Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020—1077 C.E.)

Chang_TsaiZhang Zai was one of the pioneers of the Song dynasty philosophical movement called “Study of the Way,” often known as Neo-Confucianism. One of the most distinctive features of many of these new ways of thought being formulated at the time was an increased interest in metaphysics, usually influenced by the Classic of Changes (Yijing). Zhang’s most significant contributions to Chinese philosophy were primarily in the area of metaphysics, where he came up with a new theory of qi that was very influential. He is also credited with differentiating original nature and physical nature, which was to become a key concept in the most prominent Song philosophers, the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi). Ethically, his most influential doctrines were found in the brief essay “Western Inscription,” where he propounded the ideas of being one body with all things and universal caring. After his death, most of his disciples were absorbed into the Cheng brothers’ school and his thought become known primarily through the efforts of the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi, who honored Zhang as one of the founders of the Study of the Way.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Metaphysics
  3. Human Nature and Ethics
  4. Moral Education and the Heart
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Zhang Zai is also known as Zhang Hengqu, after the town where he grew up and later did much of his teaching. He was born in 1020 and died in 1077. As a youth he was interested in military affairs, but began studying the Confucian texts on the recommendation of an important official who was impressed with Zhang’s abilities. Like most of the Song philosophers, Zhang was initially dissatisfied with Confucian thought and studied Buddhism and Daoism for several years. Eventually, however, he decided that the Way was not to be found in Buddhism or Daoism and returned to Confucian texts. This acquaintance with the other major ways of thought was to have significant influence on Zhang’s own views. According to tradition, around 1056 Zhang sat on a tiger skin in the capital and lectured on the Classic of Changes. It may have been during this period that he first became acquainted with the Cheng brothers, who were actually his younger cousins. After passing the highest level of the civil service examinations, he held a series of minor government posts.

In 1069 Zhang was recommended to the emperor and given a position in the capital, but not long after he ran into conflict with the prime minister and retired home to Hengqu, where he spent his time in retirement studying and teaching. This was probably his most productive period for developing and spreading his own philosophy. In 1076 he completed his most important work, Correcting Ignorance, and presented it to his disciples. “Western Inscription” was originally part of this longer work. That same year he was summoned back to the capital and restored to an important position. However, in the winter he became ill and resigned again to try to convalesce at home. He never reached home, dying on the road in 1077. Zhang was awarded a posthumous title in 1220 and enshrined in the Confucian temple in 1241. Many of Zhang’s writings have been lost. Zhu Xi collected selections of Zhang’s writings in his anthology of Song Study of the Way known as Reflections on Things at Hand. His most important surviving works are probably his commentary on the Changes and Correcting Ignorance.

2. Metaphysics

Zhang Zai’s metaphysics is largely based on the Classic of Changes, especially one of the commentaries, “Appended Remarks,” traditionally attributed to Confucius. According to Zhang, all things of the world are composed of a primordial substance called qiQi is sometimes translated as “substance,” “matter,” or “material force, but there is really no term in English that can capture its meaning for Zhang. Qi originally meant “breath” and is a very old concept in Chinese culture, particularly medicine. For Zhang, qi includes matter and the forces that govern interactions between matter, yin and yang. In its dispersed, rarefied state, qi is invisible and insubstantial, but when it condenses it becomes a solid or liquid and takes on new properties. All material things are composed of condensed qi: rocks, trees, even people. There is nothing that is not qi. Thus, in a real sense, everything has the same essence, an idea which has important ethical implications.

Zhang believed that qi is never created or destroyed; the same qi goes through a continuous process of condensation and dispersion. He compared it to water: water in liquid form or frozen into ice is still the same water. Similarly, condensed qi which forms things or dispersed qi is still the same substance. Condensation is theyin force of qi and dispersion is the yang force. In its wholly dispersed state, Zhang refers to qi as the Great Vacuity, a term he adopted from the Zhuangzi. He emphasized that though this qi is insubstantial, it still exists, and thus is very different from the Buddhist concept of emptiness. Whereas Buddhists argued that the fact that everything changes shows it has no essence and is unreal, Zhang argued that the very fact that it changes proves it is real. Everything that is real is composed of qi, and since qi always changes, anything real must change. Although the Great Vacuity always exists, the particular qi that is dispersed into the Great Vacuity at any time is not the same, which allows Zhang to assert both that qi always changes and the Great Vacuity always remains. There is no such thing as creation ex nihilo for Zhang, an idea he attributes to both Buddhists and Daoists.

Qi begins dispersed and undifferentiated in the Great Vacuity and through condensation forms material things. When these material things pass away, their qi disperses and rejoins the Great Vacuity to begin the process again. What looks like creation and destruction is just the never-ending movements of qi. These processes of condensation and dispersion have no outside cause; they are just part of the nature of qi. Zhang wholly naturalized the workings of qi and rejected any idea of an anthropomorphic Heaven that controlled things. While the Classic of Changes talked of the workings of ghosts and spirits, he reinterpreted these terms to mean the extending and receding of qi from and back to the Great Vacuity. It is all a naturally occurring process.

Unlike later thinkers like the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi, the concept of pattern (li, also translated as “principle”) is not that important in Zhang’s philosophy. While in the thought of Cheng Yi and Zhu Xi, pattern is a transcendental universal that exists outside of qi, Zhang denied there was anything outside of qi. He seems to use pattern to describe the actions of qi condensing and dispersing, and for the pattern actions should fit to be moral. It certainly has none of the importance for Zhang that it did for some of his successors. Zhu Xi criticized Zhang for this, saying that qi was not enough to explain the workings of the universe without pattern as well.

3. Human Nature and Ethics

Mencius‘s belief that human nature is good, and his theory of qi allowed him to come up with what became the definitive Song answer to a classic problem in Mencius’ thought: if human nature is good, what makes people bad? Zhang’s solution involved positing two ways of looking at nature: the original nature and nature embodied in qi. Zhang claimed original nature exists forever in unchanging perfection, as opposed to material things which decay and die. This raises the question of what original nature consists of, since Zhang has claimed that everything is qi and qi always changes. He is not very clear on this point, but he apparently identified original nature with the undifferentiated qi of the Great Vacuity. When qi condenses to form human beings, each somehow retains some of the character of the unity of the Great Vacuity (or Great Harmony, as he sometimes calls it). This is the original nature, and that is what is good.

However, human beings also have a nature embodied in qi, which Zhang calls physical nature. Being ordinary qi, physical nature changes, eventually dissipating upon death. Zhang theorized that the physical nature obscures the original nature, preventing it from being fulfilled, and this is what causes people to stray from the path of goodness. At one point, he stated that if clear yang qi formed the greater part of physical nature one’s moral capacities would function, but if turbid yin qi dominated, material desires would hold sway. However, it is unclear whether he meant all yang qi was clear and all yin qi was turbid, and he often seems to attach no particular moral weight to whether qi is primarily yang (dispersed) or yin (condensed). As we are all different individuals, we all have slightly different physical natures. Some people are naturally bigger and stronger, some are more generous, some are wiser. This is all a result of the particular endowment of qi that makes up the individual, and since qi condenses into things without cause or direction, there is no reason an individual has the particular physical nature he starts out with: it is just a matter of chance. What is important in terms of moral cultivation is there is also the potential to transform one’s physical nature and fulfill one’s original nature.

Zhang had a deep faith in the potential for human improvement. Like earlier Confucian thinkers such as Mencius and Xunzi, he believed that moral development was a matter of effort, not ability. In a departure from his metaphysical views, where he held that qi changes naturally with no particular rhyme or reason, he claimed that the human heart has the capacity to alter one’s own qi. One can change one’s physical nature in order to fulfill one’s original nature. If that were not possible, goodness would be a matter of chance, being born with the right kind of qi. Zhang said that only the qi of life span, which determines whether one dies young or lives to an old age, cannot be changed. This was Zhang’s attack on longevity-oriented Daoists, who taught techniques that promised to increase one’s life span or even confer immortality. Undoubtedly, part of the goal of Zhang’s theory of qi and physical nature was to refute Buddhist and Daoist teachings.Many Song and Ming thinkers, such as Zhu Xi and Wang Yangming, identified desires as one of the main obstacles to moral development. Zhang Zai was no exception to this trend, which was also probably due to Buddhist influence. The issue of how to moderate or channel desires had been discussed in Chinese philosophy at least since Mencius and Xunzi, but while the earlier Confucian tradition had emphasized finding the proper outlet to express desires and not letting them entirely control one’s actions, eliminating desires entirely never seemed to be a real option. In Xunzi’s case, at least, he clearly denied it was possible to get rid of desires. Eliminating desires was a main focus of Buddhism, on the other hand, and this view of desires was adopted by many of these Study of the Way philosophers. These thinkers focused mainly on what we might call sensual desires. The desire to be a good person was naturally not a cause for concern, but desires for fine clothes, good food, and sex were seen as interfering with one’s original nature. Zhang used the term “material desires,” identifying them with physical nature, so they had to be overcome to return to one’s original nature. Desires somehow arise from the interaction of yin and yang that produces material objects, though Zhang is none too clear exactly what this process is. The fundamental point is that following one’s desires is giving into physical nature and regressing farther and farther away from original goodness.

Overcoming the desires of physical nature, one progresses toward original nature, or the heavenly within, as Zhang also put it. In “Western Inscription” Zhang illustrated this ideal state. Putting aside selfishness, one comes to understand the essential unity of all things. All things are formed from the same qi, and ultimately we all share the same substance. This was to become Zhang’s most famous ethical doctrine, the idea of forming one body with all things. As Zhang wrote in “Western Inscription, “That which fills the universe I regard as my body.” Everyone has Heaven and Earth as their father and mother, and thus everyone are brothers and sisters. Caring for others is like caring for one’s own family. Zhang further wrote, “Even those who are tired, infirm, crippled, or sick; those who have no brothers or children, wives, or husbands, are all my brothers who are in distress and have no one to turn to.” Though there are some precedents for this idea of brotherhood in earlier Confucianism, it sounds much more like the great compassion of Buddhism or the Mohist idea of universal caring—Zhang even uses the same term (jian’ai). In response to a question about this apparent slide into Mohism, Cheng Yi admitted that “Western Inscription” went a little too far, but still defended it as going beyond what previous sages had discussed and being as meritorious as Mencius’ idea of the goodness of human nature. Later thinkers recognized “Western Inscription” as Zhang’s greatest contribution to the Study of the Way.

4. Moral Education and the Heart

Presaging Zhu Xi, Zhang emphasized the role of education in moral development. Education was the way one transformed one’s qi and overcame physical nature. Following earlier philosophers such as Confucius and Xunzi, Zhang insisted that learning should always be directed toward moral cultivation, which in his case meant returning to one’s original nature. Knowledge was not important for its own sake, but for its contributions to moral character. Despite this, Zhang’s own interests were fairly wide-ranging, and he was especially interested in observing and explaining natural phenomena such as the movements of the stars and planets. Nevertheless, he tended not to emphasize this kind of scientific study in his writings on education, which focused on ritual and the classical Confucian texts. Compared with his contemporaries, Zhang placed more importance on the study of ritual. He believed ritual derived from original nature, and following it helps one hold onto original nature and overcome the obstructions of physical nature. Zhang’s interest in the Classic of Changes has already been mentioned, and he also recommended studying the other Confucian classics, the Analects, and Mencius. In contrast to some later Study of the Way philosophers, he did not put a lot of weight on histories, considering them inferior to the classics for helping people transform their qi.

Though Zhang recommended reciting and memorizing these books, he still believed that books were a means to returning to one’s original nature, not an end in themselves. Books functioned like a set of directions: they could tell you how to get to the destination, but they should be not confused with the destination. He felt close reading and textual criticism was not necessary, and getting too caught up in the meaning of a word or sentence could detract from understanding the overall meaning. And even in the classics, not everything should be accepted. Zhang recalled Mencius’ criticism of literal readings of the Classic of Documents and pointed out the necessity for understanding the classics in light of one’s own sense of what is right. This seems to set up a paradox: a student needs to study the classics to return to his original nature and know what is right, but he needs to know what is right to properly understand the classics.

Zhang resolved this contradiction by positing an innate moral sense in everyone that he called “this heart,” a term he apparently adopted from the Mencius. “This heart” presumably belongs to the original nature, and is still present even when embodied in qi, but it can be obstructed and blocked by the physical nature. Zhang referred to this situation as the problem of the “fixed heart” blocking “this heart.” The fixed heart means having intentions, certainty, inflexibility, and egotism. Under these conditions, “this heart” will not function properly and one will have difficulty understanding the classics. The learner must get rid of the fixed heart to let “this heart” free. At times, Zhang suggests that reading books itself helps preserve “this heart,” and it is this heart itself that understands the Way. Ritual is perhaps more important than books. Zhang once suggested that even the illiterate could still develop “this heart,” but apparently ritual was indispensable in overcoming the fixed heart.

Zhang also talked of “expanding the heart” and “making the heart vast.” Both these phrases mean eliminating the obstructions of the fixed heart and putting the heart in a state where it is ready to understand. He tended to value knowledge apprehended directly through the heart over knowledge from sense perception. Zhang did not deny the validity of empirical knowledge, but he believed its scope was limited. Knowledge gained from sense perception is just knowledge of things, not knowledge of the Way. Knowledge of the Way is knowledge gained through the virtuous nature, not through sense perception. “Knowledge gained through the virtuous nature” is another way of saying knowledge apprehended directly by the heart, though Zhang seems to be talking more about a kind of mystic experience than rationalism: he wrote that understanding of the Way is not something thought and consideration can bring about.

The goal of moral cultivation was fulfilling one’s original nature. This was Zhang Zai’s definition of becoming a sage, the term in Chinese philosophy for a perfected person. Another term common in philosophical discourse of the time was integrity or authenticity (cheng). Integrity figured in some important passages in the Doctrine of the Mean, which was one of the most important Confucian texts in Song Study of the Way. Zhang emphasized “integrity resulting from clarity,” which he explained as first coming to understanding through study and inquiry and then fulfilling one’s nature. This could be a long and difficult process, but if one could persist and make the necessary effort, one could fulfill one’s nature and become a sage. There was no greater goal for Zhang.

5. References and Further Reading

Very little is available in English on Zhang Zai. The reader is encouraged to look into general histories of Chinese philosophy, especially those dealing with neo-Confucianism, in addition to the works listed here.

  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • Translates a selection of Zhang’s works, focusing on Correcting Ignorance.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Chu Hsi and Lü Tsu-chien. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • This probably contains the most extensive collection of Zhang’s writings in English. Chan includes a finding list to help the reader find the selections of a particular philosopher.
  • Chow, Kai-wing. “Ritual, Cosmology, and Ontology: Chang Tsai’s Moral Philosopy.” Philosophy East and West 43.2 (April 1993): 201-28.
    • Emphasizes the importance of ritual in moral development.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. “Chang Tsai’s Concept of Ch’i.” Philosophy East and West 18.4 (October 1968): 247-60.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. “The Moral Point of View of Chang Tsai.” Philosophy East and West 21.2 (April 1971): 141-56.
  • Kasoff, Ira. The Thought of Chang Tsai. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
    • This is the only English-language monograph on Zhang’s philosophy.
  • T’ang, Chün-i. “Chang Tsai’s Theory of Mind and Its Metaphysical Basis.” Philosophy East and West 6.2 (July 1956): 113-36.

Author Information

David Elstein
State University of New York at New Paltz
U. S. A.

Last updated: September 3, 2004 | Originally published: