The tradition of Patañjali in the oral and textual tradition of the Yoga Sūtras is accepted by traditional Vedic schools as the authoritative source on Yoga, and it retains this status in Hindu circles into the present day. In contrast to its modern Western transplanted forms, Yoga essentially consists of meditative practices culminating in attaining a state of consciousness free from all modes of active or discursive thought, and of eventually attaining a state where consciousness is unaware of any object external to itself, that is, is only aware of its own nature as consciousness unmixed with any other object. This state is not only desirable in its own right, but its attainment guarantees the practitioner freedom from every kind of material pain or suffering, and, indeed, is the primary classical means of attaining liberation from the cycle of birth and death in the Indic soteriological traditions, that is, in the theological study of salvation in India. The Yoga Sūtras were thus seen by all schools, not only as the orthodox manual for guidance in the techniques and practices of meditation, but also for the classical Indian position on the nature and function of mind and consciousness, for the mechanisms of action in the world and consequent rebirth, and for the metaphysical underpinnings and description of the attainment of mystical powers.
In terms of literary sources, there is evidence as early as the oldest Vedic text, the Ṛg Veda (c. 1200 – c. 1500 B.C.E.), that there were yogī-like ascetics on the margins of the Vedic world. In terms of the archaeological record, seals found in Indus Valley sites (c. 3000 – c. 1500 B.C.E.) with representations of figures seated in a clear yogic posture (the most famous figure is seated in padmāsana, lotus pose, with arms extended and resting on the knees in a classical meditative posture), suggest that, irrespective of its literary origins, Yoga has been practiced on the Indian subcontinent for well over 4000 years. However, it is in the late Vedic age, marked by the fertile speculations expressed in a genre of texts called the Upaniṣads (c. 800 – c. 600 B.C.E.), that practices that can be clearly related to classical Yoga are first articulated in literary sources.
While the Upaniṣads are especially concerned with jñāna, or understanding Brahman, the Absolute Truth, through the cultivation of knowledge, there are also several unmistakable references to a technique for realizing Brahman (in its localized aspect of ātman) called Yoga. As with the Upaniṣads in general, we do not find a systematic philosophy here, but mystico-poetic utterances, albeit profound in content (Kaṭha Upaniṣad VI.11–18; Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad II.8–15; Maitrī Upaniṣad VI.18). The Mahābhārata Epic, which is the largest literary epic in the world, also preserves significant material representing the evolution of Yoga, indeed, the term “yoga” and “yogī” occur about 900 times throughout the Epic. Usually dated somewhere between the 9th–4th centuries C.E., the Epic exhibits the transition between the origins of Yoga in the Upaniṣadic period and its expression in the systematized traditions of Yoga as represented in the classical period by Patañjali. Nestled in the middle of the Epic, the well-known Bhagavad Gītā (c. 4th century B.C.E.), devotes a good portion of its bulk to the practices of Yoga, which it considers to be “ancient” (IV.3).
This, of course, indicates that practices associated with Yoga had gained wide currency in the centuries prior to the common era, with a clearly identifiable set of basic techniques and generic practices, and we will here simply allude to the fact that scholars have long pointed out a commonality of vocabulary, and concepts between the Yoga Sūtras (YS) and Buddhist texts. All this underscores the fact that there was a cluster of numerous interconnected and cross-fertilizing variants of meditational Yoga – Buddhist and Jain as well as Hindu – prior to Patañjali, all drawn from a common but variegated pool of terminologies, practices and concepts (and, indeed, many strains continue to the present day). Of closer relevance to the Sūtras is the fact that the history of Yoga is inextricable from that of the Sāṁkhya tradition. Sāṁkhya provides the metaphysical infrastructure for Yoga (discussed in the section on metaphysics), and thus is indispensable to an understanding of Yoga. While both Yoga and Sāṁkhya share the same metaphysics and the common goal of liberating puruṣa from its encapsulation, their methods differ.
Sāṁkhya occupies itself with the path of reasoning to attain liberation, specifically concerning itself with the analysis of the manifold ingredients of prakṛti from which the puruṣa was to be extricated, and Yoga more with the path of meditation, focusing its attention on the nature of mind and consciousness, and the techniques of concentration in order to provide a practical method through which the puruṣa can be isolated and extricated. Sāṁkhya seems to have been perhaps the earliest philosophical system to have taken shape in the late Vedic period, and has permeated almost all subsequent Hindu traditions; indeed the classical Yoga of Patañjali has been seen as a type of neo-Sāṁkhya, updating the old Sāṁkhya tradition to bring it into conversation with the more technical philosophical traditions that had emerged by the 3–5th centuries C.E., particularly Buddhist thought. In fact, Sāṁkhya and Yoga should not be considered different schools until a very late date: the first reference to Yoga itself as a distinct school seems to be in the writings of Śaṅkara in the 9th century C.E. Yoga and Sāṁkhya in the Upaniṣads and Epic simply refer to the two distinct paths of salvation by meditation and salvation by knowledge, respectively.
One might add, as an aside, that from the 900-odd references to Yoga in the Mahābhārata, there are only two mentions of āsana, posture, the third limb of Patañjali’s system. Neither the Upaniṣads nor the Gītā mention posture in the sense of stretching exercises and bodily poses (the term is used as “seat” rather than bodily postures), and Patañjali himself only dedicates three brief sūtras from his text to this aspect of the practice. The reconfiguring, presentation and perception of Yoga as primarily or even exclusively āsana in the sense of bodily poses, then, is essentially a modern Western phenomenon and finds no precedent in the premodern Yoga tradition. From this rich and fertile post-Vedic context, then, emerged an individual called Patañjali whose systematization of the heterogeneous practices of Yoga came to be authoritative for all subsequent practitioners and his system eventually reified into one of the six schools of classical Indian philosophy. It is important to stress here that Patañjali is not the founder or inventor of Yoga, the origins of which, as noted above, had long preceded him in primordial and mythic times. Patañjali systematized the preexisting traditions and authored what came to be the seminal text for Yoga discipline. There was never one uniform school of Yoga, or Ur-Yoga (or of any Indic school of thought for that matter): there was a plurality of variants, and certainly different conceptualizations of meditative practices that were termed Yoga. For example, while Patañjali organizes his system into eight limbs, and the Mahābhārata, too, speaks of Yoga as having eight “qualities” (aṣṭaguṇita, XII.304.7), as early as in the Maitrī Upaniṣad of the 2nd century B.C.E., there is reference to a six-limbed Yoga (VI.18), as there is in the Viṣṇu Purāṇa (VI.7.91). Along similar lines, there are various references to the twelve yogas and seven dhāraṇās (dhāraṇā is considered the sixth of Patañjali’s limbs) found in the Epic Mahābhārata. Yoga is thus best understood as a cluster of techniques, some more and some less systematized, that pervaded the landscape of ancient India. These overlapped and were incorporated into the various traditions of the day such as the jñāna, knowledge-based traditions, providing these systems with a practical method and technique for attaining an experienced-based transformation of consciousness. Patañjali’s particular systematization of these techniques was in time to emerge as the most dominant, but by no means exclusive, version.
Indeed, internal to his own text, in his very first sūtra, atha yoga anuśāsanam, Patañjali indicates that he is continuing the teachings of Yoga (the verbal prefix anu indicates the continuation of the action denoted by the verb), and the traditional commentators certainly perceive him in this light. In point of fact, the tradition itself ascribes the actual origins of Yoga to the legendary figure Hiraṇyagarbha. Moreover, evidence that Patañjali was addressing an audience already familiar with the tenets of Yoga can be deduced from the Yoga Sūtras themselves. For example, on occasion, Patañjali will mention one member of a list of items followed by “etc.,”, thereby assuming his audience to be familiar with the remainder of the list. But, in short, because he produced the first systematized treatise on the subject, Patañjali was to become the prime or seminal figure for the Yoga tradition after his times, and was accepted as such by other schools. To all intents and purposes, his Yoga Sūtras were to become the canon for the mechanics of generic Yoga, so to speak, that other systems tinkered with, and flavored with their own theological trappings.
As with the reputed founders of the other schools of thought, very little is known about Patañjali himself. Tradition, first evidenced in the commentary of Bhoja Rāja in the 11th century C.E., considers him to be the same Patañjali who wrote the primary commentary on the famous grammar by Pāṇini, and also ascribes to him authorship of a treatise on medicine. There is an ongoing discussion amongst scholars as to whether this was likely or not, but there is not much to be gained by challenging the evidence of traditional accounts in the absence of alternative evidence to the contrary that is uncontroversial or at least adequately compelling.
Patañjali’s date can only be inferred from the content of the text itself. Unfortunately, as with most classical Sanskrit texts from the ancient period, early Sanskrit texts tend to be impossible to date with accuracy, and there are always dissenters against whatever dates become standard in academic circles. Most scholars seem to date the text shortly after the turn of the common era, (c. 1st – c. 2nd century C.E.), but it has been placed as early as several centuries before the common era. Other than the fact that the text does not postdate the 5th century C.E., the date of the Yoga Sūtras cannot be determined with exactitude.
The Sūtra writing style is that used by the philosophical schools of ancient India (thus we have Vedānta Sūtras, Nyāya Sūtras, etc.). The term “sūtra,” (from the Sanskrit root sū, cognate with “sew”) literally means a thread, and essentially refers to a terse and pithy philosophical statement in which the maximum amount of information is packed into the minimum amount of words. Knowledge systems were handed down orally in ancient India, and thus source material was kept minimal partly with a view to facilitating memorization. Being composed for oral transmission and memorization, the Yoga Sūtras, and sūtra traditions in general, allowed the student to “thread together” in memory the key ingredients of the more extensive body of material with which the student would become thoroughly acquainted. Thus, each sūtra served as a mnemonic device to structure the teachings and facilitate memorization, almost like a bullet point that would then be elaborated upon.
This very succinctness – the Yoga Sūtras contain about 1200 words in 195 sūtras – and the fact that the sūtras are in places cryptic, esoteric and incomprehensible in their own terms points to the fact that they served as manuals to be used in conjunction with a teacher. Therefore, it is an unrealistic (if not impossible) task to attempt to bypass commentary in the hope of retrieving some original pure, pre-commentarial set of Ur-interpretations
Knowledge systems in ancient Indian were transmitted orally, from master to disciple, with an enormous emphasis on fidelity towards the original set of Sūtras upon which the system is founded, the master unpacking the dense and truncated aphorisms to the students. Periodically, teachers of particular prominence wrote commentaries on the primary texts of many of these knowledge systems. Some of these gained wide currency to the point that the primary text was always studied in conjunction with a commentary, particularly since texts such as the Yoga Sūtras were designed to be unpacked because they contain numerous sūtras that are incomprehensible without further elaboration. One cannot overstress, therefore, that our understanding of Patañjali’s text is completely dependent on the interpretations of later commentators: it is incomprehensible, in places, in its own terms.
In terms of the overall accuracy of the commentaries there is an a priori likelihood that the interpretations of the Sūtras were faithfully preserved and transmitted orally through the few generations from Patañjali until the first commentary by Vyāsa in the 5th Century C.E. Certainly, the commentators from Vyāsa onwards are remarkably consistent in their interpretations of the essential metaphysics of the system for over fifteen hundred years, which is in marked contrast with the radical differences in essential metaphysical understanding distinguishing commentators of the Vedānta school (a Rāmānuja or a Madhva from a Śaṅkara, for example). While the 15th century commentator Vijñānabhikṣu, for example, may not infrequently quibble with the 9th century commentator Vācaspati Miśra, the differences generally are in detail, not essential metaphysical elements. And while Vijñānabhikṣu may inject a good deal of Vedāntic concepts into the basic dualism of the Yoga system, this is generally an addition (conspicuous and identifiable) to the system rather than a reinterpretation of it. There is thus a remarkably consistent body of knowledge associated with the Yoga school for the best part of a millennium and a half, and consequently one can speak of “the traditional understanding” of the Sūtras in the premodern period without overly generalizing or essentializing.
The first extant commentary by the legendary Vyāsa, typically dated to around the 4–5th century C.E., was to attain a status almost as canonical as the primary text by Patañjali himself. Consequently, the study of the Yoga Sūtras has always been embedded in the commentary that tradition attributes to this greatest of literary figures. Practically speaking, when we speak of the philosophy of Patañjali, what we really mean (or should mean) is the understanding of Patañjali according to Vyāsa: it is Vyāsa who determined what Patañjali’s abstruse Sūtras meant, and all subsequent commentators elaborated on Vyāsa. The Vyāsa Bhāṣya (commentary) becomes inseparable from the Sūtras; an extension of it. From one sūtra of a few words, Vyāsa might write several lines of comment without which the sūtra remains incomprehensible. Vyāsa’s commentary, the Bhāṣya, thus attains the status of canon, and is almost never questioned by any subsequent commentator. Subsequent commentators base their commentaries on unpacking Vyāsa’s Bhāṣya – rarely critiquing it, but rather expanding or elaborating upon it. It is this point of reference that produces a marked uniformity in the interpretation of the Sūtras in the pre-modern period.
The next commentary is called the Vivaraṇa, attributed to the great Vedāntin Śaṅkara in the 8th – 9th century C.E. It has remained unresolved since it was first questioned in 1927 whether the commentary on the Yoga Sūtras assigned to Śaṅkara is authentically penned by him. The next best known commentator is Vācaspati Miśra, whose commentary, the Tattvavai Śāradī, can be dated with more security to the 9th century C.E. Vācaspati Miśra was a prolific intellectual, penning important commentaries on the Vedānta, Sāṁkhya, Nyāya and Mīmāṁsā schools in addition to his commentary on the Yoga Sūtras, and was noteworthy for his ability to present each tradition in its own terms, without displaying any overt personal predilection.
A fascinating Arabic translation of Patañjali’s Sūtras was undertaken by the famous Arab traveler and historian al-Bīrunī (973–1050 C.E.), the manuscript of which was discovered in Istanbul in the 1920’s. Roughly contemporaneous with al-Bīrunī is the 11th century King Bhoja, poet, scholar and patron of the arts, sciences and esoteric traditions, in whose commentary, called the Rājamārtaṇ∂a, there are on occasion very valuable insights to be found. In the 15th century, Vijñānabhikṣu wrote a most insightful and useful commentary after that of Vyāsa’s, the Yogavārttika. Vijñānabhikṣu was another prolific scholar, noteworthy for his attempt to harmonize Vedānta and Sāṁkhya concepts. In the 16th century C.E., another Vedāntin, Rāmānanda Sarasvatī, wrote his commentary, called Yogamaṇiprabhā, which also adds little to the previous commentaries. But there are valuable insights contained in the Bhāsvatī by Hariharānanda Āraṇya, written in Bengali, from a context nearer our own times, a standpoint exposed to Western thought, but still thoroughly grounded in tradition. While many other commentaries have been written, these are the primary commentaries written in the pre-modern era. The commentaries written in the modern period, many of which have made massive adjustments to modernity or the sensitivities of the Western market, are beyond the scope of this discussion, which limits itself to classical Yoga philosophy.
The Yoga Sūtras is divided into four padas, chapters. The first, samādhi pāda, defines Yoga as the complete cessation of all active states of mind, and outlines various stages of insight that stem from this. The chapter points to the ultimate goal of Yoga, which is content-less awareness, beyond even the most supreme stages of insight. The second, sādhana pāda, outlines the various practices, and moral and ethical observances that are preliminary requirements to serious meditative practice. The third, vibhūti pada, primarily deals with various super-normal powers that can accrue to the practitioner when the mind is in extreme states of concentration. There seems to have been a widespread culture in ancient India of engaging in Yoga-like practices but not in pursuit of the real goal of Yoga as defined by Patañjali, but rather in quest of such super-normal powers; this chapter can be read as Patañjali’s warning against being side-tracked in this way. The fourth, kaivalya pāda deals with liberation, and, amongst other things, contains Patañjali’s response to the Buddhist challenge.
As noted, Yoga is not to be considered as a school distinct from Sāṁkhya until well after Patañjali’s time, but rather as a different approach or method towards enlightenment, although there are minor differences. Sāṁkhya provides the metaphysical or theoretical basis for the realization of puruṣa, and Yoga the technique or practice itself. While the Yoga tradition does not agree with the Sāṁkhya view that metaphysical analysis, that is, jñāna, knowledge, constitutes a sufficient path towards enlightenment in and of itself the metaphysical presuppositions of the Yoga system assume those of Sāṁkhya. Leaving aside the numerous variants of Sāṁkhya (the Chinese Buddhist pilgrim Hsöen Tsang’s disciple in the 7th century C.E. reports 18 schools, and the loss of the earlier material, the later Sāṁkhya Kārikā of Iśvarakṛṣṇa (4th–5th century C.E.), has by default become the seminal text of the tradition, just as Patañjali’s Yoga Sūtras has for the Yoga tradition.
In the generic Sāṁkhya (literally “numeration”) system, the universe of animate and inanimate entities is perceived as ultimately the product of two ontologically distinct categories; hence this system is quintessentially dvaita, or dualistic in presupposition. These two categories are prakṛti, or the primordial material matrix of the physical universe, and puruṣa, the innumerable conscious selves embedded within it. As a result of the interaction between these two entities, the material universe evolves in a series of stages. The actual catalysts in this evolutionary process are the three guṇas, literally “strands” or “qualities,” which are inherent in prakṛti. These are: sattva, “lucidity;” rajas, “action;” and tamas, “inertia.” These guṇas are sometimes compared to the threads which underpin the existence of a rope; just as a rope is actually a combination of threads, so all manifest reality actually consists of a combination of the guṇas.
Given the meditative focus of the text, the guṇas are especially significant to Yoga in terms of their psychological manifestation; in Yoga, the mind and therefore all psychological dispositions, are prakṛti, and therefore also comprised of the guṇas – the only difference between mind and matter being that the former has a larger preponderance of sattva, and the latter of tamas. Therefore, according to the specific intermixture and proportionality of the guṇas, living beings exhibit different types of mindsets and psychological dispositions. Thus, when sattva is predominant in an individual, the qualities of lucidity, tranquility, wisdom, discrimination, detachment, happiness, and peacefulness manifest; when rajas is predominant, hankering, attachment, energetic endeavor, passion, power, restlessness and creative activity; and when tamas, the guṇa least favorable for yoga, is predominant, ignorance, delusion, disinterest, lethargy, sleep, and disinclination towards constructive activity.
The guṇas are continually interacting and competing with each other, one guṇa becoming prominent for a while and overpowering the others, only to be eventually dominated in turn by the increase of one of the other guṇas. They are compared to the wick, fire and oil of the lamp which, while opposed to each other in their nature, come together to produce light. Just as there are an unlimited variety of colors stemming from the intermixture of the three primary colors, different hues being simply expressions of the specific proportionality of red, yellow and blue, so the unlimited psychological dispositions of living creatures (and of physical forms) stem from the intermixture of the guṇas; specific states of mind being reflections of the particular proportionality of the intermixture of the three guṇas.
The guṇas not only underpin the philosophy of mind in Yoga, but the activation and interaction of these guṇa qualities result in the production of the entirety of physical forms that also evolve from the primordial material matrix, prakṛti, under the same principle. Thus the physical composition of objects like air, water, stone, fire, etc. differs because of their constitutional makeup of specific guṇas: air contains more of the buoyancy of sattva, stones more of the sluggishness of the tamas element, and fire, of rajas. The guṇas allow for the infinite plasticity of prakṛti and the objects of the world.
The process by which the universe evolves from prakṛti is usefully compared to the churning of milk: when milk receives a citric catalyst, yogurt, curds, or butter emerge. These immediate products, in turn, can be further manipulated to produce a further series of products – milk desserts, cheese, etc. Similarly, according to classical Sāṁkhya, the first evolute emerging from prakṛti when it is churned by the guṇas (sattva specifically) is buddhi, intelligence. Intelligence is characterized by the functions of judgment, discrimination, knowledge, ascertainment, will, virtue and detachment, and sattva is predominant in it. This means that in its purest state, when the potential of rajas and tamas are minimized, buddhi is primarily lucid, peaceful, happy, tranquil and discriminatory, all qualities of sattva. It is the interface between puruṣa and all other prakṛtic evolutes. From this vantage point, it can direct awareness out into the objects and embroilments of the world, or, in its highest potential, it can become aware of the presence of puruṣa and consequently redirect itself towards complete realization of the true source of consciousness that pervades it.
From buddhi, ahaṁkāra, or ego is produced (aham “I” + kāra “doing;” referred to as asmitā in this text). This is characterized by the function of self-awareness and self-identity. It is the discursive aspect that processes and appropriates external reality from the perspective of an individualized sense of self or ego – the notion of “I” and “mine” in human awareness. Ahaṁkāra also limits the range of awareness to fit within and identify with the contours of the particular psychophysical organism within which it finds itself in any one embodiment, as opposed to another. In other words, the ahaṁkāra of a typical, unenlightened, bug acts almost like a concave screen, which refracts consciousness to pervade and appropriate the contours of the bug. If the bug dies and becomes, say, a typical, unenlightened dog and then a typical human in subsequent lives, the ahaṁkāra aspect of the citta adjusts to accommodate and absorb consciousness into these new environments. Thus the bug thinks it is a bug, the dog thinks it is a dog, and the human thinks he or she is a human.
When ego in turn is “churned” by the guṇa of sattva inherent in it, manas, the mind, is produced. The mind is the seat of the emotions, of like and dislike, and is characterized by controlling the senses – filtering and processing the potentially enormous amount of data accessible to the senses. It primarily receives, sorts, categorizes and then transmits. It serves as the liaison between the activities of the senses transmitting data from the external world, and buddhi, intelligence. It therefore partakes both of internal and external functioning: internally, it is characterized by reflective synthesis, while simultaneously being a sense because it acts similar to the senses. The puruṣa, or self, is cloaked in these psychic layers prior to receiving a gross body and senses. The Yoga school, while using the terminology of (especially) buddhi, but also ahaṁkāra and manas, differs somewhat from that of Sāṁkhya in conceiving these three as interacting functions of the one citta, mind, rather than as three distinct metaphysical layers. Citta, then, as the term used by Patañjali and the commentators to refer to all three of these cognitive functions combined, is one of the most important terms in the Yoga Sūtras.
Yoga is defined by Patañjali as “citta vṛtti nirodha” (YS I.2), the stilling of all states of the citta. There are five vṛttis, a term used frequently throughout the Yoga Sūtras to essentially refer to any sensual impression, thought, idea, or cognition, psychic activity or conscious mental state whatsoever. These five vṛttis are: right knowledge, error, metaphor, deep sleep and memory (YS I.5-11). They are either kliṣṭa, detrimental to the goal of Yoga, or akliṣṭa, conducive to it. The kliṣṭa vṛttis are those stemming from the mind when it is subject to the five kleśas, obstacles – ignorance, ego, desire, aversion, clinging to life – discussed below, and the akliṣṭa vṛttis are those stemming from their opposites – knowledge of the true self and freedom from desire, etc. Put simply, akliṣṭa vṛttis are the mental activities of a jivanmukta, a being who is liberated while still embodied.
The first of these five vṛttis is epistemological, pramāṇa, that is, the sources that constitute the production of valid knowledge of an object – the methods of attaining accurate information about reality. This is discussed in the section on epistemology, and we will simply note here that the first vṛtti is when the mind is in a state of right knowledge, that is, is accurately reflecting external reality (Yoga would not disagree with the basics of the Nyāya tradition as to what constitutes right knowledge, nor with the criteria that produce it). The second vṛtti is error, which can be produced from the same sources as knowledge, and is defined as considering something to be what it is not, a state that can be subsequently removed by true knowledge of what the nature of the thing in question is (such as the perception of two moons when in an intoxicated state).
The third type of vṛtti is, loosely speaking, imagination or metaphor, or, more precisely, the usage of words or expressions that do not correspond to any actual physical reality, but that are understood in common parlance. An example given in the commentaries is the statement that “the arrow stands still, stood still, will stand still.” What this actually means in the mind of the listener is that the arrow has ceased (or will cease) to move, that is, “standing still,” the absence of motion, is really an imagined state of affairs dependent on the idea of motion, but it is then projected as an actual characteristic of the arrow. A more straightforward example from English usage might be: “the sun rises and sets” or “time flies;” common usage has assigned meaning to these imaginary states of affairs, and no one bats an eyelid when such expressions are uttered. In fact, metaphors and similes, which, if dissected to their literal meanings do not correspond to actual objective reality, are normal everyday expressions and ubiquitous in human language, since language is largely figurative.
The fourth vṛtti is deep sleep defined as a state of mind which is based on an absence [of any content]. There is some difference between schools but (in contrast to e.g. Vedānta), the Yoga tradition views deep sleep as a type of vṛtti on the grounds that when one awakes, one remembers that one has either slept well, or slept restlessly, or slept in a stupor. One would not be able to do so if these impressions did not relate back to a state of mind that existed during deep sleep. This is because, in Yoga psychology, memory is the product of saṁskāra, and saṁskāra is caused by experience. Therefore, the memory of having slept well must relate to a state of mind experienced during deep sleep, which is recorded in the citta as memory (the topic of the next sūtra) and remembered upon awakening. This state of mind according to this line of reasoning must therefore pertain to a category of vṛtti distinct from others.
Finally, the fifth vṛtti is memory, defined as the retention of images of sense objects that have been experienced. Any vṛtti leaves its copy on the citta before fading away. Memories are generated from and thus depend on the other types of vṛttis. As noted earlier, every object that has ever been experienced forms a saṁskāra, an imprint, in the citta mind, like a sound is imprinted on a tape recorder, or an image on film. The mind forms an impression of an object through the sense organs, which is called a pratyaya. Once this pratyaya or active image of this object is no longer of active interest to the mind, it becomes an inactive, or latent, saṁskāra. Thus vṛttis, and their pratyaya content, are retained as saṁskāras when they fade. Memory consists of the retrieval of these saṁskāras; memories are the reactivation of the imprints of sense objects that one has experienced and recognized in the past that are not too covered by forgetfulness (tamas). However, it is important to note that these saṁskāras are not just passive imprints but vibrant latent impulses that can get activated under conducive circumstances and can exert influence on a person’s thoughts and behaviors.
The notion of the subconscious in Western psychology corresponds to other less retrievable saṁskāras, primarily from previous lives, which remain latent as subliminal impressions. The mind is thus a storehouse of these recorded saṁskāras, deposited and accumulated in the citta over countless lifetimes. Saṁskāras also account for such things as personality traits, habits, compulsive and addictive behaviors, etc. The stronger or more dominant a cluster of saṁskāras becomes, the more it activates and imposes itself upon the consciousness of the individual, demanding indulgence and perpetuating a vicious cycle that can be very hard to break (the reverse, of course, also holds true with the benevolent akliṣṭa vṛttis discussed below: one can become “addicted,” so to speak, to benevolent yogic activities and lifestyle by dint of constant repetition).
Any other states of mind that one might conceive of would be considered by the Yoga tradition as a subset of one of these five essential categories. Since the mind is never static but always active and changing, vṛttis are constantly being produced, and thus constantly absorb the consciousness of puruṣa away from its own pure nature, channeling it out into the realm of subtle or gross prakṛti.
As noted above, these five categories of vṛttis can be either akliṣṭa, conducive (at least initially) to the ultimate goal of Yoga, or kliṣṭa, detrimental. These participial terms assume an awareness of their nominal form, kleśa; there are five kleśas: ignorance, ego, desire, aversion and clinging to life (YS II.3-9). These kleśas are deeper elements of the psyche than their surface level manifestations as vṛttis. In resonance with all Indic soteriological thought, the first kleśa, ignorance, is the foundation of all the other kleśas, and hence of saṁsāra, so when ignorance is dispelled, the other kleśas, which may exist in latent unconscious form, or in various stages of consciousness, disappear. It is defined as follows: “Ignorance is the notion which takes the self, which is joyful, pure and eternal, to be the non-self, which is painful, unclean and temporary.” The “non-self,” an-ātman, consists not only of the body, which is the locus for enjoyment; and the mind, which is an instrument through which the awareness of puruṣa can contact the world; but also the accessories or paraphernalia of the body, whether animate (such as spouse, animals, and offspring), or inanimate (such as furniture or food).
Ego is to consider the nature of the seer and the nature of the instrumental power of seeing to be the same thing. In other words, ego is the specific aspect of ignorance which identifies the non-self – specifically the intelligence – with the true self, puruṣa (ātman). Ego and ignorance are to some extent the same thing, but there is a difference in degree. Ignorance initially involves a not-as-yet specific notion of “I-ness,” a sense of self as being something other than puruṣa as yet undefined, a partial identification of the real self with buddhi, the intelligence, while ego involves a more developed or complete identity between the puruṣa self and buddhi. The difference is one of degree; ego evolves out of ignorance, and makes the misidentification of non-self with self more concrete and specific.
Moving on to the third kleśa: the hankering, desire or craving for pleasure or the means to attain pleasure by one who remembers past experiences of pleasure, is attachment, rāga. The key ingredient in this process is memory. In other words, one who has experienced pleasure in the past recollects it and hankers to repeat the experience in the present or future, or to attain the means of repeating the experience. It is this dwelling on past experiences that constitutes “attachment.” When a new means of pleasure is perceived, it is memory that infers that the new means of pleasure is the same as or similar to something that produced pleasure in the past, and therefore promises to provide the same or similar pleasure in the present or future.
The fourth kleśa can be understood in a parallel manner to the previous kleśa of attachment: the feeling of resistance, anger, frustration and resentment towards pain and its causes by one who remembers past experiences of similar pain, is aversion. The tendency of clinging-to-life is the fifth kleśa which is taken to be a synonym for the fear of death. Just as the previous sūtras indicated that attachment or aversion to something is caused by positive or negative memories of that thing, aversion to death likewise indicates that one’s memory retains unpleasant recollections of past deaths, although these are latent or subconscious in the present life.
When under the influence of the detrimental vṛttis stemming from the kleśas, the mind becomes attracted or repelled by sense objects drawing its attention. In its attempt to attain that which attracts it, that is, to fulfill desires, and avoid that which repels it, avoid aversions, the mind provokes action, karma, which initiates a vicious reactive cycle. Karma, from the root kṛ, to “do” or “make,” literally means “work,” but inherent in the Indic concept of work, or any type of activity, is the notion that every action breeds a reaction. Thus karma refers not only to an initial act, whether benevolent or malicious, but also to the reaction it produces (pleasant or unpleasant in accordance with the original act) which ripens for the actor either in this life or a future one. Hence people are born into different socio-economic situations, and pleasant or unpleasant things happen to them throughout life in accordance with their own previous actions.
This cycle of action and reaction, or saṁsāra, is potentially eternal and unlimited since not only does any one single act breed a reaction, but the actor must then react to this reaction causing a re-reaction, which in turn fructifies and provokes re-re-reactions, and so on ad infinitum. Since these reactions and re-reactions, etc., cannot possibly be fitted into one life, they spill over from one lifetime to the next. It is in an attempt to portray the sheer unlimited and eternal productive power of karma that Indic thinkers, both Hindu and Buddhist, use such metaphors as “the ocean” of birth and death. Thus, karma, which keeps consciousness bound to the external world and forgetful of its own nature, is generated by the vṛttis, and the vṛttis, in turn, are produced by the kleśas. There is thus a cycle of kleśas, vṛttis and saṁskāras: vṛttis, that is thoughts, etc. stemming form sense experience, (and their consequent actions) are recorded in the citta as saṁskāras, and these saṁskāras eventually activate consciously or subliminally, producing further vṛttis. These vṛttis then provoke action with their corresponding reactions noted above, which in turn are recorded as saṁskāras, and the cycle continues. Kleśas, vṛttis, saṁskāras and karma are thus all interconnected links in the chain of saṁsāra.
The akliṣṭa non-detrimental mental vṛttis, on the other hand, are produced by the sāttvic faculty of discrimination that seeks to control the influence of rajas and tamas and thereby the detrimental vṛttis that they produce. Through the practice of yoga, the yogī attempts to supplant all the rājasic and tāmasic saṁskāras with sāttvic ones until these, too, are restricted in the higher states of meditative concentration — the notions of detrimental and non-detrimental are from the relative perspective of saṁsāra; the detrimental (rājasic and tāmasic) vṛttis cause pain, and the non-detrimental (sāttvic) ones at least lead in the direction of liberation, even though they too must eventually be given up. But these latter do point to the possibility of acting in the world, in one’s prakṛtic body and mind, from an enlightened perspective free from ignorance. This points to the notion of the jīvanmukta: someone who is still embodied and thus functioning with a citta, but a citta that generates vṛttis that are not subject to ignorance, ego, and attachment, etc.
We have discussed that ignorance is the cause of suffering and saṁsāra, and that when this is removed by discrimination, liberation is attained. The core project of the Sūtras, then, is to outline how to accomplish this. The second chapter, kriyā yoga, is dedicated to this effect, featuring the eight limbs of yoga, that is, to the means of achieving discriminative discernment. The eight limbs are: yamas, abstentions; niyamas, observances; āsana, posture; prāṇāyāma, breath control; pratyahāra disengagement of the senses; dharaṇā, concentration, dhyāna, meditation and samādhi, absorption.
The yamas are: non-violence, truthfulness; refrainment from stealing; celibacy; and renunciation of [unnecessary] possessions. The first of these, ahiṁsā, non-violence, is the yama singled out by the commentators on Patañjali for special attention, indeed, as the root of the other yamas. Patañjali’s goal is to achieve ahiṁsā and enhance it. Ahiṁsā is defined as not injuring any living creature anywhere at any time. Truth, the second yama, is defined as one’s words and thoughts being in exact correspondence to fact. “Refrainment from stealing”, the third yama, is described as not taking things belonging to others, and not even harboring the desire to do so. Celibacy is the control of the sexual organs, a definition further refined as not seeing, speaking with, embracing, or otherwise interacting with members of the opposite sex as objects of desire. Renunciation of possessions is the ability to see the problems caused by the acquisition, preservation and destruction of things, since these only provoke attachment and injury. These yamas are considered the great vow. They are not exempted by one’s class, place, time or circumstance. They are universal.
The niyamas, observances, are: cleanliness, contentment, austerity, study [of scripture], and devotion to God. Cleanliness is external and internal; the former pertains to the body, and the latter to purifying the mind of all contamination (jealousy, pride, vanity, hatred and attachment.) “Contentment,” santoṣa, the second niyama, manifests as disinterest in accumulating more than one’s immediate needs of life. “Austerity,” tapas, is the ability to tolerate the urge to eat and drink, as well as the urge for the dualities of life – hot and cold, etc., to avoid useless talk, and to perform fasts. “Study,” svādhyāya, refers to reading sacred scriptures whose subject matter is liberation, and also includes the repetition of the om syllable. The last item on Patañjali’s list, “devotion to God,” Ῑśvara-praṇidhāna, includes offering all one’s activities to Ῑśvara, the “original teacher,” (YS I.26), without desire for the fruit. This last niyama will be discussed further in the section on theism.
With regards to the third limb of Yoga, the term “āsana” is hardly found in the older texts, except on occasion in the sense of a “seat.” Although the entirety of Yoga is typically understood and presented as āsana, physical posture, in the popular representations of the term in the West, it is actually only the third limb of Yoga, not an end or goal unto itself. Indeed, given that he dedicated 20 sūtras to the yamas and niyamas, Patañjali has relatively little to say about āsana, leaving us with only three sūtras to the topic consisting of a total of nine words – less than 1% of the text.
Vyāsa, the main commentator, knew of a range of āsanas in the 5th century C.E. (listing 12 followed by “etc.”, suggesting a well known tradition of variants). Nonetheless, essentially, posture is a limb of the actual goal of Yoga to the extent that it allows the meditator to sit “firmly,” sthira, and “comfortably,” sukha, for meditation. Indeed, as noted, āsana in fact literally means “seat.” The point is that yogic postures are useful only to the extent to which they facilitate fixing the mind completely by training the body not to be a source of distraction. Prāṇāyāma, breath control, consists of the regulation of the incoming and outgoing breaths. It is defined as the external, internal and restrained movements [of breath], which are drawn out and subtle in accordance to place, time and number. Pratyāhāra, the fifth limb, is defined as withdrawal from sense objects.
This process of consecutive stages of internalization seen in these first five limbs, then, continues throughout the remaining three limbs. The fifth limb, dhāraṇā, concentration, involves fixing the mind on one place. Although Patañjali allows that any object can be used as the support of the mind in dhāraṇā, theistic meditation comes highly recommended (see section on Theism). The seventh limb, meditation, is the one-pointedness of the mind on one image. More specifically, it consists of the continuous flow of the same thought or image of the object of meditation, without being distracted by any other thought. When the image of the object of meditation “flows” uninterrupted in the mind, that is to say when the mind can focus exclusively on that object without any other distraction, the seventh limb of Yoga, dhyāna, has been achieved. The sixth and seventh limbs of Yoga, as well as the eighth, are not different practices as is the case with the previous five limbs, but a continuation and deepening of the same practice.
Samādhi, the final limb, is when that same dhyāna shines forth as the object alone and the mind is devoid of its own reflective nature. When the mind is so fully absorbed in the object of meditation that it loses all notions of itself as a self-conscious, reflective mind, one has reached the state of samādhi. In this state, the mind is no longer aware of itself as meditating on something external to itself; all distinctions between the yogī as the subjective meditator, the act of meditation, and the object of meditation have disappeared. Like a pure crystal which, when placed next to a red flower, appears to completely lose its own character by reflecting the form and color of the flower exclusively, the yogī is no longer self-aware, and is conscious only of the object of meditation, and it is in this level of intensity that samādhi differs from dhyāna. There is thus a progression of concentrative absorption on the object of meditation from dhāraṇa, through dhyāna, to samādhi, the state of consciousness ensuing when all thought has, in fact, been stilled. This is the final goal of Yoga.
There are four stages of saṁprajñāta samādhi, all of which have an ālaṁbana, “a support”. This means that the consciousness of the puruṣa is still flowing through the prakṛtic citta to connect with or be supported by an object of meditational focus (albeit in progressively more subtle ways). In this state, the mind is fixed on one pratyaya, image, or undeviating vṛtti, that of the object of concentration, and resists all change into other states. The object of concentration, whatever it might be, is the ālaṁbana, that is, the unwavering image the object produces on the concentrated mind.
The first level of saṁprajñāta samādhi, vitarka samādhi, is taken to be contemplation on a gross physical object, that is to say, meditating on an object which one experiences as a manifestation or construct of the gross physical or material atomic elements. It is thus the first level of experiencing an object in samādhi.
This first stage is further refined by Patañjali, and subdivided into two subdivisions: sa- “with” vitarka, and nir- “without” vitarka. When the yogī uses an object such as, say, a cow, as the meditational support, or object of concentration (ālaṁbana), but the yogī’s awareness of this object is conflated with the word for and the concept of a cow, this absorption is known as savitarka samādhi (samāpatti), “absorption with physical awareness.” In other words, the yogī’s experience of the object is still subtly tinged with awareness of what the object is called, and with the memory or idea corresponding to that object. Direct experience of the object in its own right and on its own ground of being is tainted by the imposition of conceptual thought upon it.
When, in contrast, the object stands out in its own right without being conflated with the conventional terminologies of language that might refer to it, or with any idea or meaning it might generate, nirvitarka samādhi has been attained. This non-conceptual, or, perhaps more accurately, super-conceptual stage occurs when the yogī’s citta has been purged of any memory awareness of what the object is and what it is called. In other words, no saṁskāric imprints pertaining to “cow” are activated on any subconscious or intuitive level whatsoever. In this state there is no recognition of what the object of meditation is, or what its name or function are; recognition is colored exclusively by the object of focus itself without any discursive analysis of the object’s place in the greater scheme of things and without the normal instinctive impulsion to identify it. Moreover, the mind has also given up its own nature of being an organ of knowledge. In other words, awareness is not even aware of the mind as being an instrument channeling awareness onto an object. In a sense, all “knowledge” of the object as conventionally understood has been suspended, and the mind has completely transformed itself into the object, free from any discursive identification or self-awareness. The object can now shine forth in its own right as an object with its own inherent existence, free from labels, categorizations or situatedness in the grand scheme of things. We can note that the object has in effect become the yogi’s entire universe, since awareness is focused on it exclusively and is thus unaware of anything else, even the discursive process itself.
Keeping the metaphysics of Sāṁkhya in mind, we know that the five gross elements which constitute gross physical objects evolve from elements that are more subtle still. That is to say, they are actually evolutes from the tanmātras, the five subtle elements. The second level of samādhi concentration, vicāra samādhi, involves absorption into this more subtle aspect of the object of meditation, that is to say, perceiving the object as actually consisting of these more subtle ingredients. In fact, the subtle substructure of external reality can refer to any of the evolutes from prakṛti, as the tanmātras themselves evolve from ahaṁkāra which, in turn, evolves from buddhi. Thus, the latter can also be considered sūkṣma, subtle. As a new archer first aims at large objects, and then progressively smaller ones, so the neophyte yogī first experiences the gross nature of the object in meditation, and then its progressively more subtle nature. Thus, instead of experiencing the object as comprised of compact quantum masses, the bhūtādi gross elements, as in the first state of vitarka, in vicāra, the yogī experiences them as vibratory, radiant potential, subtle energy, (a sublevel of reality normally imperceptible to the senses).
Vicāra samādhi, like vitarka, is also subdivided into two subdivisions of sa- “with,” and nir- “without.” When the intensity of focus on the object of meditation deepens such that the yogī penetrates its gross externalization and experiences the object as consisting of subtle elements, the tanmātras, but subtle elements circumscribed as existing in time and space, then the ensuing concentrative state of awareness is known as savicāra. In other words, in savicāra meditation, an object is perceived as consisting of subtle elements, but the object is still experienced as existing in the present time, rather than in the past or future, and is still bounded by space, that is, it is taking up some distinct physical space in the presence of the meditator rather than being situated anywhere else. Briefly put, at this stage, the yogī still has some level of awareness of space and time.
When, on the other hand, the yogī can focus on the object unconditioned by such dimensionality; in other words when he or she cannot just focus on the subtle nature of an object, but transcends space and time and perceives that these subtle essences pervade and underpin all things at all times, then the yogī has attained the state of nirvicāra. In this state, the yogī is no longer aware of dimensionality and temporality – the here and now. The object is no longer a distinct object taking up extension in a portion of space different from other spatial objects and existing in the present, rather than any other time, because the yogī experiences the subtle elements of the object as underpinning all objects at all times. In other words, the form of the object dissolves as it were under the power of the yogī’s focus, and the yogī now is simply experiencing vibrant subtle energies pervading all reality everywhere and eternally.
There is no consensus amongst the commentators as to the exact nature of the last two stages of samādhi, ānanda and asmitā, underscoring the fact that such states are experiential and do not lend themselves to scholastic categorization and analysis. The version that surfaces most commonly utilizes the three components of knowledge identified in Hindu philosophical discourse to demarcate the differences between these four stages of samādhi. In any act of knowledge, there is the “knower,” or subject of knowledge; the instruments of knowledge (mind and senses, etc.); and the object of knowledge. These are termed “gṛhitṛ,” “grahaṇa,” and “grāhya” respectively (literally: the “grasper,” the “instrument of grasping,” and “that which is grasped”). In the first two stages of samādhi outlined above, vitarka and vicāra, the object upon which the mind is fixed, whether perceived as its grosser outer form or subtler inner constituents, is an external one and therefore considered grāhya (“that which is grasped”). Now, in the third stage, ānanda samādhi, the yogī transfers awareness from the objects of the senses, grāhya, to the organs of the senses themselves, grahaṇa (the instruments of grasping), or more precisely, the powers (śakti) behind the sensual abilities of seeing, touching, smelling, tasting and hearing, (rather than the gross physical organs of eye, ear, nose, etc.). The citta now becomes aware of the mechanisms of cognition, the instruments of the senses. It becomes aware of the internal organ through which external objects are “grasped,” rather than the external objects themselves, whether experienced in their gross or subtle constitutions.
Since, in Sāṁkhya, the grahaṇa includes the internal organ, manas, buddhi and ahaṁkāra, the support of the mind in ānanda samādhī is the citta itself, specifically in its aspect as ahaṁkāra. Thus, in this third stage, awareness becomes aware of the citta itself in its capacity of acquiring knowledge, as an ‘instrument’ which ‘grasps’ the objects of the senses. In other words, the mind focuses on its own cognizing nature. Since the guṇa of sattva predominates in ahaṁkāra and buddhi, and sattva is the source of bliss, Patañjali calls this stage ānanda samādhi, the “blissful absorption.”
Finally, by involuting awareness further still and penetrating the internal organ of meditation to its still more essential nature, one transcends even the instruments of knowledge and arrives at buddhi, to the closest prakṛtic coverings, to the puruṣa itself. Relentless in the pursuit of true and ultimate knowledge, at this point the yogī attains the fourth and final stage of saṁprajñāta samādhi. Having penetrated the constituents of the external object of meditation through its gross and subtle elements, consecutively in the first two stages of samādhi, and having withdrawn itself from external cognition and into a state of contemplating the powers behind the very organs of cognition in the third, awareness penetrates the citta further still, absorbing itself in the citta’s feature of buddhi, the grahitṛ, “the grasper,” the closest prakṛtic covering to the puruṣa itself.
One final step now remains where this ultimate uncoupling of puruṣa from all connection with prakṛti and all involvement with the citta occurs. This is asaṁprajñāta samādhi, samādhi without support. This all results in a total of six stages of saṁprajñāta samādhi, before the final stage of asaṁprajñāta samādhi. Therefore, including the latter, there will be a total of seven stages of samādhi explicitly expressed by Patañjali in his system.
As we have seen, the four states of saṁprajñāta all involved the citta in various ways. Asaṁprajñāta is beyond the mind. It is therefore beyond thought and word. To underscore this, perhaps, Patañjali has used the simple pronoun anya, “the other,” rather than a descriptive term, thereby pointing to asaṁprajñāta as a state which transcends all descriptive categories and nomenclatures. The commentators present asaṁprajñāta samādhi, samādhi “without support,” as being the state where the awareness of puruṣa is no longer aware of any external entity at all, including the citta, since the latter has dissolved itself. This state corresponds with nirbīja, “without seed” (I.51). In this final and ultimate state, the supreme goal of Yoga, the mind is not supported by any active thought. The vṛttis of the mind exist simply as potential, and the saṁskāras, the subconscious imprints that trigger thoughts, memories and karma, are also latent. Since the mind is now empty of all thoughts, the awareness of puruṣa now no longer has any object whatsoever to be aware of, and thus, for the first time, can only become self-aware (loosely speaking). The final goal of Yoga has been attained.
Another way of considering this is that awareness is eternal, it cannot ever cease being aware. That being the case, the self’s only options are of what it is aware of: it can be object aware, or (again, loosely speaking) subject aware – that is, aware of entities or objects other than itself, or exclusively aware of itself as awareness with no reference to any other entity. After myriad births being aware of the unlimited varieties of prakṛtic objects, puruṣa has now come to the point of self-realization – realizing itself as distinct from not just objects of thought, but the very faculty and process of thought itself, the citta and its vṛttis. When there are no objects to detain its awareness other than its own self, the svarupa of YS I.3, this is asaṁprajñāta samādhi.
The Yoga school accepts three sources of receiving knowledge, pramāṇa, as valid (YS I.7), in accordance with the Sāṁkhya tradition. The first is sense perception, pratyākṣa, placed first on the list of pramāṇas because the other pramāṇas are dependent on it. Vyāsa defines sense perception as being the state or condition of the mind, vṛtti, which apprehends both the specific (viśeṣa) and generic (sāmānya) nature of an external object discussed further below. This apprehension is accomplished by the citta encountering a sense object through the senses and forming an impression of this object, a vṛtti. More specifically, the tāmasic nature of sense objects imprint themselves upon the mind, and are then illuminated in the mind by the mind’s sāttvic nature. Due to pervading the mind, the puruṣa, or self, then becomes conscious of this mental impression, as if it were taking place within itself, indistinguishable from itself. In actual fact, the impression is imprinted on the citta, mind, which is pervaded by consciousness but external to it.
The second pramāṇa, source of receiving valid knowledge, is anumāna, inference (logic), defined as the assumption that an object of a particular category shares the same qualities as other objects in the same category – qualities which are not shared by objects in different categories. Yoga accepts Nyāya principles here.
Finally, agama, “verbal testimony,” the third source of valid knowledge accepted by Patañjali, is the relaying of accurate information through the medium of words by a “trustworthy” person who has perceived or inferred the existence of an object, to someone who has not. “Trustworthy” is someone whose statements cannot be contradicted, has sense organs appropriately working in a suitable external environment, and is trustworthy and compassionate and free from defects such as illusion, laziness, deceit, dull-wittedness and so forth. The words of such a reliable authority enter the ear and produce an image, vṛtti, in the mind of the hearer that corresponds to the vṛtti experienced by the trustworthy person. The person receiving the information in this manner has neither personally experienced nor inferred the existence of the object of knowledge, but valid knowledge of the object is nonetheless achieved, which distinguishes this source of knowledge from the two discussed previously.
Returning to the most important episteme, perception, one must note that there are different types of pratyakṣa: the commentary on the Sāṁkhya Kārikā, the Yuktidīpikā, speaks of yogic perception as well as sensual perception (38.2). Indeed, several schools make a distinction between aparapratyakṣa, conventional perception, and parapratyakṣa, supernormal perception, or, as the Sāṁkhya Sūtras put it, external perception, bahya-pratyakṣa, and internal perception abahya pratyakṣa (I.90). The perception of interest to Yoga is the latter, that of a supernormal nature. But even the startling claims of omniscience that one encounters in the text are relevant only as signposts of experiences that the yogī will encounter on the path of Yoga, not as articles of faith.
Returning to the term viśeṣa, “particularity” or “specificity,” the term is best understood in contrast to “sāmānya,” which refers to the general category of an object. Let us consider a “cow,” or the standard item used to exemplify a generic object in philosophical commentarial discourse, a “pot.” The word “cow” refers to a generic category of bovine creature with udders and horns, who give milk and go “moo”; and “pot” to a roundish container usually made of clay (in India) that holds liquids or other substances. Although there are millions of cows in the world, and each and every one is distinct, individual and unique in some way, the term “cow” does not particularize or distinguish one cow from another. It is a general term that refers to an entire category of creatures. Likewise with the term “pot.” The term sāmānya, then refers to the genus, species or general category of something; terms like “cow” and “pot,” indeed all words in human speech, refer to objects only in terms of their generic characteristics. Viśeṣa, by contrast is what particularizes ultimate entities from each other, and ultimately one atom from another (the delimiting feature an atom has that makes it a unique specific individual, distinct from any other atom).
According to Yoga, these three forms of knowledge as conventionally accepted are all limited because they cannot provide information about “particulars” or specifics. Verbal testimony is dependent on words, and words, like “cow,” can only point to the cow as a member of a general class of things – so when we say something like “there is a cow in the field,” we are only really giving information about the cow as a member of a species, and not about particulars: we are not conveying precise information about the specifics of the particular individual cow in question.
Along exactly the same lines, inference, also, only deals with generalities (and is, in fact, dependent on perception in the first place). As for empirical sense perception, it is true, say the commentators, that when we look at a particular cow or pot, we might be able to pick up on some characteristic that distinguishes the particular cow or pot in front of us from other cows and pots – perhaps this cow has odd skin color or the pot an odd shape. But conventional sense perception, says Vyāsa, cannot provide us information about the precisely specific or subtle nature of an object – its atomic composition for example, nor about distant or hidden objects beyond the range of the senses.
Only through the clear, unobstructed insight of samādhi can one fully grasp the viśeṣa, particularity, of an object, its subtle substructure of distinct atoms and subtle essences. Patañjali claims that the yogī can tell the difference between two identical items, since, although they appear identical to normal perception, the atoms comprising them are different, and it is these that the yogī can perceive. We must keep in mind that the yogic tradition claims one can actually perceive these essences through the undeviatingly concentrated focus of mind in the higher stages of samādhi, not merely theorize their existence. This perception, then, is actually a form of pratyakṣa, but not that of conventional sense perception. As noted earlier, the Yuktidīpikā commentary on Sāṁkhya points out that yogic pratyakṣa transcends normal sense-based perception. It is parapratyakṣa, “higher,” supreme, supernormal, perception.
Additionally, since the citta is by nature luminous, once the influences of rajas and tamas have been removed, there is nothing to obstruct its natural luminosity, and it can pass beyond the limitations inherent in finite objects due to the tamas preponderant in physical things. The ingredients of the mind itself are the same as those underpinning the object in external reality, the three guṇas; we must keep in mind here that the gross and subtle elements are nothing other than tamas-dominant evolutes from sattva-dominant buddhi and ahaṁkāra. Thus when fully sāttvic, the mind can transcend its own kleśa limitations (II.2ff) and merge into the common substratum of all things. This corresponds to such states as savicāra described in the section on samādhi, when the yogī’s awareness perceives that the subtle nature of the object of meditation as well as the meditating mind itself actually pervades all objects and thus all reality. So, once the obstructing qualities of rajas and tamas have been removed, then the pure luminosity of consciousness passes beyond the limitations of all boundaries and finite objects. In other words, the commentators claim that in the higher stages of samādhi, the yogī becomes essentially omniscient since awareness is no longer limited to the body or dimensionality but can radiate out infinitely and permeate the subtle substratum in the form of buddhi, ahaṁkāra, the tanmātra, etc. (as well as the specific conglomeration of atoms that emerge from these tanmātras), underpinning all objects. It can thus perceive the viśeṣa, particularity, that is, the specific atomic composition, of any particular object. As an aside, this ability reflects the metaphysics of the supernormal mystic powers inherent in the Yoga tradition, a discussion of which occupies almost a quarter of the text (but which are beyond the scope of this entry).
Patañjali outlines a practice essential for enhancing sattva and lucidity, the prerequisite for attaining steadiness in the mind. We have established by now that the path and attainments of Yoga are nothing other than the maximization of the guṇa of sattva. Central to the Yoga tradition, then, are the ethical and other practices indispensable to this objective. Verse I.33 states that as a result of cultivating an attitude of “friendship” with those who find themselves in a “situation of happiness,” one of “compassion” towards those in “distress,” one of “joy” towards “pious” selves, and one of “equanimity” or indifference towards the “impious,” sattva is generated. Consequently, the mind becomes lucid – clarity being the nature of sattva. Once clear, one-pointed concentration, or steadiness, which is the goal of meditational Yoga, can be achieved by the mind.
From an ethical point of view, by being a well-wisher towards those who are happy, as well as those who are virtuous, the contamination of envy is removed. By compassion towards those miserable, that is, by wishing to remove someone’s miseries as if they were one’s own, the contamination of the desire to inflict harm on others is removed. By equanimity towards the impious, the contamination of intolerance is removed. By thus removing these traits of envy, desire to inflict harm, and intolerance, which are characteristics of rajas and tamas, the sattva natural to the mind can manifest. In the ensuing state of lucidity, the inclination towards seeking higher truths by controlling the vṛttis, in other words towards cultivating a focused state of mind by the practice of yoga, spontaneously arises, because the inclination for enlightenment is natural to the pure sāttvic mind.
A further set of ethical practices indispensable for increasing the sattva component of the mind are the five yamas, observances (literally “restraints”) of chapter II: non-violence, truthfulness; refrainment from stealing; celibacy and renunciation of [unnecessary] possessions. From these, ahiṁsā, non-violence, is the yama singled out by the commentators for special attention, and therefore leads the list and thus, the entire eight limbs of Yoga (it seems important to note that the yamas themselves lead the list of the eight limbs suggesting that one’s yogic accomplishment remains limited until the yamas are internalized and put into practice) (YS II.30).
Vyāsa accordingly takes ahiṁsā as the root of the other yamas. He defines it as not injuring any living creature anywhere at any time. Just as the footprints of an elephant covers the footprints of all other creatures, so does ahiṁsā cover all the other yamas - one continues to undertake more and more vows and austerities for the sole purpose of purifying ahiṁsā.
Vyāsa defines “truth,” the second yama, as one’s words and thoughts being in exact correspondence to fact, that is, to whatever is known through the three processes of knowledge accepted by the Yoga school. Speech is for the transfer of one’s knowledge to others, and should not be deceitful, misleading or devoid of value. It should be for the benefit of all creatures, and not for their harm. However, underscoring the centrality of ahiṁsā – truth must never result in violence. In other words, if there is ever a conflict between the yamas – if observing one yama results in the compromise of another – then ahiṁsā must always be respected first.
“Refrainment from stealing,” the third yama, is described as not taking things belonging to others, and not even harboring the desire to do so. Vyāsa defines “celibacy” as the control of the sexual organs, and this is further refined by Vācaspati Miśra as not seeing, speaking with, embracing, or otherwise interacting with members of the opposite sex as objects of desire. In short, self-realization cannot be attained if one is sexually absorbed because this indicates that one is still seeking fulfillment on the sensual level, and thus misidentifying with the non-self.
Vyāsa defines “renunciation of possessions” as the ability to see the problems caused by the acquisition, preservation and destruction of things, since these only provoke attachment and injury. These yamas are considered the great vow; they are not exempted by one’s class, place, time or circumstance. They are universal in all aspects of life’s affairs and social interactions. Without them rajas and tamas cannot be curtailed, and the sattva essential to the higher stages of Yoga is unattainable.
Patañjali in YS I.23 states that the goal of Yoga can be attained by the grace of God, Ῑśvara-prāṇidhānād vā. The theistic, or Ῑśvaravāda element in Indic thought stretches back at least to the late Vedic period. Of the six “schools” of traditional thought that stem from this period, five – Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Vedānta, Yoga and Sāṁkhya – were, or became, theistic. Sāṁkhya, although often represented as nontheistic, was, in point of fact, widely theistic in its early expressions, and continued to retain widespread theistic variants outside of the later classical philosophical school associated with Ῑśvarakṛṣṇa, as evidenced in the Purāṇas and Bhagavad Gītā. Reflecting Patañjali’s undogmatic and nonsectarian sophistication, although Ῑśvara-praṇidhāna, “devotion to God” may not be the exclusive or mandatory way to attain realization of the self (given the particle vā “or” in I.23) it is clearly favored by him. The term “Ῑśvara” occurs in three distinct contexts in the Yoga Sūtras. The first, beginning with I.23, is in the context of how to attain the ultimate goal of Yoga, namely, the cessation of all thought, saṁprajñāta samādhi and realization of puruṣa. Patañjali presents dedication to Ῑśvara as one such option. But it is important to note the word va, “or,” in this sūtra, indicating that Patañjali presents devotion to Ῑśvara, the Lord, as an optional means of attaining samādhi, rather than an obligatory one.
In the ensuing discussion, Patañjali states that:
the Lord is a special self because he is untouched by the deposits of saṁskāras, karma and its fructification, and the obstacles to the practice of yoga, the kleśas of nescience, ego, attachment, aversion and the will-to-live. He is omniscient, and also the teacher of the ancients, because he is not limited by Time.
Given the primary context of the Sūtras, namely fixing the mind on an object, two sūtras, I.27–28, specify how Ῑśvara is to be meditated upon: “his designation is the mystical syllable “om,” and its repetition, japa, and the contemplation of its meaning should be performed.” This points to the ubiquitous and most prominent form of Hindu meditation from the classical period to the present day: mantra recitation (japa). As a result of this devotional type of meditation, “comes the realization of the inner consciousness and freedom from all obstacles.”
The second context in which Patañjali refers to Ῑśvara is in the first sūtra in chapter II, where kriyā yoga, the path of action, is described as consisting of austerity, study and devotion to the Lord. By performing such kriyā yoga, samādhi is attained and the obstacles (the kleśas of II.3), are weakened. Finally, Ῑśvara surfaces again in a third context in the second chapter, II.32, where the niyamas are listed. The niyamas, which are the second limb of the eight-limbed path of Yoga, consist of cleanliness, contentment, austerity, study and, as in the other two contexts, Ῑśvarapraṇidhāna, devotion to Ῑśvara (thus, the three ingredients of kriyā yoga are all niyamas). The various benefits associated with following the yamas and niyamas, ethics and morals, are noted in the ensuing sūtras of the chapter, and II.45 states that the benefit from the niyama of devotion to God is the attainment of samādhi. This is the final reference to Ῑśvara in the text, but it is significant, because all the boons mentioned as accruing from the other yamas and niyamas (there are ten in all) represent prakṛtic, or material, attainments – vitality, knowledge of past lives, detachment, etc., etc. It is only from Ῑśvarapraṇidhāna, the last item on the list of yamas and niyamas, that the ultimate goal of Yoga, samādhi, is achieved. These then are the gleanings that can be extracted from Patañjali’s characteristically frugal sūtras.
From these we can conclude that Patañjali is definitely promoting a degree of theistic practice in the Yoga Sūtras. Although in the first context, Ῑśvarapraṇidhāna, devotional surrender to God, is optional as a means of attaining samādhi, Patañjali does direct six sūtras to Ῑśvara, which is not insignificant given the frugality of his sūtras. This devotional surrender is not optional in the second context, kriyā yoga. Since it is likewise not optional in the third context as a niyama, which is a prerequisite to meditational yoga, Patañjali seems to be requiring that all aspiring yogīs be devotionally oriented in the preparatory stages to the higher goals of Yoga and, while in the higher, more meditational stages of practice they may shift their meditational focus of concentration to other objects – even, ultimately, to any object of their pleasing (I.39) – they would best be advised to retain Ῑśvara as object thereafter, since this “special puruṣa” can bestow perfection of samādhi which other objects cannot (II.45).
Patañjali also states that Ῑśvara is represented by the mystical syllable “om.” Om has been understood as a sonal incarnation of Brahman (which is the most common term used for the Absolute Truth in the Upaniṣads), since the late Vedic period. A scholastic such as Patañjali would most certainly have been well schooled in the Upaniṣads (especially given his own mandate of the prerequisite of study for success in yoga, II.1 & 44), which, as an orthodox thinker, he would have accepted as śruti, divine revelation. Even though he never refers to Brahman in the Sūtras, here again we must wonder whether along with all the Ῑśvara theologies of his time he is quite consciously equating the Upaniṣadic Brahman with this personal Ῑśvara, by means of this common denominator of om.
It is through the sound om that the yogi is to fix the mind on Ῑśvara. After all, since Ῑśvara, as a type of puruṣa, is beyond prakṛti, and therefore beyond conceptualization or any type of vṛtti, how is one to fix one’s mind upon him – the prakṛtic mind cannot perceive that which is finer than itself? Patañjali here provides the means: through the recitation of the syllable in which Ῑśvara manifests. Such recitation is called japa (an old Vedic term common in the old Brāhmaṇa texts, where it referred to the soft recitation of Vedic mantras by the priest.) By constantly repeating om and contemplating its meaning, artha, namely Ῑśvara, the mind of the yogī becomes one-pointed – the goal of all yoga practice. Repeating the sound om and “contemplating its meaning,” namely, that it is the sound representation of Ῑśvara, the object of the yogī’s surrender, when coupled with Patañjali’s usage of the word praṇidhāna, surrender, in I.23, points to chanting the mantra in a devotional mood. This is quintessential Hindu theistic meditation, the most prominent form of Hindu Yoga evidenced from antiquity to the present day.
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 15, 2012 | Originally published: