkish Khan whose power extended to the very gates of India. Having initially left China against the will of the Emperor, he was no longer an unknown fugitive fleeing in secret, but an accredited pilgrim with official standing.
At long last, Xuanzang reached his ultimate destination, where his strongest personal interest in Buddhism was located and the principal portion of his time abroad was spent: the Nalanda monastery, located southwest of the modern city of Bihar in northern Bihar state. As a far-famed metropolis of Buddhist monastic education, Nalanda was a veritable monastic city consisting of some ten huge temples with spaces between divided into eight compounds, surrounded by a high wall. There were over ten thousand Mahayana monks there engaged in the study of the orthodox Buddhist canon as well as the Vedas, arithmetic, and medicine. According to legend, Silabhadra (529-645), abbot of Nalanda, was considering suicide after years of wasting illness when he received instructions from deities in a dream, commanding him to endure and await the arrival of a Chinese monk in order to guarantee the preservation of the Mahayana tradition abroad. Indeed, Xuanzang became Silabhadra's disciple in 636 and was initiated into the Yogacara lineage of Mahayana learning by the venerable abbot. While at Nalanda, Xuanzang also studied Sanskrit and Brahmana philosophy. Subsequent studies in India included hetu-vidya (logic), the exegesis of Mahayana texts such as the Mahayana-sutralamkara (Treatise on the Scripture of Adorning the Great Vehicle), and Madhyamika ("Middle-ist") doctrines.
The name of the Madhyamika School, founded by Nagarjuna (2nd century CE), derives from its having sought a middle position between the realism of the Sarvastivada (Doctrine That All Is Real) School and the idealism of the Yogacara (Mind Only) School. Xuanzang appears to have combined these two systems into each other in a more eclectic and comprehensive Mahayanism. With the approval of his Nalanda mentors, Xuanzang composed a treatise, Hui zong lun (Hui-tsüng-lun or On the Harmony of the Principles), which articulates his synthesis.
At Nalanda, Xuanzang became a critic of two major philosophical systems of Hinduism opposed to Buddhism: the Samkhya and the Vaiseshika. The former was based upon a dualism of Nature and Spirit. The latter was a realist system, immediate and direct in its realism, resting upon the acceptance of the data of consciousness and experience as such: in brief, it was a melding of monism and atomism. Such beliefs were in absolute contradiction to the acosmic idealism of the Buddhist Yogacara, which evenly repelled the substantial entity of the ego and the objective existence of matter. Xuanzang also critiqued the atheistic monism of the Jains, especially inveighing against what he saw as their caricature of Buddhism in terms of Jain monastic garb and iconography.
Xuanzang's success in religious and philosophical disputes evidently aroused the attention of some Indian potentates, including the King of Assam and the poet-cum-dramatist king Harsha (r. 606-647), who was regarded as a Buddhist patron saint upon the throne like Ashoka and Kanishka of old. An eighteen-day religious assembly was convoked in Harsha's capital of Kanauj during the first week of the year 643, during which Xuanzang allegedly defeated five hundred Brahmins, Jains, and heterodox Buddhists in spirited debate.
Following these public successes in India, Xuanzang resolved to return to China by way of Central Asia. He followed the caravan-track that led across the Pamirs to Dunhuang. In the spring of 644, he reached Khotan and awaited a reply to his request for return addressed to the Emperor Taizong. In the month of November, Xuanzang left for Dunhuang by a decree of the Emperor, and arrived in the Chinese capital Chang'an the first month of the Chinese Lunar Year 645.
Traditional sources report that Xuanzang's arrival in Chang'an was greeted with an imperial audience and an offer of official position (which Xuanzang declined), followed by an assembly of all the Buddhist monks of the capital city, who accepted the manuscripts, relics, and statues brought back by the pilgrim and deposited them in the Temple of Great Happiness. It was in this Temple that Xuanzang devoted the rest of his life to the translation of the Sanskrit works that he had brought back out of the wide west, assisted by a staff of more than twenty translators, all well-versed in the knowledge of Chinese, Sanskrit, and Buddhism itself. Besides translating Buddhist texts and dictating the Da tang xi yu ji in 646, Xuanzang also translated the Dao de jing (Tao-te Ching) of Laozi (Lao-tzu) into Sanskrit and sent it to India in 647.
His translations may, by and large, be divided into three phases: the first six years (645-650), focusing on the Yogacarabhumi-sastra; the middle ten years (651-660), centering on the Abhidharmakosa-sastra; and the last four years (661-664), concentrating upon the Maha-prajnaparamita-sutra. In each phase of his career as a translator, Xuanzang saw his task as introducing Indian Buddhist texts to Chinese audiences in all their integrity. According to Thomas Watters, the total number of texts brought by Xuanzang from India to China is six hundred and fifty seven, enumerated as follows:
Mahayanist sutras: 224 items
Mahayanist sastras: 192
Sthavira sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 14
Mahasangika sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 15
Mahisasaka sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 22
Sammitiya sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 15
Kasyapiya sutras, sastra and Vinaya: 17
Dharmagupta sutras, Vinaya, sastras: 42
Sarvastivadin sutras, Vinaya, sastras: 67
Yin-lun (Treatises on the science of Inference): 36
Sheng-lun (Etymological treatises): 13
The Chinese Faxiang School, derived from the Indian Yogacara (yoga practice) School, is based upon the writings of two brothers, Asanga and Vasubandhu, who explicated a course of practice wherein hindrances are removed according to a sequence of stages, from which it gets its name. The appellation of the school originated with the title of an important fourth- or fifth-century CE text of the school, the Yogacarabhumi-sastra. Yogacara attacked both the provisional practical realism of the Madhyamika School of Mahayana Buddhism and the complete realism of Theravada Buddhism. Madhyamika is regarded as the nihilistic or Emptiness School, whereas Yogacara is seen as the realistic or Existence School. While the former is characterized as Mahayana due to its central theme of emptiness, the latter might be considered to be semi-Mahayana to a point for three basic reasons: (1) the Yogacara remains realistic like the Abhidharma School; (2) it expounds the three vehicles side by side without being confined to the Bodhisattvayana; and (3) it does not accent the doctrine of Buddha nature.
The other name of the school, Vijnanavada (Consciousness-affirming/Doctrine of Consciousness), is more descriptive of its philosophical position, which in short is that the reality a human being perceives does not exist. Yogacara becomes much better known, nevertheless, not for its practices, but for its rich development in psychological and metaphysical theory. The Yogacara thinkers took the theories of the body-mind aggregate of sentient beings that had been under development in earlier Indian schools such as the Sarvastivada, and worked them into a more fully articulated scheme of eight consciousnesses, the most weighty of which was the eighth, or store consciousness -- the alaya-vijnana.
The Yogacara School is also known for the development of other key concepts that would hold great influence not merely within their system, but within all forms of later Mahayana to come. They embody the theory of the three natures of the dependently originated, completely real, and imaginary, which are understood as a Yogacara response to the Madhyamika's truth of emptiness. Yogacara is also the original source for the theory of the three bodies of the Buddha, and greatly expands the notions of categories of elemental constructs.
Yogacara explored and propounded basic doctrines that were to be fundamental in the future growth of Mahayana and that influenced the rise of Tantric Buddhism. Its central doctrine is that only consciousness (vijnanamatra; hence the name Vijnanavada) is real, and that mind is the ultimate reality. In other words, external objects do not exist; nothing exists outside the mind. The common view that external phenomena exist is due to a misconception that is removable through a meditative or yogic process, which brings a complete withdrawal from these fictitious externals, and an inner concentration and tranquility may accordingly be bodied forth.
Yogacara is an alternative system of Buddhist logic. According to it, the object is not at all as it seems, and thus can not be of any service to knowledge. It is therefore unreal when consciousness is the sole reality. The object is only a mode of consciousness. Its appearance although objective and external is in fact the transcendental illusion, because of which consciousness is bifurcated into the subject-object duality. Consciousness is creative and its creativity is governed by the illusive idea of the object. Reality is to be viewed as an Idea or a Will. This creativity is manifested at different levels of consciousness.
Since this school believes that only ideation exists, it is also called the Idealistic School. In China, it was established by Xuanzang and his principal pupil Kuiji who systematized the teaching of his masters recorded in two essential works: the Fa yuan i lin zhang (Fa-yuan i-lin-chang or Chapter on the Forest of Meanings in the Garden of Law) and the Cheng wei shi lun shu ji (Ch'eng wei-shih lun shu-chi or Notes on the Treatise on the Completion of Ideation Only). On account of the school's idealistic accent it is known as Weishi (Wei-shih) or Ideation Only School; yet because it is concerned with the specific character of all the dharmas, it is often called the Faxiang School as well. Besides, this school argues that not all beings possess pure seeds and, therefore, not all of them are capable of attaining Buddhahood.
The central concept of this school is borrowed from a statement by Vasubandhu -- idam sarvam vijnaptimatrakam, "All this world is ideation only." It strongly claims that the external world is merely a fabrication of our consciousness, that the external world does not exist, and that the internal ideation presents an appearance as if it were an outer world. The whole external world is, hence, an illusion according to it.
Broadly speaking, Mere-Consciousness may cover the eight consciousnesses, the articulation of which forms one of the most seminal and distinctive aspects of the doctrine of the Yogacara School, transmitted to East Asia where it received the somewhat pejorative designations of Dharma-character School and Consciousness-only School. According to this doctrine, sentient beings possess eight distinct layers of consciousness, the first five -- the visual consciousness, auditory consciousness, olfactory consciousness, gustatory consciousness, and tactile consciousness -- corresponding to the sense perceptions, the sixth discriminatory consciousness to the thinking mind, the seventh manas consciousness to the notion of ego, and the eighth alaya-consciousness to the repository of all the impressions from one's past experiences. As the first seven of these arise on the basis of the eighth, they are called the transformed consciousnesses. In contrast, the eighth is known as the base consciousness, store consciousness, or seed consciousness. And in particular, it is this last consciousness that the Mere-Consciousness is all about.
One of the foremost themes discussed in the school is the
alaya-vijnana or storehouse consciousness, which stores and coordinates all the notions reflected in the mind. Thus, it is a storehouse where all the pure and contaminated ideas are blended or interfused. This principle might be illustrated by the school's favorite citation:
"A seed produces a manifestation,
A manifestation perfumes a seed.
The three elements (seed, manifestation, and perfume) turn on and on,
The cause and effect occur at one and the same time."
It is the doctrine of consciousness or mind as the basis for so-called "external" objects that gave the Cittamatra (Mind Only) tradition its name. Apparently external objects are constituted by consciousness and do not exist apart from it. Vasubandhu began his
Vimsatika vijnapti-matrata-siddhih (Twenty Verses on Consciousness-only) by stating: "All this is only perception, since consciousness manifests itself in the form of nonexistent objects." There is only a flow of perceptions. This flow, however, really exists, and it is mental by nature, as in terms of the Buddhist division of things it has to be either mental or physical. The flow of experiences could barely be a physical or material flow. There might be a danger in calling this "idealism," because it is rather dissimilar from forms of idealism in Western philosophy, in which it is deemed necessary for a newcomer to negate and transcend previous theories and philosophies through criticism, but the situation in Buddhism, especially Yogacara Buddhism, is such that it developed its doctrines by inheriting the entire body of thought of its former masters. Nonetheless, if "idealism" denotes that subjects and objects are no more than a flow of experiences and perceptions, which are of the same nature, and these experiences, just as perceptions, are mental, then this could be called a form of "dynamic idealism."
Because this school maintains that no external reality exists, while retaining the position that knowledge exists, assuming knowledge itself is the object of consciousness. It, therefore, postulates a higher storage consciousness, which is the final basis of the apparent individual. The universe consists in an infinite number of possible ideas that lie inactively in storage. Such dormant consciousness projects an interrupted sequence of thoughts, while it itself is in restless flux till the karma, or accumulated consequences of past deeds, blows out. This storage consciousness takes in all the impressions of previous experiences, which shape up the seeds of future karmic action, an illusory force creating outer categories that are actually only fictions of the mind. So illusive a force determines the world of difference and belongs to human nature, sprouting the erroneous notions of an I and a non-I. That duality can only be conquered by enlightenment, which effects the transformation of an ordinary person into a Buddha.
Certain objections were interposed to level at Yogacara's doctrine of consciousness. Vasubhandhu, again in his Vimsatika, undertook to prove the invalidity of some of these:
In reply, Vasubandhu argued that these were after all no objections; they simply failed to show that perception-only as a teaching was beyond the limits of what could be concretely reasoned. Spatiotemporal determination can be elucidated on the analogy of dream experience, where a complete and surreal world is created with objects appearing to have spatiotemporal localization despite the fact that they do not exist apart from the mind which is cognizing them. Moreover, the second objection can be met by recourse to the wider Buddhist religious framework. The hells and their tortures, which are taught by Buddhist beliefs as the result of wicked deeds, and to be endured for a very long time till purified, are experienced as the collective fruit of the previous karmas done by those hell inmates. The torturers of hell obviously can not really exist, otherwise they would have been reborn in hell themselves and would too experience the sufferings associated with it. If this were the case then how could they jovially inflict sufferings upon their fellow inmates? Thus they must be illusive, and yet they are experienced by a number of people. Finally, as in a dream objects bear some pragmatic purpose within that dream, and likewise in hell, so in everyday life. Furthermore, as physical activity can be directed toward unreal objects in a dream owing, it is said, to nervous irritation on the part of the dreamer, so too in daily life.
Representing a two-hundred-year development within the Vijnanavadin tradition subsequent to the Lankavatara Sutra (Sutra on the Buddha's Entering the Country of Lanka) and being the primary text of the Faxiang School, the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra is an exhaustive study of the alaya-vijnana and the sevenfold development of the manas, manovijnana, and the five sensorial consciousnesses. As a creative and elaborate exposition of Vasubandhu's Trimsika-vijnapti-matrata-siddhi (Treatise in Thirty Stanzas on Consciousness Only) rendered by Xuanzang in 648 at Great Happiness Monastery, it synthesizes the ten most significant commentaries written on it, and becomes the enchiridion of the new Faxiang School of Buddhist idealism. It is mainly a translation by Xuanzang in 659 of Dharmapala's commentary on the Trimsika-vijnapti-matrata-siddhi, yet it also contains edited translations of other masters' works on the same verses. This is the only translation by Xuanzang that is not a direct translation of a text, but instead a selective and evaluative editorial drawing on ten distinct texts. Since Kuiji aligned himself with this text as assuming the role of Xuanzang's successor, the East Asian tradition has treated the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra as the pivotal exemplar of Xuanzang's teachings.
In both style and content, the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra symbolizes a superior advance over the earlier Lankavatara Sutra, a basic Faxiang School's canonical text that sets forth quite a few hallmarks of Mahayana position, such as the eight consciousnesses and the tathagatagarbha (Womb of the Buddha-to-be). Instead of bearing the latter's cryptically aphoristic form, Xuanzang's treatise is a detailed and coherent analysis, a scholastic apologetics on the doctrine of Consciousness-only. Without any reference to the tathagatagarbha itself, the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra firmly grounds its pan-consciousness upon Absolute Suchness or the existence of the mind as true reality. Aside from human consciousness, another principle is accepted as real -- the so-called suchness, which is the equivalent of the void of the Madhyamika School.
The Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra spells out how there can be a common empirical world for different individuals who ideate or construct particular objects, and who possess distinct bodies and sensory systems. According to Xuanzang, the universal "seeds" in the store consciousness account for the common appearance of things, while particular "seeds" make a description of the differences.
Being a first and foremost idealistic school of Mahayana Buddhism, the Faxiang School categorically discerns chimerical phenomena manifested in consistent patterns of regularity and continuity; in order to justify this order in which only defiled elements could prevail before enlightenment is attained, it created the tenet of the alaya-vijnana. Sense perceptions are commanded as regular and coherent by a store of consciousnesses, of which one is consciously unaware. Then, sense impressions produce certain configurations in this insensibility that "perfumate" later impressions so that they appear consistent and regular. Each and every single one of beings possesses this seed consciousness, which therefore becomes a sort of collective consciousness that takes control of human perceptions of the world, though this world does not exist at all according to the very tenet. This school's forerunner had emerged in India roughly the second century AD, yet had its period of greatest productivity in the fourth century, during the time of Asanga and Vasubandha. Following them, the school divided into two branches, the Nyayanusarino Vijnanavadinah (Vijnanavada School of the Logical Tradition) and the Agamanusarino Vijnanavadinah (Vijnanavada School of the Scriptural Tradition), with the former sub-school postulating the standpoints of the logician Dignaga (c. AD 480-540) and his successor, Dharmakirti (c. AD 600?-680?).
This consciousness-oriented school of ideology was largely represented in China by the Faxiang School, called Popsang in Korea, and Hosso in Japan. The radical teachings of Yogacara became known in China primarily through a work of Paramartha, a sixth-century Indian missionary-translator. His rendition of the Mahayana-samparigraha-sastra (Compendium of the Great Vehicle) by Asanga provided a sound base for the Sanlun (Three-Treatise) School, which preceded the Faxiang School as the vehicle of Yogacara thought in China. Faxiang is the Chinese translation of the Sanskrit term dharmalaksana (characteristic of dharma), referring to the school's basal emphasis on the unique characteristics of the dharmas that make up the world, which appears in human ideation. According to Faxiang doctrines, there are five categories of dharmas: (1) eight mental dharmas, encompassing the five sense consciousnesses, cognition, the cognitive faculty, and the store consciousness; (2) eleven elements relating to appearances or material forms; (3) fifty-one mental capacities or functions, activities, and dispositions; (4) twenty-four situations, processes, and things not associated with the mind -- for example, time and becoming; and (5) six non-conditioned or non-created elements -- for instance, space and the nature of existence.
Alaya-consciousness is posited as the receptacle of the imprint of thoughts and deeds, thus it is the dwelling of sundry karmic seeds. These "germs" develop into form, feeling, perception, impulse, and consciousness, collectively known as the Five Aggregates. Then ideation gradually takes shape, which triggers off a self or mind against an outer world. Finally comes the awareness of the objects of thought via sense perceptions and ideas. The store consciousness must be purified of its subject-object duality and notions of false existence, and restored to its pure state tantamount to buddhahood, the Absolute Suchness, and the undifferentiated. In line with these three elements of false imagination, right knowledge, and suchness is the three modes in which things respectively are: (1) the mere fictions of false imagination; (2) under certain conditions to relatively exist; and (3) in the perfect mode of being. Corresponding to this threefold version of the modes of existence is the tri-body doctrine of the Buddha -- the Dharma Body, the Reward Body, and the Response Body, a creed that was put into its systematic and highly developed theory by Yogacara thinkers. The distinguishing features of the Faxiang School lie in its highlight of meditation and broadly psychological analyses. Seen in this light, it is a fry cry from the other predominant Mahayana stream, Madhyamika, where the stress is entirely upon dialectics and logical arguments.
The base consciousness is interpreted as the container of the karmic impressions or seeds, nourished by us beings in the process of our existence. These seeds, ripening in the course of future circumstances, find the nearest parallel to the present-day understanding of genes. In view of the foregoing, philosophers of this school have constantly essayed to explain in detail how karmic force actually operates and affects us on a concrete, personal level. Comprised in this development of consciousness theory is the concept of conscious justification -- phenomena that are presumably external to us can never exist but in intimate association with consciousness itself. Such a notion is commonly referred to as "Mind Only."
The fundamental early canonical texts that expound Yogacara doctrines are such scriptures as the (Sutra on Understanding Profound and Esoteric Doctrine, the Srimala-sutra (Sutra on the Lion's Roar of Queen Srimala), and treatises like the Mahayana-samparigraha-sastra, the Prakaranaryavaca-sastra (Acclamation of the Scriptural Teaching), and the Yogacarabhumi, etc.
As an early and influential Chinese Buddhist monk, Xuanzang embodies the tensions inherent in Chinese Buddhism: filial piety versus monastic discipline, Confucian orthodoxy versus Mahayana progressivism, etc. Such tensions can be seen not only in his personal legacies, which include the extremely popular Chinese novel based on his travels, Xiyouji (Journey to the West), but also in the career of scholastic Buddhism in China.
For a time during the middle of the Tang Dynasty the Faxiang School achieved a high degree of eminence and popularity across China, but after the passing of Xuanzang and Kuiji the school swiftly declined. One of the factors resulting in this decadence was the anti-Buddhist imperial persecutions of 845. Another likely factor was the harsh criticism of Faxiang by members of the Huayan (Hua-yen) School. In addition, the philosophy of this school, with its abstruse terminology and hairsplitting analysis of the mind and the senses, was too alien to be accepted by the practical-minded Chinese.
Der Huey Lee
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