Zhong Hui (Chung Hui) was a major philosophical figure during China’s early medieval period (220-589 CE). An accomplished interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing, Zhong Hui contributed significantly to the early development of xuanxue—literally “learning” (xue) of the “dark” or “mysterious” (xuan) Dao (“Way”), but sometimes translated as “Neo-Daoism“. He also was a major political figure whose ambition eventually led to his untimely demise. Virtually all of Zhong Hui’s writings have been lost, which perhaps explains why he has been given scant attention by students of Chinese philosophy. Had he not failed in his attempt to overthrow the regime of his day, no doubt his writings would have been preserved and given the attention they justly deserve. In particular, his views on human “capacity and nature” (caixing), as developed in his interpretation of the Laozi, are major contributions to xuanxue philosophy, which dominated the Chinese intellectual scene from the third to the sixth century CE. In contrast to other thinkers of the time, who argued that capacity and nature are the same (tong), different (yi), or diverge from one another (li), Zhong Hui argued that they coincide (he). In effect, he proposed that what is endowed is potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to completion through learning and effort. While one’s native endowment is not sufficient, one must have some material to begin with in order to achieve the desired result. Thus, it cannot be said that the latter has nothing to do with the former.
Toward the end of the second century CE, the once glorious Han dynasty (founded in 206 BCE) was already in irreparable decline, with regional military commanders competing for power and control. Among them, Cao Cao (155–220) proved the strongest and in 220 CE his son, Cao Pi (187–226), formally ended the rule of Han and established the Wei dynasty (220–265).
The third century was a time of profound change. The end of the Han dynasty brought political turmoil and hardship; but it also cleared a space for intellectual renewal. The Confucian tradition that dominated much of the Han intellectual landscape now seemed powerless to overcome the forces of disorder that threatened to tear the country asunder. Indeed, to some scholars Han Confucianism was not only ineffective as a remedy, but also part of the problem that led to the downfall of the Han dynasty. New approaches to reestablishing order were urgently needed. In this context, xuanxue was born.
The word xuan literally depicts a shade of black with dark red. It appears prominently in the Laozi, signifying metaphorically the profound unfathomability of the Dao. For this reason, xuanxue has been translated as “Neo-Daoism.” However, while it is true that third-century Chinese philosophers turned to the Laozi for insight, the term “Neo-Daoism” can be misleading because mainstream xuanxue was never a partisan Daoist or “anti-Confucian” movement. Rather, xuanxue scholars saw the whole classical heritage as embodying the truth of the Dao. In other words, Confucius, Laozi, and other sages and near-sages of old were all concerned with unlocking the mystery of Dao, to lay out a blueprint for order. They were all “Daoists” in this sense. What seemed necessary was a radical reinterpretation of the classical tradition that would eradicate the distortions and excesses of Han Confucianism and reestablish the rule of Dao, in both practice and theory, in government and learning. To avoid misunderstanding, most scholars today prefer to translate xuanxue as “Dark Learning,” or more clumsily but less ambiguous, “Learning of the Mysterious (Dao).”
Although the Wei dynasty had to contend with two rival kingdoms during its early years, there was a sense of optimism that order could be restored. There were eager attempts to reform public administration, especially the process of appointment of officials, and law. During the Zhengshi reign period (240–249) of the Wei dynasty in particular, there was a flurry of intellectual activities that saw the first wave of xuanxue scholars arriving on the scene. Zhong Hui was a significant player in this development.
Zhong Hui hailed from a distinguished family, politically influential and known especially for its expertise in law. His father, Zhong You (d. 230), was one of the most powerful statesmen in the early Wei regime and a noted calligrapher and Yijing expert as well. From the start, Zhong Hui was groomed to follow in his father’s footsteps. Zhong Hui himself recounts that he began his formal education under the guidance of his mother with the Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) at the age of three. He then studied the Analects, Shijing (Classic of Poetry), Shujing (Book of Documents), the Yijing (with his father’s commentary), and other classics before he was sent to the imperial academy to further his studies at the age of fourteen. The Zhong family evidently held a special interest in the Yijing and the Laozi. Zhong You had written on both, and Zhong Hui’s mother was also a dedicated student of the Laozi and the Yijing.
As Zhong Hui’s biography in the Sanguozhi (History of the Three Kingdoms) relates, he began his official career as an assistant in the palace library during the Zhengshi era. Reputed for his wide learning and skill in disputation, he was soon promoted to serve as a deputy secretary at the Central Secretariat. At that time, Cao Shuang (d. 249) controlled the Wei court. On the intellectual front, many looked to He Yan (d. 249) as their leader. Zhong Hui was then part of this elite circle. He and Wang Bi (226–249), in particular, were singled out as among the brightest and most promising of their generation. (Wang Bi, of course, now occupies a hallowed place in the history of Chinese philosophy as a brilliant interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing.)
The scene took a sudden change in 249 when Sima Yi (179–251) successfully staged a coup that led to the death of Cao Shuang, He Yan, and other members of their faction. After Sima Yi’s death, control of the Wei government came into the hands of his two sons, Sima Shi (208–255) and Sima Zhao (211–265). In 265, the latter’s son, Sima Yan, (236–290) formally ended the reign of Wei and established the Jin dynasty (265–420).
The fall of Cao Shuang and He Yan in 249 marked a turning point in Wei politics. Zhong Hui managed to keep out of harm’s way despite his apparent association with the Cao faction. After 249, Zhong Hui was able to retain his post at the Central Secretariat and soon became a key member of the Sima regime. Rising from Palace Attendant to Metropolitan Commandant, and to General of the Suppression of the West in 262, Zhong Hui achieved remarkable success in the political arena. In 263, in recognition of his role in the conquest of the rival kingdom of Shu, he was made Chief Minister of Culture and Instruction, one of the “Three Excellencies” of state. At the height of his power, Zhong Hui considered his achievement to be unsurpassed in the world and that he could no longer serve under anyone. Calculating that he had control of a formidable army and that he could at least claim the land of Shu even if he failed to conquer the entire country, Zhong Hui decided to turn against the Sima government. He was killed by his own troops in the first month of 264.
Few of Zhong Hui’s writings have survived. A Zhong Hui ji (Collected Works) in nine scrolls has been reported, but it is no longer extant. He was also an accomplished poet; a few fragments of his poetry in the fu (prose-poem) style have been preserved in various sources. Zhong Hui seems to have written two essays on the Yijing, although little of his Yijing learning can now be reconstructed. He was the author of a commentary on the Laozi. He also contributed significantly to a debate on the relationship between “capacity and nature” (caixing).
In early medieval China, caixing was one of the basic topics about which every intellectual was expected to be able to say something. Fu Jia (also pronounced Fu Gu, 209–255), who criticized He Yan during the Zhengshi era and later acted as a major policy maker in the Sima administration, is generally acknowledged to be the leading figure in this debate. Zhong Hui, who became a junior associate of Fu Jia after 249, is said to have “collected and discussed” the latter’s deliberation on the “identity and difference of capacity and nature.” Zhong’s work presents four views on the subject, including his own, and is given the title Caixing siben lun (On the Four Roots of Capacity and Nature). Despite its evident popularity in Wei-Jin China, other than the general position of the four views and the individuals who hold them, which will be introduced later, we have no further knowledge of this work.
According to Du Guangting (850–933), He Yan, Wang Bi, and Zhong Hui all attempted in their interpretation of the Laozi to make clear “the way of ultimate emptiness and nonaction, and of governing the family and the country.” Unfortunately, Zhong Hui’s Laozi commentary has been lost, probably since the end of the Song dynasty (960-1279). Today, we can only see glimpses of Zhong’s Laozi learning through about 25 quotations from his commentary preserved in a number of sources.
When xuanxue became an established trend during the Jin dynasty, its supporters looked back to the Zhengshi period rather nostalgically as the “golden age” of philosophical debate and criticism. The concept of wu—variously translated as “nothing,” “nothingness,” “nonbeing” or “negativity”—is often singled out as the key to this new learning. As the Jin scholar Wang Yan (256–311) puts it, “During the Zhengshi period, He Yan, Wang Bi, and others propounded the teachings of Laozi and Zhuangzi. They established the view that heaven and earth and the myriad things are all rooted in wu.” Zhong Hui was among the “others” who sought to reformulate classical learning by focusing on the mysterious Dao, on the basis of which government and society may be restructured to establish lasting peace and order. What must be emphasized is that xuanxue is not monolithic. The concept of wu generates a new focus, but it is subject to interpretation, with different ethical and political implications.
The concept of wu fundamentally serves to bring out the mystery of Dao, which is “nameless” and “formless,” according to the Laozi, and as such transcends language and sensory perception. As Zhong Hui understands it, the Dao is “shadowy, dark, dim, and obscure; it is therefore described as xuan” (commentary to Laozi 1). The Dao is also described as “silent and void” in the Laozi. This means, Zhong explains, that it is “empty and without substance” (comm. to Laozi 25).
Though formless and nameless, dark and mysterious, the Dao is nonetheless said to be the “beginning” and “mother” of all things (e.g., Laozi 1 and 42). Indeed, according to the Laozi, “All things under heaven are born of you (something); you is born of wu (nothing)” (ch. 40). This obviously requires explanation.
Life is essentially constituted by “vital energy” (qi). This can be regarded as the generally accepted view in traditional China. Applied to the Laozi, this suggests that the Dao should be understood as the source of the essential qi that generated the yin and yang energies at the “beginning.” Through a process of further differentiation, the created order then came into being. As the origin of the vital energy or cosmic “pneuma” that makes life possible, the Dao is indeed formless and nameless, and for this reason may be described as “nothing” (wu), in the sense of not having any characteristics of things. But, wu does not connote metaphysical “nonbeing,” “negativity,” or absence. Zhong Hui shares this view. In contrast, Wang Bi emphasizes in his commentary on the Laozi that the multiplicity of beings logically demands a prior ontological unity. From this perspective, “Dao” does not refer to a kind of primordial, undifferentiated substance, formless and of which nothing can be said; rather, it signifies the necessary ground of being.
According to the Laozi, “Heaven models after the Dao. The Dao models after what is naturally so (ziran)” (ch. 25). According to Zhong Hui, the reason the Dao is described as ziran is that “no one knows whence it comes.” Moreover, the Laozi observes, “The great image does not have any form” (ch. 41). The context suggests that the “great image” is a metaphor for the Dao, and this is how Zhong Hui has understood it: “There is no image that does not respond to it; this is what is called the ‘great image’. Since it does not have any bodily shape, how can it have any form or appearance?” In these instances, the mystery of Dao has little to do with “nonbeing” as an abstract concept, but rather intimates the ever-existing and formless nature of the generative force that brought forth heaven and earth and the myriad beings.
The Dao is also called the “One,” as Zhong Hui interprets the Laozi. It is “ceaseless, indeed, yet it does not have any ties; overflowing, yet it does not become diminished. Subtle and wondrous, it is difficult to name it. In the end, it returns to a state of not being anything (with discernible characteristics)” (comm. to Laozi 14; cf. comm. to Laozi 39). Limitless and ultimately unfathomable, the Dao is indeed “subtle and wondrous” and therefore “difficult to name,” but it is a real presence. The Laozi states that the Dao “stands on its own and does not change.” Zhong Hui explains, “Solitary, without a mate, it is therefore said to be ‘standing on its own’. From antiquity to the present, it is always one and the same; thus it is stated, it ‘does not change’” (comm. to Laozi 25). Further, the Laozi specifically points out that the Dao “operates everywhere and is free from danger” (ch. 25). Zhong Hui’s commentary here reads: “There is no place that the Dao is not present; it is (thus) described as ‘operating everywhere’. Where it is present, it penetrates everything; thus it is without danger.”
For Zhong Hui, the concept of Dao thus explains from a cosmological perspective the genesis of being and the emergence of order in the cosmos. The Laozi may seem to privilege the concept of wu, to bring out the indefinable fullness of the Dao, over the concept of you, which subsumes under it the world of things, but in the final analysis the two are interdependent in enabling the proper functioning of the universe. Finding an apt illustration in a common mode of transportation in early China, the Laozi thus announces in chapter 11 that “thirty spokes” join into one hub; but the use or function of the wheel, and by extension the carriage or cart as a whole, is not so much dependent on the solid spokes as the empty space within the hub. Similarly, clay may be shaped and treated to make vessels, and doors and windows cut out to make a room; but it is the “emptiness” of the vessel or room that makes possible its use or function. “Therefore,” the Laozi concludes, “having something (you) is what produces benefit, (but) having nothing (wu) is what produces use.”
To Zhong Hui, the Laozi makes use of these metaphors “to bring to light that you and wu gain from each other, and neither can be neglected …. Wu depends on you to become of benefit; you relies on wu to be of use.” The relationship between wu and you may be likened to that between “interiority” (nei) and “externality” (wai)—concrete objects are able to function and generate value externally because of their inner capacity endowed by the Dao in the form of vital energies. The interdependence of you and wu represents an intrinsic “law” in a Dao-centered universe (comm. to Laozi 11). This has important ethical implications.
Derived from the Dao, the world reflects a pristine order. In the ideal Dao-centered world, filial love and respect, for example, would be entirely spontaneous and thus unremarkable, which is why the Laozi regards “filial piety” in the Confucian sense as a virtue that merits praise and has to be perfected if not acquired as having arisen only after the decline of the Dao (Laozi 18). Deliberate effort at bringing love and respect into the world, in other words, proves necessary only after natural filial affection has been lost. Thus Zhong Hui writes, “If the nine generations of the family are all in accord, then love and respect will have no cause to be applied. ‘When the six relations are not in harmony’ [as the Laozi phrases it], then filial piety and compassion will become conspicuous.” The concept of “naturalness” (ziran), in this sense, involves not only the regularity of natural processes and the plenitude of nature but also a perceived “natural” harmony and order in the social arena.
The pristine Dao-derived order has been lost. The aim of xuanxue is to restore this order. For Zhong Hui, the process of recovery begins with self-cultivation, which requires careful tending of one’s qi-energy. According to Zhong Hui, “the soul manages and protects its form and qi, so as to enable it to last long.” This is why the Laozi urges the people to “look after the soul and embrace the One” (comm. to Laozi 10).
Aligned with the yin-yang, cosmological theory, the idea that human beings are constituted spiritually and physically by qi was well established by the third century. No bifurcation of “soul” and “body” is implied. Both are constituted by qi, although the “qi of the blood” may be less “pure” when compared with the more subtle qi of the soul or spirit. In this context, self-cultivation involves both nourishing and purifying the vital qi-energy.
Chapter 12 of the Laozi warns that the “five colors cause one’s eyes to become blind,” and of the other harmful effects that stem from indulging in one’s senses. The Laozi concludes: “For this reason the sage is for the belly and not for the eyes.” Emphasizing the importance of self-cultivation, Zhong Hui relates this to the being of the ideal sage: “The genuine vital energy pervades (the sage’s) inner being; thus it is said, (he is) ‘for the belly’. Externally, desires have been eliminated; thus, it is said, ‘not for the eyes’.”
Here, the complementarity of the “inner” and the “outer” again guides Zhong Hui’s interpretation. The sage is always mindful of his qi-nature in everything he does and certainly does not live to satisfy the senses. On the opening sentence of Laozi 16—“Attain utmost emptiness; maintain complete tranquility”—Zhong Hui again stresses this point: “… eliminate emotions and worries to reach the ultimate of emptiness. The mind is always quiet, so as to maintain complete tranquility.”
Self-cultivation translates into certain effects or ways of doing things at both the personal and political levels. The Laozi states: “The yielding and weak will overcome the hard and strong” (ch. 36). In this same chapter, the Laozi elaborates, “If you would have a thing shrink, stretch it first.” Zhong Hui comments: “If one wishes to control the hard and strong, one assumes the appearance of being submissive and weak. Stretch it first; shrink it afterward—win or lose, (the outcome) is certain.” In chapter 22, the Laozi brings out the central Daoist insight that preservation or fulfillment does not lie in self-aggrandizement or aggressive action but in self-effacement and non-contention, in embracing humility and the way of “yieldingness.” “If one is truly able to keep being yielding,” Zhong Hui reasons, then “everything will certainly return to him”—that is to say, all successes and benefits will as a matter of course belong to him. In the ideal Dao-centered world, this would describe the being of the sage-ruler, who abides by naturalness, acts with “nonaction” (wuwei) in the sense of yieldingness, and whose inner tranquility would ensure the absence of selfish desire and the flourishing of the realm.
The sage is someone who possesses “superior virtue,” as the Laozi describes it. Zhong Hui explains: “(He who) embodies the wondrous and subtle spirit to preserve the transformations (of nature) is (the man of) superior virtue” (comm. to Laozi 38). In the government of the sage, penal laws and punishment do not apply, for the sage is able to transform the people through nonaction, guiding them to regain their natural simplicity (comm. to Laozi 19). This is the reign of “great peace” (taiping) as envisaged by the majority of xuanxue scholars, in which virtues would naturally abound and family relations would be in complete harmony. Can great peace be attained? There is no question that a sage can realize the taiping ideal; but is it the case that sages alone can bring about great peace? Can it not be realized by worthy and able rulers and ministers, who are committed to the way of the sage but are not sages? Zhong Hui could not but be concerned with this question, which began to surface during the Han period and continued to attract debate during the early years of the Wei dynasty. In fact, Zhong Hui’s father, Zhong You, asserts unequivocally that sages are necessary for the realization of great peace.
The role of the sage in realizing great peace presupposes a prior understanding of the nature of the sage. Is “sagehood” inborn, or can it be acquired through effort? This was a major topic of discussion also among the Wei elite. The prevalent view in early xuanxue seems to be that sages are born, not made, a view to which Zhong Hui subscribes and which stems directly from a cosmological understanding of the Dao, particularly the deciding role of qi in shaping the nature and destiny of human beings.
In a cosmological interpretation, the Dao informs all beings, provides them with a “share” of its potent energy, which accounts for their lifespan, capacity, and all other aspects of their being. Sages are exceptional beings, whose qi-endowment is extraordinarily pure and abundant. On this basis, He Yan, for example, thus argues that “sages do not have emotions,” which attracted a substantial following during the Zhengshi period. Zhong Hui was drawn to He Yan’s view and is said to have developed it in his own thinking. As the Sanguozhi relates, “He Yan maintained that the sage does not have pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy. His views were extremely cogent, on which Zhong Hui and others elaborated.”
Emotions are “impure” qi-agitations that disturb the mind and render impossible the work of sagely government. The sage, blessed with the finest and richest energy that arises from the “One,” is free from such qi-imperfections, which enables him to be absolutely impartial and to realize great peace not only within himself but also in government. The sage, in other words, is utterly different from ordinary human beings. On this view, this is a basic difference in qi-constitution, which amounts to a difference in kind and not in degree. “Sagehood,” in other words, should be understood in terms of a sage nature that is inborn and not an accomplished goal that is attainable through learning and effort.
If Zhong Hui is of the view that sage nature is inborn, why does he emphasize self-cultivation to fortify the qi within and to eliminate desires? As we have seen also, Zhong Hui affirms that the “soul,” if properly managed and protected, can “last long.” Does this show that he believes in the existence of “immortals” (xian) and that it is possible to attain immortality? In a fu poem on the chrysanthemum (Juhuafu), Zhong Hui writes, “Thus, the chrysanthemum … [if ingested] flows within and renders the body light; it is the food of immortals.” Further, in the same poem, Zhong rhapsodizes, “Those who ingest it would live long, and those who consume it would find their spirit unobstructed.” Zhong Hui has also written a fu on grapes (Putaofu), in which he describes the fruit as “having embodied the finest qi in nature.”
It is not surprising that Zhong Hui accepts the existence of immortals, which was a widely held belief at that time. Whether it is an immortal or a sage, the same reasoning applies. Only a select few are endowed at birth with the necessary qi-condition to develop into a sage or immortal. An ordinary human being cannot learn to become a sage, who is a different kind of being, but self-cultivation remains important because it is possible to nourish and purify one’s qi-endowment by means of certain substances and practices. In other words, although complete “transcendence” may be beyond reach, one can remove obstacles to personal fulfillment, prevent corruption of one’s nature, and ensure that one’s capacity is developed to the fullest.
The idea that only sages can realize great peace is grounded in this conception of the nature of the sage. If one believes, as Zhong Hui does, that the sage is of a special breed, absolutely pure and without cognitive-affective qi-disturbances, it would not make much sense to say that even those who are not sages could realize the reign of great peace. The uniqueness of the sage would then be inconsequential. Zhong Hui would thus agree with his father that great peace is an ideal realizable only by sages. Opposed to this is the view that it is possible to attain great peace even without the intervention of sages. What is crucial is that we learn from the ancient sages. If able and worthy individuals such as Yi Yin of the Shang dynasty and Yan Yuan (Yan Hui), the exemplary disciple of Confucius, were entrusted with governing the country, and if their policies would continue for several generations, then great peace may be realized.
From this latter perspective, the difference between a sage such as Confucius and worthies such as Yan Yuan is a matter of degree. Moreover, this implies that we can learn from the sages and worthies, which signals a particular Confucian approach to government and education. Benevolent government requires men of integrity and talent to serve the public good. Education is necessary to transmit the teaching of the sages and to lay a strong moral foundation. Care and compassion are required in the administration of justice. Step by step, with rulers and ministers serving as examples, the transformative power of Confucian virtues would instill benevolence and propriety in the hearts of the people or at least render them willing and obedient subjects. In this way, lasting order and peace may be secured.
Both camps considered Confucius to be the ideal sage. But whereas to some, Confucius was a great teacher, to others he embodied the best of heaven and earth. It would be impossible to be like Confucius in every respect, according to the latter; the assertion that great peace could be realized by able and worthy men would undermine the supra-mundane status of Confucius, who was such an exalted figure as to exclude the possibility of someone else matching his attainment. The sage is fundamentally different from “mere” mortals, and the sage alone can realize lasting peace. This implies a certain distrust of the nature and capacity of the people, who are driven by desires. It is important thus to curb one’s desires and to maintain tranquility. But this, too, can only be achieved by a few. For the majority, laws and models are necessary. They serve as the “outer” instruments that would complement the call to embrace “emptiness” within.
The concept of “law” (fa) is not limited to criminal justice. It concerns proper rulership and sociopolitical order at large. The principles of government must be clearly delineated for the rule of law to apply. In particular, the various duties and functions of officials must be carefully defined, so that there is accountability and quality control. Precisely because great peace can be realized only by sages, and given that sages are rare, government should depend on laws and processes, as opposed to individuals, so that official positions and duties would be occupied and performed by the right persons, laws and punishment would be appropriate, and in all aspects the “inner” and the “outer” would attain their proper balance.
Although the evidence at our disposal is limited, a consistent approach emerges from the surviving fragments of Zhong Hui’s Laozi commentary. Guided by a hermeneutic that equates the nothingness of Dao with the fullness of qi, Zhong Hui probes the basis of personal well-being and sociopolitical order. The pristine order of the Dao is characterized by intrinsic laws and standards, which ensure the smooth functioning of the cosmos and the integrity of sociopolitical institutions. Order would flourish in this ideal world, and remedial action would be superfluous. In a world where the Dao has declined, only a true sage can realize genuine order and peace. In the absence of a sage-ruler, due process is required to ensure sound governance, social stability and that justice prevails. In the context of early Wei politics, the system of official appointment would be of particular concern to those who seek to reestablish the rule of Dao.
In this context, the debate on capacity and nature may be understood. Zhong Hui is particularly noted for his contribution to this debate, which involves four positions—namely, that capacity and nature are the same (tong); that they are different (yi); that they coincide (he); and that they diverge from each other (li).
Fu Jia apparently initiated the debate by arguing for the first position. The second is represented by Li Feng (d. 254), who was Director of the Central Secretariat and whom Fu Jia denounced as pretentious and false. Zhong Hui held the third view, and Wang Guang (d. 251), who like Zhong Hui was a junior officer during the Zhengshi period, argued for the last position. Zhong Hui’s treatise, however, was no longer available by the early sixth century.
It has been suggested that the debate should be understood in terms of the political struggles between the Cao faction and the Sima faction during the Zhengshi period. Whereas Fu Jia and Zhong Hui (before his attempted revolt) sided with the Sima regime, both Li Feng and Wang Guang were struck down by it. This is an important observation. However, philosophically, what does it mean to say that capacity and nature are the same? In what sense can they be said to “coincide”?
The first position seems relatively straightforward in the light of the concept of qi. Inborn nature can be understood in terms of one’s innate capacity, which encompasses one’s physical, intellectual, moral, psychological, and spiritual endowments. In Fu Jia’s account, both capacity and nature are seen to be determined by qi-endowment. Whereas nature is the inner substance, capacity reaches outward and translates into ability as well as moral conduct. This view finds eloquent support in the Caixing lun (Treatise on Capacity and Nature) by another third-century scholar, Yuan Zhun. All beings that exist in heaven and earth, according to Yuan, can be either excellent or of a bad quality. Whereas the former is endowed with a “pure qi,” the latter is constituted by a “turbid energy.” It is like a piece of wood, Yuan adds: whether it is crooked or straight is a matter of nature, on the basis of which it has a certain capacity that can be made to serve particular ends. The same is true for human beings, who may be “worthy” or “unworthy” by nature. To argue that nature and capacity are the same, Fu Jia cannot but maintain also that sagacity is inborn.
Li Feng counters that capacity and nature are different. Fu Jia had misconstrued the relationship between capacity and nature, because whereas nature may be inborn, capacity is shaped by learning. This suggests that any accomplishment, moral or political, is ultimately dependent on effort. Fu Jia is evidently committed to affirming that a person may be born good or bad, strong or weak, bright or dull, depending on his or her qi-endowment. Li Feng’s counterview, however, proceeds on the premise that nature is “neutral” or unmarked, morally and in all other respects. What is endowed at birth is simply the biological apparatus to grow and to learn, but the person one becomes is a matter of learning and putting into practice the teachings of the sages. Yu Huan, a third-century historian, provides a helpful analogy: the effect of learning on a person is like adding color to a piece of plain silk. This should align with the view that sagehood can be achieved through effort and that sages are not necessary to realizing great peace, given the perceived transformative power of learning.
Zhong Hui’s position may be seen as an attempt to mediate between these two opposing views. Given Zhong Hui’s understanding of qi and the nature of the sage, he would obviously side with Fu Jia in this debate. Yet, the “identity” thesis seems to assume that what is endowed is both necessary and sufficient. Although native endowment is necessary for realized capacity, Zhong Hui is saying, it is not sufficient. Thus, when capacity is said to “coincide” with nature, Zhong Hui is in effect proposing that what is endowed is potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to completion. For immortals and sages, who are different in kind because of their exceptional qi-endowment, what is inner in the sense of innate capacity naturally manifests itself completely in extraordinary achievements. For ordinary human beings, however, nature does not amount to actual ability but only furnishes certain dispositions or directions of development. To be sure, if the native endowment is extremely poor, there is not much that can be done. Nevertheless, the real challenge to the identity thesis is that an excellent endowment may go to waste because the person succumbs to desire and would not learn. The inner provides the capital, but it requires external control to maintain its value, to generate profit, and to bring the investment to a successful close.
In response to Li Feng’s critique of Fu Jia, Zhong Hui thus offers a modified identity thesis that takes into account the place of learning and effort. Although having the “right stuff,” as it were, is not sufficient, one must have some material to begin with in order to achieve the desired result. Thus, it cannot be said that the latter has nothing to do with the former. In this context, Wang Guang adds a fourth view, which is stronger than Li Feng’s and appears to be directed especially against Zhong Hui’s position. Inborn nature does not provide the necessary fertile ground for cultivation; rather, it needs to be rectified by learning. Human beings are naturally driven by desire and therefore must rely on rituals and instruction to become responsible individuals. In this sense, capacity and nature do not “coincide” but “diverge” from each other.
The debate on caixing demonstrates the richness and complexity of xuanxue. The debate may have particular political relevance, but it presupposes an understanding of the origin and structure of the cosmos, the role of self-cultivation, the rule of law, the nature of the sage, and other issues central to Wei-Jin thought. The four views engage one another in coming to terms with the basis of goodness and other forms of excellence. Zhong Hui’s view on capacity and nature is consistent with his interpretation of the Laozi, both of which should be recognized as a major contribution to xuanxue philosophy. Had he not attempted to topple the Sima regime, or more precisely had he not failed in that attempt, no doubt his writings would have been preserved and given the attention they justly deserve.
Alan Kam-Leung Chan
National University of Singapore
Last updated: June 16, 2007 | Originally published: