Yinyang (yin-yang) is one of the dominant concepts shared by different schools throughout the history of Chinese philosophy. Just as with many other Chinese philosophical notions, the influences of yinyang are easy to observe, but its conceptual meanings are hard to define. Despite the differences in the interpretation, application, and appropriation of yinyang, three basic themes underlie nearly all deployments of the concept in Chinese philosophy: (1) yinyang as the coherent fabric of nature and mind, exhibited in all existence, (2) yinyang as jiao (interaction) between the waxing and waning of the cosmic and human realms, and (3) yinyang as a process of harmonization ensuring a constant, dynamic balance of all things. As the Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu) claims, “Yin in its highest form is freezing while yang in its highest form is boiling. The chilliness comes from heaven while the warmness comes from the earth. The interaction of these two establishes he (harmony), so it gives birth to things. Perhaps this is the law of everything yet there is no form being seen.”(Zhuangzi, Chapter 21). In none of these conceptions of yinyang is there a valuational hierarchy, as if yin could be abstracted from yang (or vice versa), regarded as superior or considered metaphysically separated and distinct. Instead, yinyang is emblematic of valuational equality rooted in the unified, dynamic, and harmonized structure of the cosmos. As such, it has served as a heuristic mechanism for formulating a coherent view of the world throughout Chinese intellectual and religious history.
The earliest Chinese characters for yin and yang are found in inscriptions made on “oracle bones” (skeletal remains of various animals used in ancient Chinese divination practices at least as early as the 14th century BCE). In these inscriptions, yin and yang simply are descriptions of natural phenomena such as weather conditions, especially the movement of the sun. There is sunlight during the day (yang) and a lack of sunlight at night (yin). According to the earliest comprehensive dictionary of Chinese characters (ca. 100 CE), Xu Shen’s Shuowen jiezi (Explaining Single-component Graphs and Analyzing Compound Characters), yin refers to “a closed door, darkness and the south bank of a river and the north side of a mountain.” Yang refers to “height, brightness and the south side of a mountain.” These meanings of yin and yang originated in the daily life experience of the early Chinese. Peasants depended on sunlight for lighting and their daily life routines. When the sun came out, they would go to the field to work; when the sun went down, they would return home to rest. This sun-based daily pattern evidently led to a conceptual claim: yang is movement (dong) and yin is rest (jing). In their earliest usages, yin and yang existed independently and were not connected. The first written record of using these two characters together appears in a verse from the Shijing (Book of Songs): “Viewing the scenery at a hill, looking for yinyang.” This indicates that yang is the sunny side and yin is the shady side of hill. This effect of the sun exists at the same time over the hill.
According to Sima Tan (Ssu-ma Tan, ca. 110 BCE), there existed a school of teaching during the “Spring and Autumn” (770-481 BCE) and “Warring States” (403-221 BCE) periods that bore the name of yinyang. He lists this yinyang school alongside five others (Confucian, Mohist, Legalist, Fatalist, and Daoist) and defines its theory as “the investigation of the shu [art] of yin and yang.” According to him, this school focused on omens of luck and explored the patterns of the four seasons. In other words, the yinyang school was concerned with methods of divination or astronomy (disciplines that were not distinct from one another in early China, as elsewhere in the ancient world) and the calendrical arts (which entailed study of the four seasons, eight locations, twelve du [measures] and twenty-four shijie [time periods]). Just as the Confucians (rujia) arose from the ranks of rushi (“scholar-gentlemen”) who excelled at ritual and music, those of the yingyang school came from the fangshi (“recipe-gentlemen”) who specialized in various numerological disciplines known as shushu (“number-arts”). These shushu included tianwen (astronomy), lipu (calendar-keeping), wuxing (“five phases” correlative theory), zhuguai (tortoise-shell divination), zazha (fortune-telling) and xingfa (face-reading). The Han dynasty chronicle Shiji (Records of the Historian) lists Zou Yan (305-240 BCE) as a representative of the yinyang school who possessed a profound knowledge of the theory of yinyang and wrote about a hundred thousand words on it. However, none of his works have survived.
By the Han dynasty (202 BCE-220 CE), yinyang was associated with wuxing (“five phases”) correlative cosmology. According to the “Great Plan” chapter of the Shujing (Classic of Documents), wuxing refers to material substances that have certain functional attributes: water is said to soak and descend; fire is said to blaze and ascend; wood is said to curve or be straight; metal is said to obey and change; earth is said to take seeds and give crops. Wuxing is used as a set of numerological classifiers and explains the configuration of change on various scales. The so-called yinyang wuxing teaching – an “early Chinese attempt in the direction of working out metaphysics and a cosmology” (Chan 1963: 245) – was a fusion of these two conceptual schemes applied to astronomy and the mantic arts.
The most enduring interpretation of yinyang in Chinese thought is related to the concept of qi (ch’i, vital energy). According to this interpretation, yin and yang are seen as qi (in both yin and yang forms) operating in the universe. In the “Duke Shao” chapter of the Zuozhuan (The Book of History), yin and yang are first defined as two of six heavenly qi:
There are six heavenly influences [qi] which descend and produce the five tastes, go forth in the five colours, and are verified in the five notes; but when they are in excess, they produce the six diseases. Those six influences are denominated the yin, the yang, wind, rain, obscurity, and brightness. In their separation, they form the four seasons; in their order, they form the five (elementary) terms. When any of them is in excess, they ensure calamity. An excess of the yin leads to diseases of cold; of the yang, to diseases of heat. (Legge 1994: 580).
Here, yin and yang are the qi of the universe. These qi flow within the natural as well as the human worlds. They are the basic fabric of existence:
Heaven and earth have their regular ways, and men like these for their pattern, imitating the brilliant bodies of Heaven, and according with the natural diversities of the Earth. (Heaven and Earth) produce the six atmospheric conditions [qi], and make use of the five material elements. Those conditions (and elements) become the five tastes, are manifested in the five colours, and displayed in the five notes. When they are in excess, there ensue obscurity and confusion, and people lose their (proper) nature… There were mildness and gentleness kindness and harmony, in imitation of the producing and nourishing action of Heaven. There are love and hatred, pleasure and anger, grief and joy, produced by the six atmosphere conditions [qi]. Therefore (the sage kings) carefully imitated these relations and analogies (in forming ceremonies), to regulate those six impulses…When there is no failure in the joy and grief, we have a state in harmony with the nature of Heaven and Earth, which consequently can endure long. ( Legge 1994: 708).
Thus qi, a force arising from the interplay between yin and yang, becomes a context in which yinyang is seated and functions. Yinyang as qi provides an explanation of the beginning of the universe and serves as a building block of the Chinese intellectual tradition. In many earlier texts, one may observe how yinyang generates a philosophical perspective on heaven, earth and human beings. Chapter 42 of the Laozi says that “everything is embedded in yin and embraces yang; through chong qi [vital energy] it reaches he [harmony].” It is through yinyang’s function as qi and the interaction between them that everything comes into existence. Zhuangzi also speaks about the “qi of yin and yang”: “When the qi of yin and yang are not in harmony, and cold and heat come in untimely ways, all things will be harmed.” (Zhuangzi ch. 31) On the other hand, “when the two have successful intercourse and achieve harmony, all things will be produced.” (Zhuangzi ch. 21)
The interpretation of yinyang as qi conceives yinyang as a dynamic and natural form of flowing energy, a complementary in the primordial potency of the universe. The Huainanzi offers more detailed explanation of the cosmological process of yin and yang:
When heaven and earth were formed, they divided into yin and yang. Yang is generated [sheng] from yin and yin is generated from yang. Yin and yang mutually alternate which makes four fields [wei, “celestial circles”] penetrate. Sometimes there is life, sometimes there is death, that brings the myriad things to completion. (ch. 2)
This process also explains the beginning of human life. When qi moved, the clear and light rose to be heaven and the muddy and heavy fell to become earth. When these two qi interacted and attained the stage of harmony (he), human life began. This shows that everything is made from the same materials and difference relies on the interaction.
Qi also takes on various forms and is convertible from one form to another with order and pattern. The concept of yinyang supplies a unitary vision of heaven, earth and human beings and makes the world intelligible in terms of a resonance between human beings and the universe. The Guoyu (Discourses of the States) describes how earthquakes took place at the confluence of the Jing, Wei, and Lou rivers during the second year of Duke You of the western Zhou dynasty. A certain Boyang Fu claims that the Zhou empire is doomed to collapse, explaining that
The qi of heaven and earth can’t lose its order. If its order vanishes people will be disoriented. Yang was stuck and could not get out, yin was suppressed and could not evaporate, so an earthquake was inevitable. Now the earthquakes around the three rivers are due to yang losing its place and yin being pressed down. Yang is forsaken under yin so the source of rivers has been blocked. If the foundation of rivers is blocked the country will definitely collapse. This is because of the fact that the flowing water and flourishing land are necessities for the people’s lives. If the water and land cannot sustain the people’s living conditions, the country will inevitably fall. (Discourse of the States 1994: 22).
Not only does this ¬yinyang-flavored explanation claim to illuminate natural phenomena, it also implies that there is an intrinsic relationship between natural events and political systems. Human beings, especially political leaders, must align their virtuous actions with the morally-oriented universe. If they follow and harmonize with (shun) the order and patterns of the universe, they will be rewarded with prosperity and flourishing, but if they go against and conflict with (ni) it, they will be punished with disasters and destruction. Whether one engages in shun or ni depends upon whether yin and yang are in a state of balance. Thus, yinyang provides a heuristic outlook for human understanding as well as ethical guidance for achieving harmony in action. As chapter 8 of the Huainanzi claims:
Yinyang embodies the harmony of heaven and earth, manifests the forms of myriad things, contains qi to transform the things and completes various kinds of things; yinyang extends and penetrates to the deepest level; begins in emptiness then becomes full and moves in boundless lands.
Yinyang also has been understood as some concrete substance (xingzhi), according to which yixing and yangxing define everything in the universe. In the Yijing (I-Ching, The Book of Changes), yinyang is presented as xingzhi. Yang was identified with the sun and yin with the moon:
Heaven and earth correlate with vast and profound; four seasons correlate with change and continuity [biantong]; the significance of yin and yang correlate with sun and moon; the highest excellence [zhide] correlates the goodness of easy and simple.(Sishu wujing 1990: 197)
The Guanzi, an important work of the Huang-Lao school, discusses this view along the same lines: “The sun is in charge of yang, the moon is in charge of yin, the stars are in charge of harmony [he].” (Guanzi 2000: 151). This xingzhi interpretation materializes the concept of yinyang in some concrete contexts and shows that the universe is orderly, moral and gendered. The pattern of the world is written in a gendered language. Yinyang is something one can see, feel, and grasp through the senses. For example, in the Liji (Book of Ritual), music represents the he (harmony) of heaven and earth, while li (ritual) represents the order of heaven and earth: “Music is coming from yang, ritual is coming from yin. The harmony of yinyang receives the myriad things.” (Sishu wujing 1990: 525) In the human world, male as yang should be cultivated, otherwise the day will suffer; female as yin should be cultivated too, otherwise the moon will be affected.
According to Dong Zhongshu, (195-115 BCE), both Tian (heaven) and human beings have yinyang. Therefore, there is an intrinsic connection between tian and human beings through the movement of yin and yang. Yinyang is an essential vehicle for interactions between heaven and human beings: “The qi of yinyang moves heaven above as well as in human beings. When it is among human beings it is displayed itself as like, dislike, happy and mad, when it is in heaven it is seen as warm, chilly, cold and hot.” (Dong Zhongshu 1996: 436) In Dong’s cosmological vision, the whole universe is a giant yinyang. One of many examples of this vision is Dong’s proposal to control floods and prevent droughts by proper human interaction. In chapter 74 (“Seeking the Rain”) of his Luxuriant Gems of the Spring and Autumn, Dong asserts that a spring drought indicates too much yang and not enough yin. So one should “open yin and close yang” (1996: 432) He suggests that the government should have the south gate closed, which is in the direction of yang. Men, embodying yang, should remain in seclusion. Women, embodying yin, should appear in public. He even requests all married couples to copulate (ouchu) to secure more yinyang intercourse. It is also important during this time to make women happy. (1996: 436) In chapter 75 (“Stopping the Rain”), Dong alleges that the flood proves there is too much yin so one should “open yang and close yin” (1996: 438). The north gate, the direction of yin, should be wide open. Women should go into concealment and men should be visible. Officers in the city should send their wives to the countryside in order to make sure that yin will not conquer yang. Derk Bodde defines this practice as a “sexual sympathetic magic.” (Bodde 1981: 373)
Finally, yinyang also plays a pivotal role in traditional Chinese thought about health and the human body. The early medical text known as the Huangdi neijing (The Yellow Emperor’s Classic of Internal Medicine) provides a detailed account of physiological functions and pathological changes in the body and guidance for diagnosis and treatment in terms of yinyang. Five zang (organs) — the kidneys, liver, heart, spleen and lungs — are classified as yin. They control the storage of vital substance and qi. Six fu (organs) — the gallbladder, stomach, small and large intestines, urinary bladder and triple burner (referring to three parts of the body cavity: the upper burner, which houses the heart and lungs; the middle burner, which houses the spleen and stomach; and the lower burner, which houses the kidney, urinary bladder and small and large intestines) — are yang and control the transport and digestion of food. The storage is a yin function, and the transport and transformation of substance is a yang function. But the zang and fu organs can be further subdivided into yin and yang. The activity or function of each organ is its yang aspect, while its substance is its yin aspect. Yin should flow smoothly and yang should vivify steadily. They regulate themselves so as to maintain equilibrium. Yin and yang do not exist in isolation but are in a dynamic state in which they interact and fashion the complicated and intricate system of the human body.
There is no a clear and definite way to determine the exact date of origin or the person who created the popular yinyang symbol. No one has ever claimed specific ownership of this popular image. However, there is a rich textual and visual history leading to its creation. Inspired by a primeval vision of cosmic harmony, Chinese thinkers have sought to codify this order in various intellectual constructions. Whether to formulate this underlying pattern through words and concepts or numbers and visual images has been debated since the Han dynasty. The question first surfaced in the interpretation of the Yijing. The Yijing is constructed around sixty-four hexagrams (gua), each of which is made of six parallel broken or unbroken line segments (yao). Each of the sixty-four hexagrams has a unique designation; its image (xiang) refers to a particular natural object and conveys the meaning of human events and activities. The Yijing thus has generated a special way to decipher the universe. It mainly incorporates three elements: xiang (images), shu (numbers), and li (meanings). They act as the mediators between heavenly cosmic phenomena and earthly human everyday life. From the Han dynasty through the Ming and Qing dynasties (1368-1912 CE), there was a consistent tension between two schools of thought: the school of xiangshu (images and numbers) and the school of yili (meanings and reasoning). At issue between them is how best to interpret the classics, particularly the Yijing. The question often was posed as: “Am I interpreting the six classics or are the six classics interpreting me?”
For the school of Xiangshu the way to interpret the classics is to produce a figurative and numerological representation of the universe through xiang (images) and shu (numbers). It held that xiangshu are indispensable structures expressing the Way of heaven, earth and human being. Thus the school of Xiangshu takes the position that “I interpret the classics” by means of the images and numbers. The emphasis is on the appreciation of classics. The school of Yili, on the other hand, focuses on an exploration of the meanings of the classics on the basis of one’s own reconstruction. In other word, the school of Yili treats all classics as supporting evidence for their own ideas and theories. The emphasis is more on idiosyncratic new theories rather than the explanation of the classics. In what follows, our inquiry focuses on the legacy of the Xiangshu school.
The most common effort of the Xiangshu school was to draw tu (diagrams). Generations of intellectuals labored on the formulation and creation of numerous tu. Tu often delineate structure, place, and numbers through black and white lines. They are not aesthetic objects but rather serve as a means of articulating the fundamental patterns that govern phenomena in the universe. Tu are universes in microcosm and demonstrate obedience to definite norms or rules. During the Song dynasty (960-1279 CE), the Daoist monk Chen Tuan (906-989 CE) made an important contribution to this tradition by drawing a few tu in order to elucidate the Yijing. Though none of his tu were directly passed down, he is considered the forerunner of the school of tushu (diagrams and writings). It is said that he left behind three tu; since his death, attempting to discover these tu has become a popular scholarly pursuit. After Chen Tuan, three trends in making tu emerged, exemplified by the work of three Neo-Confucian thinkers: the Hetu (Diagram of River) and Luoshu (Chart of Luo) ascribed to Liu Mu (1011-1064 CE), the Xiantian tu (Diagram of Preceding Heaven) credited to Shao Yong (1011-1077 CE), and the Taijitu (Diagram of the Great Ultimate) attributed to Zhou Dunyi (1017-1073 CE). These three trends eventually led to the creation of the first yinyang symbol by Zhao Huiqian (1351-1395 CE), entitled Tiandi Zhiran Hetu (Heaven and Earth’s Natural Diagram of the River) and pictured above at the head of this entry.
Robin R. Wang
Loyola Marymount University
Last updated: September 10, 2006 | Originally published: