Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Xunzi (Hsün Tzu, c. 310—c. 220 B.C.E.)

xunziXunzi, along with Confucius and Mencius, was one of the three great early architects of Confucian philosophy. In many ways, he offers a more complete and sophisticated defense of Confucianism than Mencius. Xunzi lived toward the end of the Warring States period (453-221 BCE), generally regarded as the formative era for most later Chinese philosophy. It was a time of great variety of thought, comparable to classical Greece, so Xunzi was acquainted with many competing ideas. In reaction to some of the other thinkers of the time, he articulated a systematic version of Confucianism that encompasses ethics, metaphysics, political theory, philosophy of language, and a highly developed philosophy of education. Xunzi is known for his belief that ritual is crucial for reforming humanity’s original nature. Human nature lacks an innate moral compass, and left to itself falls into contention and disorder, which is why Xunzi characterizes human nature as bad. Ritual is thus an integral part of a stable society. He focused on humanity's part in creating the roles and practices of an orderly society, and gave a much smaller role to Heaven or Nature as a source of order or morality than most other thinkers of the time. Although his thought was later considered to be outside of Confucian orthodoxy, it was still very influential in China and remains a source of interest today. (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.)

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. The Way and Heaven
  3. Human Nature, Education, and the Ethical Ideal
    1. Human Nature
    2. Education
    3. The Ethical Ideal
    4. Discovering the Way
    5. The Heart
  4. Logic and Language
  5. Social and Political Thought
    1. Government structure
    2. Ritual and Music
    3. Moral Power
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Xunzi ("Master Xun") is the common appellation for the philosopher whose full name was Xun Kuang. He is also known as Xun Qing, “Minister Xun,” after an office he held. He was born in the state of Zhao in north-central China around 310 BCE. As a young man he studied in the state of Qi in the northeast, which had the greatest concentration of philosophers of the age. Xunzi's writings show him to be well acquainted with all the doctrines current at the time, which he probably came in contact with during this period of his life. Leaving Qi, he traveled to many of the other states that made up China at the time, and was briefly employed by some of them. His last post ended when his patron was assassinated in 238 BCE, ending his chances to put his theories of government into practice. Xunzi may have lived to see China unified by the authoritarian state of Qin in 221 BCE. If so, he certainly must have been disappointed that two of his former students, Li Si and Han Feizi, helped counsel Qin to victory when the Qin government was steadfastly opposed to Xunzi’s ideas of government through moral power. The Qin dynasty was long remembered as a time of strict laws and draconian punishments, and Xunzi’s association with two of its architects probably was one factor in the later marginalization of his thought.

Like most philosophical works of the time, the Xunzi that we have today is a later compilation of writings associated with him, not all of which were necessarily written by Xunzi himself. The current version of the Xunzi is divided into thirty-two books, about twenty-five of which are considered mostly or wholly authentic and others of which are considered representative of his thought, if not his actual writings. This is probably the largest collection of early Chinese philosophical writings that can be plausibly attributed to one author. The Xunzi is also notable for its style. Comparatively little of it is written in the dialogue format of works like the Mencius, and there are none of the fanciful parables of the Zhuangzi. Most books normally attributed to Xunzi are sustained essays on one topic that appear to have be written as more or less unified pieces, though there are often sections of verse and two books that are merely compilations of poetry. In these writings, Xunzi carefully defines his own position and raises objections to rival thinkers in a way that renders his work more recognizable as philosophy than that of many other early Chinese thinkers.

2. The Way and Heaven

The most important concept in Xunzi's philosophy is the Way (dao). This is one of the most common terms of Chinese philosophy, though all thinkers define it somewhat differently. Though the term originally referred to a road or path, it became extended to a way of doing things, a way of acting, or as it was used in philosophy, the right way to live. In Xunzi’s case, he means the human way, the way of good government and the proper way of behaving, not the Way of Heaven or Nature as Laozi and Zhuangzi define it, and as Mencius often suggests. In fact, Xunzi is notable for having probably the most rationalistic view of Heaven and the supernatural in the early period. Xunzi claims that the Way was first pointed out by particularly wise and gifted people he calls sages (a common term for an exemplar in early Chinese thought), and following the Way as it has been handed down from the past will result in a stable, prosperous, peaceful society, while going against it will have the opposite results. While certain aspects of the Way, such as particular rituals, are certainly created by humanity, whether the Way as a whole is created or discovered remains a matter of scholarly debate.

Unlike many other early philosophers, Xunzi does not believe Heaven gets involved in human affairs. Heaven was sometimes considered to be an anthropomorphic god, sometimes an impersonal force that automatically rewarded the good and punished the bad, but in Xunzi's view Heaven is much like Nature: it acts as it always does, neither helping the good or harming the bad. The Way is not the Way because Heaven approves of it, it is the Way because it is good for people. In the chapter "Discourse on Heaven" (chapter 17, also translated as “Discourse on Nature”), Xunzi devotes himself to refuting these other views of Heaven, most prominently that of the Mohists. Heaven does not reward good kings with peace and prosperity, nor punish tyrants by having them deposed. These results come about through their own good or bad decisions. Having a good harvest and sufficient food is not a sign of Heaven’s favor, it is the result of wise agricultural policy. Similarly, events like eclipses and floods are not signs of Heaven’s displeasure: they are simply things that sometimes happen. One might wonder at them as unusual occurrences, but it is not right to be afraid of them or consider them ominous. Worrying about Heaven’s favor is a waste of time; it is better to be prepared for whatever might happen. There will be some natural disasters, but if one is prepared they will not cause harm.

Interestingly, though Xunzi has this rational view of Nature, which extends to spirits and gods as well, he never suggests eliminating religious rituals that are directed toward them, such as sacrifices and divination. One must perform them as part of the ritual system that binds society together, but one does not perform expecting any results. In "Discourse on Heaven," Xunzi wrote, “You pray for rain and it rains. Why? For no particular reason, I say. It is just as though you had not prayed for rain and it rained anyway.” When it rains after you pray for rain, it is just like when it rains when you didn't pray for it. Yet during a drought, officials must still pray for rain—not because it has any effect on the natural world, but because of its effect on people. What Xunzi believes ritual does will be examined later.

In Xunzi's view, the best thing to do is understand what Nature does and what humanity does, and concentrate on the latter. Not only is it wrong to believe that Heaven intervenes in human affairs, it is useless to speculate about why Nature is the way it is or to try to help it along. Xunzi is interested in practical knowledge, and speculation about Nature is not useful. In this respect, he could be considered anti-metaphysical, since he has no interest in how the world works or what it is. His concern is what people should do, and anything that might confuse or detract from that is a waste of time. We know that Nature is invariable, and we know the Way to get what we need from Nature to live, and that is all we need to know. This kind of division between knowledge of the human world and knowledge of Heaven may have been partially influenced by Zhuangzi, but while Zhuangzi considers knowing Heaven to be important, Xunzi does not.

3. Human Nature, Education, and the Ethical Ideal

a. Human Nature

As Mencius is known for the slogan "human nature is good," Xunzi is known for its opposite, “human nature is bad.” Mencius viewed self-cultivation as developing natural tendencies within us. Xunzi believes that our natural tendencies lead to conflict and disorder, and what we need to do is radically reform them, not develop them. Both shared an optimism about human perfectability, but they viewed the process quite differently. Xunzi envisioned that humanity was once in a state of nature reminiscent of Hobbes. Without study of the Way, people's desires will run rampant, and they will inevitably find themselves in conflict in trying to satisfy their desires. Left to themselves, people will fall into disorder, poverty and conflict, living a life that would be, as Hobbes put it, “poor, nasty, brutish, and short.” It was this insistence that human nature is bad that was most often condemned by later thinkers, who rejected Xunzi’s view in favor of the idea, traced to Mencius, that people are naturally good.

Xunzi offers several arguments against Mencius's position. He defines human nature as what is inborn and does not need to be learned. He argues that if people were good by nature, there would be no need for ritual and social norms. The sages would not have had to create them, and they would not need to have been handed down through the generations. They were created precisely because people do not act in accordance with them naturally. He also notes that people desire the good, and on the principle that one desires what one doesn’t already have, this shows that people are not good. He gives several illustrations of what life is like in the state of nature, without any education on ritual and morality. Xunzi does not believe that people are evil, that they deliberately violate the rules of morality, taking a perverse pleasure in doing so. They have no natural conception of morality at all: they are morally blind by nature. Their desires bring them into conflict because they don’t know any better, not because they enjoy conflict. In fact, Xunzi believes people do not enjoy it at all, which is why they desire the kind of life that results from good order brought about through the rituals of the sages.

Like Mencius, Xunzi believed human nature is the same in everyone: no one starts off with moral principles. The original nature of Yao (a legendary sage king) and Jie (a legendary tyrant) was the same. The difference was in how they cultivated themselves. Yao reformed his original nature, Jie did not. In this way, Xunzi emphasizes the essential perfectability of everyone. Human nature is bad, but it is not incorrigible, and in fact Xunzi was rather optimistic about the possibility of overcoming the demands of desires that result in the state of nature. Though Confucius suggests that some people are better off by nature than others, Mencius and Xunzi seem to agree that everyone starts out the same, though they differ on the content of that original state. Though Xunzi believes that it is always possible to reform oneself, he recognizes that in reality this will not always happen. In most cases, the individual himself has to make the first step in attempting to reform, and Xunzi is rather pessimistic about people actually doing this. They cannot be forced to do so, and they may in practice be unable to make the choice to improve, but for Xunzi, this does not mean that in principle it is impossible for them to change.

b. Education

Like Confucius and Mencius, Xunzi is much more concerned with what kind of person to be than with rules of moral behavior or duty, and in this respect his view is similar to Western virtue ethics. The goal of Xunzi's ethics is to become a person who knows and acts according to the Way as if it were second nature. Because human nature is bad, Xunzi emphasizes the importance of study to learn the Way. He compares the process of reforming one’s nature to making a pot out of clay or straightening wood with a press-frame. Without the potter, the clay would never become a pot on its own. Similarly, people will not be able to reform their nature without a teacher showing them what to do. Xunzi’s concern is primarily moral education; he wants people to develop into good people, not people who know a lot of facts. He emphasizes the transformative aspect of education, where it changes one’s basic nature. Xunzi laid out a program of study based on the works of the sages of the past that would teach proper ritual behavior and develop moral principles. He was the first to offer an organized Confucian curriculum, and his curriculum became the blueprint for traditional education in China until the modern period.

Practice was an important aspect of Xunzi's course of education. A student did not simply study ritual, he performed it. Xunzi recognized that this performative aspect was crucial to the goal of transforming one’s nature. It was only through practice that one could realize the beauty of ritual, ideally coming to appreciate it for itself. Though this was the end of education, Xunzi appealed to more utilitarian motives to start the student on the program of study. As noted above, he discussed how desires would inevitably be frustrated in the state of nature. Organizing society through ritual was the only way people could ever satisfy even some of their desires, and study of ritual was the best way to achieve satisfaction on a personal level. Through study and practice, one could learn to appreciate ritual for its own sake, not just as a means to satisfy desires. Ritual has this power to transform someone’s motives and character. The beginning student of ritual is like a child learning to play the piano. Maybe she doesn’t enjoy playing the piano at first, but her parents take her out for ice cream after each lesson, so she goes along with it because she gets what she wants. After years of study and practice, she might learn to appreciate playing the piano for its own sake, and will practice even without any reward. This is what Xunzi imagines will happen to the dedicated student of ritual: he starts out studying ritual as a means, but it becomes an end in itself as part of the Way.

c. The Ethical Ideal

Xunzi often distinguishes three stages of progress in study: the scholar, the gentlemen, and the sage, though sometimes the sage and the gentleman seem to be equivalent for him. These were all terms in common use in philosophical discourse of the time, especially in Confucian thought, but Xunzi gives them a unique twist. He describes the achievements of each stage slightly differently in several places, but what he seems to mean is that a scholar is someone who has taken the first step of wishing to study the Way of the ancient sages and adopts them as the model for correct conduct; the gentleman has acquired a good deal of learning, but still must think about what the right thing to do is in a situation; and the sage has wholly internalized the principles of ritual and morality so that his action flows spontaneously without the need for thought, yet never goes beyond the bounds of what is proper. Using the piano analogy, the scholar has made up his mind to study the piano and is practicing basic scales. The gentleman is fairly skilled, but still needs to look at the music in front of him to know what to play. The sage is like a concert pianist who not only plays with perfect technique, but also adds his own style and unique interpretation of the music, accomplishing all this without ever consciously thinking about what notes to play. As the pianist is still playing someone else's music, the sage does not make up new standards of conduct; he still follows the Way, but he makes it his own. Yet even then, at this highest stage, Xunzi believes there is still room for learning. Study is a lifelong process that only ends at death, much as concert pianists must still practice to maintain their skills.

The teacher plays an extremely important role in the course of study. A good teacher does not simply know the rituals, he embodies them and practices them in his own life. Just as one would not learn piano from someone who had just read a book on piano pedagogy but never touched an actual instrument, one should not study from someone who has only learned texts. A teacher is not just a source of information; he is a model for the student to look up to and a source of inspiration of what to become. A teacher who does not live up to the Way of the sages in his own life is no teacher at all. Xunzi believes there is no better method of study than learning from such a teacher. In this way, the student has a model before of him of how to live ritual principles, so his learning does not become simple accumulation of facts. In the event that such a teacher is unavailable, the next best method is to honor ritual principles sincerely, trying to embody them in oneself. Without either of these methods, Xunzi believes learning degenerates into memorizing a jumble of facts with no impact on one's conduct.

d. Discovering the Way

Given Xunzi's insistence on the importance of teachers to transmit the Way of the sages of the past and his belief that people are all bad by nature, he must face the question of how the first sages discovered the Way. Xunzi uses the metaphor of a river ford for the true Way: without the people who have gone before to leave markers, those coming after would have no way of knowing where the deep places are, and they would be in danger of drowning. The question is, how did the first people get across safely, when there were no markers? Xunzi does not address the question in precisely this way, but we can piece together an answer from his writings.

Examining the analogies Xunzi uses is instructive here. He talks about cultivating moral principles as a process of crafting, using the metaphors of a potter shaping and firing clay into a pot, or using a press-frame to straighten a bent piece of wood. Just as the skill of making pottery was undoubtedly accumulated through generations of refining, Xunzi appears to think that the Way of the sages was also a product of generations of development. According to Xunzi's definition of human nature, no one could say people know how to make pots by nature: this is not something we can do without study and practice, like walking and talking are. Nevertheless, some people, through a combination of perseverance, talent, and luck, were able to discover how to make pots, and then taught that skill to others. Similarly, through generations of observing humanity and trying different ways of regulating society, the sages hit upon the correct Way, the best way to order society in Xunzi’s view. David Nivison has suggested that different sages of the past contributed different aspects of the Way: some discovered agriculture, some discovered fire, some discovered the principles of filiality and respect between husband and wife, and so on.

Xunzi views these achievements as products of the sage's acquired nature, not his original nature. This is another way of saying these are not products of people’s natural tendencies, but the results of study and experimentation. Accumulation of effort is an important concept for Xunzi. The Way of the sages was created through accumulation of learning what worked and benefited society. The sages built on the accomplishments of previous sages, added their own contributions, and now Xunzi believes the process is basically complete: we know the ritual principles that will produce a harmonious society. Trying to govern or become a moral person without studying the sages of the past is essentially trying to re-invent the wheel, or discover how to make pots on one’s own without learning from a potter. It is conceivable (though Xunzi is very skeptical about anyone actually being able to do it), but it is much more difficult and time-consuming, when all one has to do is study what has already been created.

e. The Heart

In addition to having a teacher, a critical requirement for study is having the proper frame of mind, or more precisely, heart, since early Chinese thought considered cognition to be located in the heart. Xunzi's philosophy of the heart draws from other contemporary views as well as Confucian philosophy. Like Mencius, Xunzi believed that the heart should be the lord of the body, and using the heart to direct desires and decide on right and wrong accords with the Way. However, like Zhuangzi, Xunzi emphasizes that the heart must be tranquil and concentrated to be able to learn. In the view of the heart basically shared by Xunzi and Mencius, desires are not wholly voluntary. Desires are part of human nature, and can be activated without our necessarily being conscious of them. The function of the heart is to regulate the sense faculties and parts of the body, so that though one may have desires, the heart only acts on those desires when it is right to do so. The heart controls itself and directs the other parts of the body. This ability of the heart is what allows humanity to create ritual and moral principles and escape the state of nature.

In the chapter "Dispelling Blindness" Xunzi discusses the right way to develop the heart to avoid falling into error. For study, the heart needs to be trained to be receptive, focused, and calm. These qualities of the heart allow it to know the Way, and knowing the Way, the heart can realize the benefits of the Way and practice it. This receptivity Xunzi calls emptiness, meaning the ability of the heart to continually store new information without becoming full. Focus is called unity, by which Xunzi means the ability to be aware of two aspects of a thing or situation without allowing them to interfere with each other. “Being of two hearts” was a common problem in Chinese philosophical writings: it could mean being confused or perplexed about something, as well as what we would call being two-faced. Xunzi addresses the first aspect with his discussion of unity, a focus that keeps the heart directed and free from perplexity. The final quality the heart needs is stillness, the quality of moving freely from task to task without disorder, remaining unperturbed while processing new information. A heart that has the qualities of emptiness, unity, and stillness can understand the Way. Without these qualities, the heart is liable to fall into various kinds of “blindness” or obsessions that Xunzi attributes to his philosophical rivals. Their hearts focus too much on just one aspect of the Way, so they are unable to see the big picture. They become obsessed with this one part and mistake it for the entirety of the Way. Only with the proper attitudes and control of one's heart can one perceive and grasp the Way as a whole.

4. Logic and Language

One subject that was certainly not part of Xunzi's program of study is logic. Other philosophers, particularly the Mohist school, were developing sophisticated views on logic and the principles of argumentation around Xunzi’s time, and other thinkers were known for their paradoxes that played with language to show its limits. Though Xunzi was undoubtedly influenced by the principles of argument developed by the Mohists, he had no patience for the dialectical games and disputation for its own sake that were popular at the time. According to one story, a philosopher, having just convinced a king through his arguments, then took the other side and persuaded the king that his earlier arguments were wrong. Such exercises in argument and rhetoric were a waste of time for Xunzi; the only correct use of argument was to convince someone of the truth. Even the work of trying to distinguish logical categories was not productive in his view. According to Xunzi, such work can accomplish something, but it is still not the province of the gentlemen, much as wondering about the workings of nature are not the gentlemen’s concern, either. The only proper object of study is the Way of the sages; anything else is at best useless and at worst detrimental to the Way.

Despite his professed disinterest in logic, Xunzi came up with the most detailed philosophy of language in early Confucian thought. Again, however, his primary concern was preserving the Way in the face of attacks, which in Xunzi's view included questions about the nature of language that were arising at the time. He defended a modified conventionalism concerning language: names were not intrinsically appropriate for the objects they referred to, but once usage was determined by convention, to depart from it is wrong. It would be a mistake to think of Xunzi’s view as a kind of nominalism, however, since he is very clear that there is an objective reality that names refer to. The particular phonemes used to make the word "cat" in language are conventionally determined, but the fact that a cat is a kind of feline is real. One of the fundamental principles of Confucianism was that the reality must match the name. Confucian thinkers were most concerned about the names of social roles: a father must act like a father should, a ruler must act like a ruler should. Not fulfilling the demands of one’s role means that one does not deserve the title, hence Mencius defined the removal of a tyrant as the killing of a commoner, not regicide. Xunzi defended this view, yet he objected to the Mohists, who claimed that a robber is not a person, so that killing a robber is not killing a person. This kind of usage violated the principles of correct naming and departed from the Way, though Xunzi is not entirely clear why. In Xunzi’s view, the reality represented by a name is objective, even if the name is merely conventional. Because of the objectivity of referent, he distinguishes appropriate (following convention) and inappropriate (violating convention) uses of names. In addition, he believes there are good and bad names. Good names are simple and direct and readily bring the referent to mind. Using names in a way that the referents are clear is using names correctly. The chief function of language is to communicate, and anything that interferes with communication, such as the word games and paradoxes of other philosophers, should be eliminated.

5. Social and Political Thought

a. Government structure

The Warring States period, during which Xunzi lived, was a time of great social change and instability. As the name implies, it was a period of disunity, when several different states were warring with each other to determine who would gain control of all of China and found a new dynasty. Under the pressure of competition, the old ways and political systems were being abandoned in the search for greater control over human and material resources and increased military power. The central question for most philosophers of the time was how to respond to this time of instability and achieve a greater measure of order and safety. For the Confucian philosophers, the answer was found in a revival of the ways of the past, and for Xunzi in particular, the most important aspect of that was the ritual system. In this sense, the ethical and political aspects of Xunzi's philosophy are the core areas, and in fact were not sharply distinguished in most Confucian thought. Metaphysics and philosophy of language serve to further the goal of restoring social stability.

All of the Warring States philosophers assumed that the government should be a monarchy. The king was the ultimate authority in all areas of government, having full power to hire and dismiss (and execute) any other government official. There was no idea of democracy in early China. The ruler could lose his state through failing in his duties as a sovereign, but he could not be replaced at the whim of the people. The political thinkers of the time instead tried to impose checks through tradition and thought, rather than law. The Mohists made Heaven the watchdog over the ruler: if a ruler offended Heaven by mistreating the people, Heaven would have him removed through war or revolt. The Confucians also emphasized the duties of the ruler to the people, though in Xunzi's case there was no personified Heaven watching over things. One of the functions of ritual was to try to put limits on the power of the ruler and emphasize his obligation to the people. Confucian thinkers, including Xunzi often viewed the state as a family. Just as a father must take care of his children, the ruler must take care of the people, and in return, the people will respond with loyalty. The Confucians also offered a very practical motive to care for the people: if the people were dissatisfied with the ruler, they would not fight on his behalf, and the state would be ripe for annexation by its neighbors.

b. Ritual and Music

Xunzi diagnosed the main cause of disorder as a breakdown of the social hierarchy. When hierarchical distinctions are confused and people do not follow their proper roles, they compete indiscriminately to satisfy their desires. The way to put limits on this competition is to clarify social distinctions: such as between ruler and subject, between older brother and younger brother, or between men and women. When everyone knows their place and what obligations and privileges they have, they will not contend for goods beyond their status. Not only will this result in order and stability, it actually will allow for greater satisfaction of everyone's desires than the competition of the state of nature. This is the primary purpose of ritual: to clarify and enforce social distinctions, which will bring an end to contention for limited resources and improve social order. This, in turn, will ensure greater prosperity. The ritual tradition not only emphasized reciprocal obligations between people of different status, it had extremely precise regulations concerning who was allowed to own what kind of luxuries. There were rules concerning what colors of clothing different people could wear, who was allowed to ride in carriages, and what grave goods they could be buried with. The point of all these rules is to enforce the distinctions necessary for social harmony and prevent people from reaching beyond their station.

Without the benefit of ritual principles to enforce the social hierarchy, the identity of human nature makes conflict inevitable. By nature we all desire the same things: fine food, beautiful clothing, wealth, and comfort. Xunzi believes desires are inevitable. When most people see something beautiful, they will desire it: only the sage can control his desires. Because of limited resources, it is impossible for everyone to satisfy their desires for material goods. What people can do is decide whether to act on a desire or not. Ritual teaches people to channel, moderate, and in some cases transform their desires so they can satisfy them in appropriate ways. When it is right to do so one satisfies them, and when that is not possible one moderates them. This allows both the partial satisfaction of desires and the maintenance of social harmony. All of this is made possible by the ritual principles of the Way, when the alternative is the chaos of the state of nature. Hence, Xunzi wrote that Confucian teachings allow people to satisfy both the demands of ritual and their desires, when the alternative is satisfying neither.

Another important part of governing is music. The ancient Chinese believed that music was the most direct and effective way of influencing the emotions. Hence, only allowing the correct music to be played was crucial to governing the state. The right kinds of music, those attributed to the ancient sages, could both give people an outlet for emotions that could not be satisfied in other ways, like aggression, and channel their emotions and bring them in line with the Way. The wrong kind of music would instead encourage wanton, destructive behavior and cause a breakdown of social order. Because of its powerful effect on the emotions, music is as important a tool as ritual in moral education and in governing. Much as Plato suggested in the Republic, Xunzi believes regulating music is one of the duties of the state. It must promulgate the correct music to give people a legitimate source of emotional expression and ban unorthodox music to prevent it from upsetting the balance of society.

c. Moral Power

As he does with virtuous people, Xunzi distinguishes different levels of rulers. The lowest is the ruler who relies on military power to expand his territory, taxes excessively without regard for whether his people have enough to sustain themselves, and keeps them in line with laws and punishments. According to Xunzi, such a ruler is sure to come to a bad end. A ruler who governs efficiently, does not tax the people too harshly, gathers people of ability around him, and makes allies of the neighboring states can become a hegemon. The institution of the hegemon existed briefly about three hundred years before Xunzi's time, but he often uses the term to connote an effective ruler who is still short of the highest level. The highest level is that of the true king who wins the hearts of the people through his rule by ritual principles. The moral power of the true king is so great that he can unify the whole country without a single battle, since the people will come to him of their own accord to live under his beneficent rule. According to Xunzi, this is how the sage kings of the past were able to unify the country even though they began as rulers of small states. The best kind of government is government through the moral power acquired by following the Way.

This concept of moral power was quite old in China even in Xunzi's time, though initially it referred to the power gained from the spirits through sacrifice. Beginning with Confucius, it become ethicized into a kind of power or charisma that anyone who cultivated virtue and followed the Way developed. Through this moral power, a king could rule effectively without having to personally attend to the day-to-day business of governing. Following his example, the people would become virtuous as well, so crime would be minimal, and the ruler’s subordinates could carry out the necessary administrative tasks to run the state. In Confucian thought, the most important role of the ruler is that of moral example, which is why the best government was that of a sage who followed the ritual principles of the Way. Confucius seemed to believe that the moral power of a sage king would render laws and punishments completely unnecessary: the people would be transformed by the ruler’s moral power and never transgress the boundaries of what is right. Xunzi, while still believing in the efficacy of rule through moral force, is not quite as optimistic, which is likely related to his view on human nature. He thinks punishments will still be necessary because some people will break the law, but a sage king will only rarely need to employ punishments to keep the people in line, while a lord-protector or ordinary ruler will have to resort to them much more. This increased acceptance of the necessity for punishments may have influenced Xunzi’s student Han Feizi, to whom is attributed the most developed theory of government through a strict system of rewards and punishments that was employed by the short-lived Qin dynasty.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cua, Antonio S. Ethical Argumentation: A Study in Hsün Tzu's Moral Epistemology. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1985.
  • Dubs, Homer H. Hsüntze: Moulder of Ancient Confucianism. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1927. The first English-language monograph on Xunzi's thought.
  • Goldin, Paul. Rituals of the Way. Chicago: Open Court, 1999. A good overview of the essentials of Xunzi's thought.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. Confucian Moral Self Cultivation. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000. An introduction to Confucian thought, focusing on the theme of self cultivation. Includes a chapter on Xunzi.
  • Kline, T.C. III and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds. Virtue, Nature, and Moral Agency in the Xunzi. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000. An excellent anthology bringing together much of the recent important work on Xunzi. The bibliography includes virtually every English publication related to Xunzi.
  • Knoblock, John, trans. Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works, 3 vols. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1988, 1990, 1994. The only complete English translation of the Xunzi, with extensive introductory material.
  • Machle, Edward. Nature and Heaven in the Xunzi: A Study of the Tian Lun. Albany: SUNY Press, 1993. A translation and study of chapter seventeen, "Discourse on Heaven."
  • Watson, Burton, trans. Hsün Tzu: Basic Writings. New York: Columbia University Press, 1964. An excerpted translation, including many of the more philosophically interesting chapters. It is easier for non-specialists than Knoblock.

Author Information

David Elstein
Email: davidelstein@world.oberlin.edu
State University of New York at New Paltz
U. S. A.




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