Yang Xiong (Yang Hsiung) was a prolific yet reclusive court poet whose writings and tragic life spanned the collapse of the Former Han dynasty (202 BCE-9 CE) and the brief and catastrophic usurpation of the throne by the Imperial Regent Wang Mang (9-23 CE). He is best known for his assertion that human nature originally is neither good (as argued by Mencius) nor depraved (as argued by Xunzi) but rather comes into existence as a mixture of both. Yang Xiong’s chief philosophical writings – an abstruse book of divination known as the Tai xuan (The Great Dark Mystery) and his Fa yan (Words to Live By), a collection of aphorisms and dialogues on a variety of historical and philosophical topics – are little known even among Chinese scholars. These works combine a Daoist concern for cosmology, but may be best described as a product of the intellectual and spiritual syncretism characteristic of the Han dynasty (202 BCE-220 CE). As a social critic and classical scholar, he is considered to be the chief representative of the Old Text School (guxue) of Confucianism. Although some think he was one of the most important writers of the late Former Han, he had little influence during his own time and was vilified for his association with the usurper Wang Mang. Consequently, his works have largely been left out of the Confucian canon.
Yang Xiong was born in 53 BCE in the western city of Chengdu in the province of Shu. His biography in the Qian Han Shu (History of the Former Han) remarks that Yang Xiong was fond of learning, was unconcerned with wealth, office, and reputation, and suffered from a speech impediment and consequently spoke little. As a youth he probably was a student of Zhuang Zun, a reclusive marketplace fortune teller who refused to take office, opting instead to use divination and fortune-telling as a means to encourage virtue among the common people. Before coming to the capital he gained renown for his poetic writings, in particular for his fu, a poetic genre associated with an earlier native of Shu, Sima Xiangru (179-117 BCE). Yang Xiong’s reputation as a poet eventually reached the capital of Chang’an, and around 20 BCE he was summoned to the court of Emperor Cheng. Between the years 14-10 BCE, Yang Xiong submitted several poetic pieces commemorating imperial sacrifices and hunts, and finally in 10 BCE he was appointed to the humble office of “Gentleman in Attendance” and “Servitor at the Yellow Gate,” where he would remain until his final days. While not much is known of Yang Xiong’s activities as a lowly official at the Han court, it appears that, as far back as 9 BCE, Emperor Cheng issued a decree excusing him from the direct official service, while maintaining an official title, salary, and access to the imperial library for him.
Shortly after his appointment, Yang Xiong became disillusioned with the rectifying power of his poetry and stopped writing it for the court. Yang Xiong’s decision appears to have coincided with the death of his son, a tragedy which left him despondent and financially impoverished. Over the next two decades he produced his two works on philology: Cang Jie xun zuan (Annotations to the Cang Jie), a compilation of annotations to the Qin dynasty’s official imperial dictionary, and Fang yan (Dialects), a collection of regional expressions. During this period, he also produced his Tai xuan (The Great Dark Mystery), which he completed around 2 BCE, and Fa yan (Words to Live By), which he completed in 9 CE – right about the time that the Imperial Regent Wang Mang usurped the throne and established the brief Xin dynasty (9-23 CE).
Yang Xiong’s life and writings were overshadowed by the rise and fall of the notorious Wang Mang (45 BCE-23 CE). A nephew of the wife of Emperor Yuan (who reigned 48-32 BCE), Wang Mang rose to the rank of Imperial Regent. In 9 CE, through a combination of court intrigue, political machinations, manipulation of popular superstitions, and opportunity, he seized the throne from the founding House of Liu and declared himself the rightful possessor of the Mandate of Heaven. His short-lived Xin dynasty marks the dividing line between the Former or Western Han (202 BCE-9 CE) and the Later or Eastern Han (25-220 CE) and, due to widespread rebellion and a series of natural catastrophes, is widely considered one of the most calamitous periods in Chinese history.
While little is known of Yang Xiong’s activities during his final years, his biography notes that, shortly after Wang Mang’s usurpation Yang Xiong attempted suicide when he was named in a scandal involving one of his former students. He survived the attempt. When Wang Mang heard of it, he ordered all charges against Yang Xiong dropped, proclaiming that the poet had never been involved in any political affairs at court. His final work, Ju qin mei xin, appears to have been a controversial memorial presented to Wang Mang around 14 CE; its title is translated by Knechtges as Denigrating Qin and Praising Xin. Yang Xiong died four years later at the age of 71.
The focus of Yang Xiong’s writings during the middle years of his life is commonly seen as reflecting the Han trend toward syncretism and correlative cosmology. While the disunity of the Warring States period (475-221 BCE) provided fertile soil for the flourishing of the “One Hundred Schools of Thought” (baijia), the unification brought about by the Qin (221-206 BCE) and the Former Han dynasties provided the impetus for their coalescence. This combination of diverse views during the Qin and the Han periods can be seen in works such as the Lushi chunqiu (The Spring and Autumn Annals of Mr. Lu) and the Huainanzi (The Master of Huainan), which blend various streams of ancient Chinese thought, including Daoism, Confucianism, Legalism, Huang-Lao thought, Militarism, Mohism, and yinyang and wuxing (Five Phase) thought.
Though Confucianism became the dominant and official school of thought in the Han, it borrowed heavily from earlier schools, particularly the yinyang and wuxing schools. The former explains all entities and events in terms of the interaction between two interdependent properties, yin (associated with darkness, passivity, and femininity) and yang (associated with light, activity, and masculinity). The latter takes a similar approach to understanding natural phenomena but includes the idea that “Five Phases” (each associated with metal, wood, water, fire, and earth, respectively) succeed one another in a never-ending cyclical process. The amalgamation of Confucianism, yinyang, and wuxing theory is especially evident in the writings of the scholar Dong Zhongshu (179-104 BCE), whose Chunqiu fanlu (Luxuriant Dew of the Spring and Autumn Annals) illustrates a synthesis between Confucian ethics and an amalgam of yinyang and wuxing cosmology. Attempts to develop exhaustive systems of classification (leishu) were also common during this period and can be seen as part of the larger trend toward syncretization. These tables often use a Five Phase cosmological framework in which things are organized analogically on the basis of their relevant associations, rather than on the basis of some discrete essence. As can be seen in Yang Xiong’s Tai xuan, the correlations which form the basis of these classification systems can be bewildering – especially to anyone unfamiliar with the sorts of complex associations found in early Chinese culture.
Many historians of Chinese philosophy have identified Yang Xiong’s final and best-known work, the Fa yan (Words to Live By), as representative of a more rational and sober-minded form of Confucianism known as the Old Text School (guxue). In contrast to the New Text School, which relied on versions of the classics written in the simpler and officially recognized script of the Han dynasty known as “new script” (jinwen), the Old Text School relied on versions written in the archaic scripts (guwen) and characters of the Zhou dynasty (c. 1100-221 BCE). Legend has it that these latter texts survived the book burnings of the Qin dynasty by lying concealed in the walls of the home of Confucius. Generally speaking, the Old Text School was associated with the simpler, more pragmatic philosophy of Confucius’s native state of Lu, while the New Text school was associated with the often fantastic writings of Zou Yan (305-240 BCE), a native of Qi and founder of the yinyang and wuxing schools of thought.
Through much of the late Former Han dynasty, Confucianism was under the influence of the yinyang and wuxing theories promoted by New Text adherents. During this period, New Text scholars increasingly became interested in esoteric readings of the classics, cosmological speculation, and calamity and portent interpretation. The chief representatives of this period were classical scholars who commonly employed wuxing and yinyang correlations, numerical calculations, and various techniques of divination to fathom the harmony and continuity of humanity, nature, and the ancestral spirits – and to forecast disruptions.
By the reigns of the last Former Han Emperors, the use of yinyang and wuxing theory in interpreting the classics and the progress of history closely paralleled methods found in apocryphal oracle books and commentaries that treated the classics as fortune-telling handbooks and used reports of unusual phenomena not to boldly admonish the Emperor – as did Zou Yan and Dong Zhongshu – but to curry favor with those in power. This trend reached its climax with Wang Mang, whose rise to power and eventual usurpation was associated with, and to a large extent legitimated by, hundreds of favorable omens and the generous rewarding of those who reported them.
While scholars are divided on whether the Old Text School originated from Xunzi’s branch of Confucianism, most characterize this movement as a rational response to the excesses of the New Text school, whose influence had left the Han court and its scholars heavily dependent upon yinyang and wuxing thinking. More broadly, the Old Text school can be seen as a response to the often irrational and superstitious world of the late Former Han – a world that interpreted the classics as containing secret magical formulas and prognostications, was fascinated by talk of immortals, saw itself near the bottom in the historical cycle of rise and decline, and interpreted the passing of each childless Emperor and reports of calamities as portents to be dreaded.
Completed around 2 BCE, the Tai xuan is Yang Xiong’s longest and most difficult work. Few scholars have taken time to study it, and those who have often disagree about its import. Some scholars view the main focus of the text to be wuxing theory, others view its main focus to be the Five Constant Virtues (wuchang) of Confucianism, and still others view the Tai xuan as political satire of Wang Mang and other historical figures of the late Former Han. (See Michael Nylan’s translation and commentary of the Tai Xuan (1993)). While the Tai xuan is more a manual of divination than a philosophical treatise, it embodies a number of assumptions about the nature of the world, its cycles of transformation, and the central importance of timeliness in making one’s way in the world. Just as in his earlier poetry, in the Tai xuan Yang Xiong reiterates the view that success and failure do not all come down to individual effort but have much to do with the times and circumstances in which one lives, and that if one does not meet one’s proper time for acting, then one should retire or withdraw and wait for more advantageous times.
The term xuan in the title is typically used in Chinese literature as a modifier to describe that which is dark, black, mysterious, profound, abstruse or hidden. Yang Xiong, however, uses the term xuan much like the term dao in the Laozi to refer to the hidden fountainhead or initial state out of which things emerge and the mysterious process through which they unfold. While Yang Xiong’s conception of xuan seems to be derived from the Laozi, the text of the Tai xuan is modeled on the Yijing (Book of Changes), certainly the most enigmatic philosophical document in early Chinese literature. Like the Yijing, the Tai xuan is a book of divination based on an evolving sequence of figures that, when taken together, map out the cycles of transformation underlying all things. In both texts, each figure-image-circumstance is articulated through an evolving series of statements that describes and appraises the unfolding of the situation and the meaning of the image. Appended to both the Yijing and the Tai xuan is a set of commentaries that elaborates on the inner meanings of their respective texts.
In some ways, the Tai xuan is even more complex than its model. While the Yijing is made up of 64 hexagrams, the Tai xuan is made up of 81 tetragrams. In the Yijing, each hexagram line can be solid or broken (representing the polarities of yin and yang). In the Tai xuan, each tetragram line can be solid, broken once, or broken twice (representing the triad of heaven, earth, and man), and each of the 81 tetragrams is correlated with, among other things, yin or yang, one of the “Five Phases,” a hexagram from the Yijing, a constellation, days of the calendar, and a musical note.
In the Tai xuan, each tetragram is articulated though an evolving series of nine appraisals or judgments (whereas in the Yijing, each hexagram is articulated through a series of six line statements). These line appraisals unfold in a cyclical pattern corresponding to periods of time, the transformations of yin and yang, and a continuous cycle of commencement, maturity and decline. The appraisals can also be divided into those that address the commoner, the noble, and the Emperor.
Also, the often obscure correlative-poetic organization of the images and their associated line appraisals can be seen in the Tai xuan commentary “Numbers of the Dark Mystery,” an example of the Han genre of classificatory works known as leishu. For example, “Numbers of the Mystery” correlates the number five with the earth, the color yellow, fear, wind omens, tumuli, the naked animal (humankind), fur, bottles, weaving, sleeping mats, complying, verticality, glue, sacks, hubs, calves, coffins, bows and arrows, stupidity, and the center courtyard rain well. The basis of these associations is analogical; A is to B as C is to D. The organization scheme is fivefold. The five numerical categories (three and eight, four and nine, two and seven, one and six, and five) correspond to the five directions (east, west, south, north, center), the five phases (wood, metal, fire, water, earth), the seasons (spring, autumn, summer, winter, four seasons), the five colors (green, white, red, black, yellow), the five trades (carpentry, metal smithing, working with fire, waterworks, earth works), and the like.
Unlike Yang Xiong’s other works, the dating of the Fa yan is fairly certain. In the final passage of the text, there is a reference to Wang Mang as the Duke of Han. The fact that Wang Mang held this title from 1-9 CE implies that the Fa yan could not have been submitted after 9 CE when he took the title of Emperor. In Fa yan 13:34 there is a reference to the Han dynasty as having ruled for 210 years. If the founding of the Han is taken to be 202 BCE, then the passage would have been written no earlier than 8 CE. Whatever the date of completion, there is little doubt that the Fa Yan was written during a period when Wang Mang held in his hands the reigns of power and the destiny of his sovereign. It remains his best-known work.
In his autobiography, Yang Xiong notes that, just as he modeled his Tai xuan on the greatest of the classics, the Yijing, so he modeled his Fa yan on the text he saw as the greatest of the commentaries – the Confucian Lunyu (Analects). Like the Lunyu, the Fa yan consists of a series of aphorisms and dialogues on a wide variety of historical and philosophical topics. Also like the Lunyu, the language of the Fa yan is archaic, its style terse, and its organization puzzling. While the form, language, and style of the Fa yan all seem to be derived from the Lunyu, the two works are most similar in their underlying concerns.
Both the Lunyu and the Fa Yan focus on the perennial Confucian theme of self-cultivation while emphasizing the importance of learning, friendship, role models, rites and music, and the human virtues. Both works look back to the ancient sage kings, the ways of the Zhou dynasty, and the teachings of the classics as models for their own troubled times. Each work has been read as a subtle attack on the predominant political powers. Finally, both the Lunyu and Fa yan can be characterized as works of frustration that lament the political instability of their respective times, the tendency of princes and officials to overstep their roles, and the failure of Confucius (Kongzi) and Yang Xiong to gain recognition or to exercise political influence.
Among the disjointed sayings and dialogues of the Fa yan, one finds a wide variety of topics and themes. As noted, the most central of these are the perennial Confucian themes: self-cultivation, learning, the natural tendencies, the human virtues, the value of the classics, rites and music, the princely person, the sage, ruling, filial responsibility, and so forth. One also finds in the Fa yan discussions of concepts and themes usually associated with Daoism such as dao (way), de (potency), ziran (spontaneity), wuwei (non-coercive action), minimizing desire, and withdrawing from public life. These topics are often explicated through discussions of an unusually broad assortment of historical figures, including poets, philosophers, rhetoricians, rulers, officials, generals, merchants, rebels, assassins, jesters, recluses, and others. These topics are similarly interpreted through discussions of historical events, such as the collapse of the Zhou dynasty, the intrigues of the Warring States, the rise of the Qin dynasty and its rapid fall, the struggle between Xiang Ji (233-202 BCE) and the Han dynastic founder Liu Bang (247-195 BCE), and the founding of the Han dynasty.
Also included among the numerous topics discussed in the Fa yan are more immediate concerns of the late Former Han. These include the assimilation of heterodox teachings and popular superstitions into commentaries and interpretations of the classics, the decline of the ruling house of Han, the popularity of portents and the rise of Wang Mang, and government reforms in taxation, punishment, division of land, and relations with barbarian tribes. Finally, there are sayings and dialogues which address the concerns of scholar officials living not only in the troubled late Former Han, but throughout much of China’s long history – the practicality and viability of the Confucian way of life, the vanity of the desires for wealth, office and renown, and the challenges of surviving and maintaining one’s integrity in a time of disorder.
Throughout the Fa yan, Yang Xiong sets the tone for subsequent representatives of the Old Text School by repeatedly poking fun at questions on magic, immortals, spirits, omens and portents, and esoteric interpretations of the classics. Instead he redirects attention toward concerns directly affecting the living: wealth and poverty, gain and loss, glory and disgrace, success and failure, friendship, joy, integrity, the dangers of public office, ruling the Empire, fate and circumstance, fleeing the world, and death. While the Tai xuan might be described as a synthesis of the various schools of early Chinese thought, the Fa yan elevates the Confucian school above all the others. In aphorism after aphorism, the Fa yan praises Confucius and the classics as the standards, stresses the importance of learning, rites and music, the five virtues, the five relations, and filial responsibility, while at the same time offering sardonic remarks on Daoist, Legalist, and yinyang and wuxing thinkers and their doctrines.
On governing, the Fa yan can be seen as advancing a Reformist position. While the literary world of the late Former Han is often explicated in terms of the New and the Old Text schools, the political world of this period is similarly explicated in terms of two opposing camps: Modernists who, like earlier Legalists, advocated policies that sought to enrich the wealth and power of the state through conquering border tribes, opening trade routes, and establishing government monopolies, and Reformists who accused Modernists of ignoring the welfare of the people and advocated instead for a more frugal form of government that emphasized retrenchment in foreign policy, abolition of government monopolies, and land reform. In the Fa yan, Yang Xiong aligns himself with the Reformists by speaking out against government monopolies and expensive military campaigns and voices support for an easing of heavy burdens on the populace and the reinstitution of Zhou dynasty practices and policies.
The Reformist tone of the Fa yan gives credence to the association of Yang Xiong with “the Usurper,” Wang Mang, which has become standard throughout generations of Chinese scholarship. While Wang Mang’s rise to power met with opposition and spurred a number of insurrections, he seems to have found support in the ranks of court scholars for his display of Confucian virtue and his attempts to reorganize the social institutions of the Han along the lines of the Zhou dynasty – the system of rites and institutions highly prized by Confucian scholars since the Warring States period. Some have even seen Wang Mang as genuine in his espousal of Confucian ideals and as a sincere believer that reviving the institutions and rites of the Zhou dynasty would lead to a period of great peace and harmony. The more typical view, dating back to the account of Ban Gu (32-92 CE) in the Qian Han Shu (History of the Former Han), portrays Wang Mang as an ambitious, duplicitous, and murderous charlatan who rebelled against his sovereign and left the Empire in ruins.
Little is known of Yang Xiong’s actual political leanings in the face of Wang Mang’s rise to power. Those who portray Yang Xiong as a Wang Mang partisan point to the fact that, when Wang Mang declared himself Emperor, Yang Xiong did not commit suicide or leave court to become a recluse as did many other Han officials. His supporters, however, point out that, in his earlier poetic works and in the Fa yan, Yang Xiong has a great deal to say – most of it critical – about men who, in the name of principle, committed suicide or fled to the mountains. As noted above, it appears that Yang Xiong preferred instead to follow his teacher Zhuang Zun – though not as a recluse among men, but as a recluse at court. Although the Fa yan was written during Wang Mang’s rise in power and apparently finished shortly before his usurpation, he is mentioned only once in it. Nonetheless, some read the text as an apology for Wang Mang’s usurpation and the Confucian reforms he attempted to institute. Others read the Fa yan as consisting of a number of cleverly veiled attacks on Wang Mang’s penchant for superstition, his insatiable ambition, and his pretense to being a humble Confucian.
Some passages of the Fa yan have been read as offering neither flattery nor ridicule but bold admonitions, counseling Wang Mang to remember his filial duties and to return the reigns of power to the rightful ruler. For example, in Fa yan 8:21, there is a terse passage that reads, “The Red and Black Bows and Arrows do not amount to having it.” Centuries earlier the Imperial house of the Zhou dynasty awarded princes a set of bows and arrows as symbol of investiture to punish all within their jurisdiction. In an attempt to follow this ancient tradition, a set of red and black bows and arrows was awarded to Wang Mang in 5 CE as part of the “Conferment of the Nine Distinctions” bestowed on him by ministers, officials, and scholars of the Han court. While commentators uniformly read the phrase “red and black bows and arrows” in Fa yan 8:21 as a reference to this award, they are divided over its meaning. While some see 8:21 as flattering praise, others see it as reminding Wang Mang that having been bestowed the honor of the “Red and Black Bows and Arrows” does not amount to the possession of the mandate.
The passage most frequently cited as evidence of Yang Xiong’s political leanings is found in Fa yan 13:34, where Wang Mang is compared to two of the greatest ministers in Chinese history: Zhou Gong (the Duke of Zhou, c. 12th century BCE) and Yi Yin (c. 18th century BCE). Given the location of this passage at the very end of the text, some have considered it to be a forgery. Others have seen it as a flattering endorsement of Wang Mang. The great Neo-Confucian philosopher Zhu Xi (1130-1200 CE), for example, reads this passage as lavish praise of Wang Mang’s achievements and, on the basis of it, dismisses Yang Xiong as “Wang Mang’s Grandee.” Still others have seen it as admonishing Wang Mang to be like Yi Yin and Zhou Gong before him and to return the reigns of power to his rightful sovereign. It is important to point out that, like Wang Mang, both Yi Yin and Zhou Gong served as Imperial Regents. Like Yi Yin, Wang Mang stood in the wings through a series of short-lived reigns. As in the case of Yi Yin, it fell on Wang Mang to name a successor to the throne. Both Yi Yin and Wang Mang served as regents while their hand-picked successors lacked maturity. But while Yi Yin and Zhou Gong are remembered for handing back the reigns of power, Wang Mang is popularly remembered in the chengyu (proverb) as one who “usurped the Han and named himself Emperor.”
As Wing-tsit Chan and others have pointed out, the view for which Yang Xiong has become most famous – that human nature is a mixture of good and evil – is articulated only in a single passage of the Fa yan (3:2) and is not elaborated any further:
Human nature is a muddle [hun] of good and evil tendencies. Cultivating the good tendencies makes a person good. Cultivating the evil ones makes a person depraved. This force [qi] - is it not like a horse that drives one towards good or evil?
This hardly amounts to the kind of sustained development of a view of human nature found, for example, in the work of Mencius or Xunzi, who represent opposite poles on the continuum of ancient Chinese views of human nature. Nonetheless, Yang Xiong’s view here, although undefended in philosophical terms, contradicts Mencius’ view that human nature originally is good and can only be warped (but never entirely destroyed) through neglect or negative influences. After Mencius’ view became the orthodox one among Confucians, especially during the Neo-Confucian movement of medieval and early modern China, Yang Xiong’s work came in for a great deal of criticism from Confucians. Thus, rather like Xunzi, Yang Xiong may be seen as something of a black sheep among early Confucians because of his deviation from what became Confucian orthodoxy in a later age.
Before being summoned to court, Yang Xiong wrote a number of poetic pieces of which only one – Fan sao (Refuting Sorrow) – survives. As Yang Xiong explains in his autobiography, Fan Sao was written in response to Li sao (Encountering Sorrow), a poem by the legendary Warring States poet Qu Yuan (340-278 BCE). According to the Shiji (Historical Records) account, Qu Yuan served as a trusted official to King Huai of Chu, but, after he was slandered by a jealous minister, he fell from favor and was exiled. Qu Yuan desperately wished to return to the service of King Huai, but in the end he gave up hope and after composing Li sao, he drowned himself.
While Yang Xiong’s Fan sao is similar in style to Qu Yuan’s Li sao, its outlook is very different. Qu Yuan saw suicide as the only option left to persons of character living in a corrupt age. Yang Xiong, on the other hand, compares Qu Yuan’s response to failure in the political sphere with the response of Confucius. Unlike Qu Yuan, Confucius’s disappointments in searching for rulers who would employ him in “making good government” did not stop him from living a full life of travel, teaching, and writing. Here and in his later philosophical works, we find Yang Xiong maintaining that success and failure do not come down to individual effort but have much to do with the times and circumstances in which one lives. If one does not meet one’s proper time for acting, then one should retire or withdraw and like a snake or dragon lie submerged or like a phoenix remain concealed and wait for more advantageous times.
While at court, Yang Xiong composed a number of primarily autobiographical poetic pieces where he reflects on his poverty, lowly position, lack of recognition, and the ridicule and difficulties these frustrations have engendered. In Jie chao (Dissolving Ridicule), for example, Yang Xiong portrays himself as ridiculed for his low position and his failure to influence the court. In responding, Yang Xiong reiterates a familiar theme in his writings, arguing that in an age beset with chaos, it is better to remain silent and unknown since, as David R. Knechtges translates it, “those who grab for power die, and those who remain silent survive; those who reach the highest positions endanger their family, while those who maintain themselves intact survive.” In Zhu bin (Expelling Poverty), Yang Xiong expels an unwelcome guest named “Poverty” whose lingering presence in the poet’s life has labored his body and afflicted his health, cut him off from friends, and slowed his promotion in office. After listening to Yang Xiong vent, Poverty humbly agrees to leave, but first reminds Yang Xiong of the virtue of the impoverished sage Shun, warns him of the greed of the tyrants Jie and Zhi, and offers the consolation that it is only because of his privation that the poet is able to bear heat and cold, and to live freely with equanimity. Enlightened, Yang Xiong apologizes to Poverty and welcomes him as an honored guest.
Yang Xiong wrote several pieces in a genre known as fu, a term translated by Knechtges as “rhapsody.” Marked by its florid imagery and ecstatic tone, this genre was commonly employed by Han court officials as a means of offering indirect criticism and admonition to the Emperor. As Knechtges points out, most of the well known early writers of rhapsodies, such as Lu Jia (228-140 BCE) and Jia Yi (200-168 BCE), were not only poets but also scholar-officials who saw it as their duty to offer advice and remonstrance (jian) to rulers and did so through their poetic works. In the rhapsodies of later Former Han writers like Sima Xiangru, however, verbal decoration and entertainment took precedence over instruction and admonition.
In his early years at the court of Emperor Cheng, Yang Xiong submitted a number of rhapsodies. At first glance, these works appear to be little more than ornate, fanciful, and flattering descriptions of Imperial spectacles. In Fa yan (Words to Live By) and in the autobiographical section of his biography, however, Yang Xiong stresses that, like earlier poets, he envisioned the primary purpose of these works to be remonstrance – a dangerous political task widely recognized as one of the most central duties of the Confucian scholar. While, on the surface, Yang Xiong’s rhapsodies heap lavish praise on the Emperor, they also contain stern reprimands and warning. For example, within the fanciful descriptions of Imperial grandeur found in the Ganquan fu (Sweet Springs Rhapsody), Yang Xiong indirectly admonishes Emperor Cheng to be more solemn in conducting affairs, suggesting through allusion that, like the lascivious tyrant kings Jie and Xia, Emperor Cheng’s wanton conduct would lead to his downfall. In the Jiaolie fu (Barricade Hunt Rhapsody) and the Changyang fu (Changyang Palace Rhapsody), both of which commemorate imperial hunts, Yang Xiong indirectly criticizes the hunts as lavish, wasteful spectacles that burden the peasants and destroy their farms and farmlands. In his later writings, Yang Xiong claims that he eventually came to see the ornate style of rhapsody as excessive, and realizing that the moral admonitions he tried to provide had gone unheeded (if not unnoticed), he renounced it. He never gave up writing poetry altogether, however.
There are very few published studies of Yang Xiong in English. Of these, Nylan’s pioneering translation and commentary of the Tai Xuan (1993) is the most complete account of Yang Xiong’s philosophy, while Knechtges’s studies of Yang Xiong’s fu poetry (1976, 1977) and his Qian Han Shu biography (1982) offer superb translations and interpretations of Yang Xiong’s life and literary works. Colvin (2001) provides a translation of the Fa yan and an examination of the seemingly haphazard organization of its aphorisms and dialogues. For a fuller understanding of Yang Xiong’s thought, readers are encouraged to explore the more general accounts of the literary, intellectual, and political contexts of the Former Han dynasty in Bielenstein (1984), Feng (1953), Loewe (1974, 1986), Thomsen (1988), Xiao (1979), and Yu (1967).
Slippery Rock University
Last updated: October 10, 2005 | Originally published: