Zhou Dunyi (Chou Tun-i, 1017-1073)

Zhou DunyiZhou Dunyi (sometimes romanized as Chou Tun-i and also known by his posthumous name, Zhou Lianxi) has long been highly esteemed by Chinese thinkers.  He is considered one of the first “Neo-Confucians,” a group of thinkers who draw heavily on Buddhist and Daoist metaphysics to articulate a comprehensive, Confucian religious philosophy.

This article begins with a brief look at Zhou’s life and historical context before turning to a detailed examination of his major writings.  It then looks at major themes in Zhou’s work as well as a few important philosophical concerns that his writings address.  Finally, it turns to Zhou’s legacy and influence, providing information on additional readings for further study of Zhou’s thought.

Zhou combines deep spirituality with an emphasis on morality and politics. He places this humanistic ideal within a cosmic vision wherein the forces of creation find their fullest expression in human beings.  Essentially, he articulates the common metaphysical framework that informed Chinese philosophy for nearly a millennium.  In his work, Zhou follows earlier thinkers such as Mencius (Mengzi, 372-289 B.C.E.), but, unlike some of his stricter Confucian brethren, Zhou draws heavily on ideas associated with Daoism and Buddhism. This is particularly the case with Zhou’s stress on the primacy of “stillness” (qing) over “activity” (dong) and his strong cosmological orientation.  Moreover, Zhou’s temperament seems marked more by Buddhist notions of equanimity and compassion than stereotypical Confucian formality and restraint.  For these reasons, Zhou remains an intriguing yet controversial figure.

According to Zhu Xi (1130-1200), perhaps the most eminent early Neo-Confucian thinker, Zhou was the first sage since Mencius and a key figure in the “new transmission” of the Confucian Way (Dao). Zhou transmitted the Way to the Cheng brothers, Cheng Hao (1032-1085) and Cheng Yi (1033-1107), who then transmitted the Way to Zhu himself.  In this view, Zhou is the “founding ancestor” of Zhu Xi’s school of Neo-Confucianism, a philosophical system that profoundly informed East Asian societies in the Middle Ages. Zhou’s best known works are the “Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity” (Taijitu shuo), and Penetrating the Classic of Changes (Tongshu), both of which are included in the Zhouzi Quanshu (Collected Works of Master Zhou).  Zhou also wrote a short poetic essay, “On the Love of the Lotus” (Ai lian shuo), that is part of the standard secondary school curriculum in contemporary Taiwan.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Context
  2. Works
    1. “Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity”
    2. Penetrating the Classic of Changes
    3. “On the Love of the Lotus”
  3. Key Concepts
    1. Fundamental Unity within Diversity
    2. Human Nature
    3. Authenticity as Humanity’s Ethical and Ontological Basis
    4. Inseparability of Ethical Life from the Workings of the Cosmos
    5. Sageliness as Ideal for Daily Life
  4. Principal Concerns
    1. Lineage
    2. Daoist and Buddhist Influences
    3. Criticism of Other Thinkers
    4. Quietism
    5. The Problem of Evil
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Context

Much of what we know of Zhou’s life comes from the Song Shi (History of the Song Dynasty), as well as anecdotes preserved in Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu), the anthology of Song-era Confucian treatises compiled by Zhu Xi with the help of the historian Lü Zuqian (1137-1181).  Totaling some 622 passages culled from the writings of key thinkers (along with Zhu Xi’s comments), this book ranks as one of the most important works of Chinese philosophy.

Zhou was born in Daozhou (modern-day Hunan) into a family of scholar-officials. His “style name” was “Maoshu.”  Originally, his personal name was “Dunshi,” but due to the taboo against using the name of the emperor (a widely observed practice in traditional China), Zhou’s name was changed to “Dunyi” when Emperor Yingzong ascended to the throne in 1063. When Zhou was 14 years old, his father passed away but he was adopted by his maternal uncle, Zheng Xiang.  It was through his uncle’s work that Zhou attained his first governmental post.  During his career, Zhou served as district keeper of records, magistrate of various counties, and assistant prefect. Traditional accounts  say that he was quite diligent in his duties, earning high praise from his colleagues and superiors; yet Zhou refused to participate in the civil service examination system, the typical route by which bright and capable men gained access to the elite levels of Song society.  As a result, Zhou never held a high governmental position nor attained the coveted “presented scholar” (jinshi) degree, the highest rank and a virtual necessity for attaining an influential post.

Towards the end of his life, Zhou fell ill and was transferred to Xingzi in Jiangxi province, where he settled near the foot of Mount Lu, one of China’s sacred mountains.  Here he built a retreat along a tributary of the Pen River, naming it Lianxi (“Stream of Waterfalls”) after a stream in his home village; later generations honored Zhou by calling him “Master Lianxi” after his beloved study. Zhou resigned from office in 1071, passing away about eighteen months later.  During his lifetime, Zhou was not well known, even though he briefly tutored both Cheng Hao (1032-1085) and Cheng Yi (1033-1107) when they were young.  His contemporaries, however, revered him for his warm personality and intuitive insight into the Way of Heaven.  Later Neo-Confucians came to regard him as an exemplar of “authenticity” (cheng), much like Confucius’ disciple Yan Hui.  In 1200, Zhou was posthumously dubbed Yuangong (“Duke of Yuan”) and in 1241 was honored in the sacrifices performed in the official Confucian temple.

Zhou lived during the Northern Song (960-1126), the “second golden age” of Confucianism.  The initial impetus for this Confucian renaissance came from late Tang Confucian thinkers such as Han Yu (768-824), Li Ao (772-836), and Liu Zhongyuan (773-819). They were highly critical of Buddhism and advocated for a return to what they considered the true source of Chinese civilization (in Zhu Xi’s words, “this culture of ours”), a heritage enshrined in the Classical Confucian texts.  After the collapse of the Tang and the eventual rise of the Song dynasty, Confucianism became the guiding Way and, just as in the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.-220 C.E.), anyone seeking an official position had to be schooled in Confucian texts and doctrines.

The Confucian revival in the early Song was by no means monolithic, however, and several prominent thinkers also pursued studies outside of official circles. While looking to Confucian ideas, many of these thinkers investigated and embraced Daoist and Buddhist notions, particularly those pertaining to spiritual self-cultivation.  The ensuing creative tension between these intertwined lines of thought inspired new interpretations of classical texts and pushed Confucianism beyond its traditional boundaries.  Among these thinkers, Zhu Xi singles out a select few as the “Masters of the Northern Song,” a group that included Zhou Dunyi, Shao Yong (1011-1077), Zhang Zai (1020-1077), and the aforementioned Cheng brothers.  While it would be wrong to consider these men as forming an institutionalized school, they were united in the view that a society based on the Way could only be achieved through personal reform grounded in cultivation of the xin (“mind-heart”) to harmonize Heaven, Earth, and Humanity.

2. Works

For such an influential figure, Zhou authored surprisingly few works.  In fact, of the 622 passages in Reflections on Things at Hand, only 12 are by Zhou—far fewer than the number of passages from Zhang Zai and the Chengs.  Most people know Zhou for his essay “Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity” (Taijitu shuo) along with his extensive commentary, Penetrating the Classic of Changes (Tongshu).  Both texts focus on cosmology as well as the ethical and spiritual implications of their depictions of the cosmos, and both texts continue to exert tremendous influence on Chinese thought.  In addition, Zhou is credited with “On the Love of the Lotus” (Ai lian shuo), a short poetic essay that, like many such works, reveals unexpected philosophical depths.

a. “Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity”

According to tradition, Zhu Xi was so struck by this treatise that he placed it at the beginning of Reflections on Things at Hand, thereby assuring it pride of place in Neo-Confucian thought. Broadly speaking, it has two main parts: the essay itself, which outlines the evolution of the cosmos, and the accompanying “Diagram” (taiji tu), a graphic illustration of the cosmic process described.


Taiji Tu from an ancient Chinese text

The main theme of the Diagram is simple: the human and cosmic realms are governed by the same norms; the microcosm and the macrocosm correspond perfectly.  Much like earlier Chinese thinkers, Zhou proclaims that human life (including the socio-political realm) is rooted in the Way of Heaven, and that it is the duty of the sage-ruler to ensure that the cosmic and human realms harmonize.  Nonetheless, Zhou presents this cosmology in a particularly powerful manner, prompting later thinkers to consider the “Explanation” a true masterpiece.

A close look at the “Explanation” yields interesting insights.  The treatise can be divided into six parts, each corresponding to certain figures in the Diagram.  Part 1 begins with the mysterious “Non-Polarity” (wuji), the primordial yet indefinite source of all reality, which Zhou identifies with the “Supreme Polarity” (taiji), the core of actual existence.  The taiji gives rise to yin and yang by alternating from stillness to activity and back.  Part 2 picks up with the yin and yang, speaking of how their alternation and combination produces the Five Phases (wuxing: water, fire, wood, metal, earth), which in turn form the basis for the cycles of nature (the Four Seasons).  In Part 3, Zhou circles back to include the wuji and taiji, the “Two Modes” (yin and yang), and the Five Phases, noting that the latter interact and stimulate one another, thus generating the myriad things of our world.

At this point, Zhou has covered the entire Diagram, yet the “Explanation” is only half finished.  With Part 4, he shifts to humanity, which emerges from the cosmic processes and, as such, is governed by both yin and yang which together engender our “five-fold nature.” In Part 5, Zhou turns to the sage, the ideal Chinese ruler, who more clearly perceives and embodies the cosmic forces than the majority of humankind.  Mirroring the cosmic rhythm, the sage addresses and “settles” human affairs through the Confucian virtues of centrality, correctness, humaneness, and rightness while abiding in “stillness.”  Finally, in Part 6 Zhou turns to the Yijing (Classic of Changes), referring to the Sage’s wisdom as one that embraces cosmic and human truths.

Zhou makes liberal use of paradoxical language in the “Explanation,” notably in the first line where he both distinguishes the wuji and taiji yet joins them together. In doing so, Zhou suggests an equivalence, if not actual identity.  Zhou continues in this same rhetorical mode, speaking of the incipient cosmos as both “still” and “active” in its functioning: “Activity and stillness alternate; each is the basis of the other.”  In Part 2, Zhou proclaims that the Five Phases are fundamentally one—“simply yin and yang; yin and yang are simply the taiji”—while each has its own nature.  Part 4 opens by declaring that humans have the “finest and most spiritually efficacious [qi],” thus singling us out for special consideration.  Humans are distinct yet not separate from other beings or the processes of creation.  Part 5 focuses on the sage, a mysterious figure who manages human affairs effortlessly, as though he were the the working of nature.  Finally, Zhou concludes by stating “Great indeed is the Yijing!  Herein lies its excellence!” By closing on this note of awe, Zhou suggests that his treatise proffers a glimpse of the Sage’s cosmic vision.

Zhou’s “Explanation” is simultaneously stirring, enlightening, yet maddeningly mysterious, and this air of mystery is a source of the text’s power.  The mystery deepens as Zhou leads us through the Diagram, largely because he describes rather than explains the various figures, and he is strangely silent on some of the Diagram’s aspects.   The essay, thus, resembles a theological treatise, laying out basic teachings derived from “scripture,” such as the Yijing, and relating them in a coherent way.  In this regard, it resembles the Nicene Creed, a formal statement of core beliefs shared by many traditional Christians.  Like the Creed, Zhou’s “Explanation” assumes its readers are familiar with its ideas, presenting them as “articles of faith” but never arguing for why these things should be the case.

b. Penetrating the Classic of Changes

This work comprises forty chapters in all yet since each chapter is only a paragraph or so in length, it is still relatively short.  Ostensibly, the title Tongshu comes from Zhou’s insistence that its principles penetrate (tong) and harmonize with the Yijing.  The treatise also draws on the Zhongyong (Doctrine of the Mean), the Shujing (Classic of History), and the Analects. It is likely that the “Explanation” was originally the last section of the Tongshu but that Zhu Xi moved it to the beginning; eventually, it became an independent work due to its importance in Neo-Confucian thought.

The treatise’s main themes are central to the Neo-Confucian project: the necessity of authenticity (cheng) in attaining Sageliness, and how to enact Sageliness in accord with the cosmos to establish the true Way (Dao). Zhang Boxing (1652-1725), who compiled the Complete Collection of Zhou Dunyi’s Writings (Zhou Lianxi xiansheng quanji), divides the Tongshu into two parts, each comprising 20 chapters.  Certain ideas and concerns link various chapters but a detailed presentation lies beyond the scope of this entry. Instead, this overview highlights key points and includes quotes to provide a sense of Zhou’s voice and style.

Part 1: Tongshu, Chapters 1-20

The first half of the treatise begins with a stirring proclamation: “Being authentic is the foundation of the sage.” Over the next few chapters, Zhou then touches on several traditionally Confucian topics: the importance of moral virtue, the necessity of learning, how to govern properly, and so forth.  Not surprisingly, Zhou grounds each of these human concerns in the workings of the cosmos, much as we have seen with the “Explanation.” However, there are a few points in this first half that make the Tongshu rather unique and thus warrant close attention.

Chapters 7-10, for instance, consist of questions from unnamed students and Zhou’s replies, thereby rhetorically underscoring the essentially pedagogical and dialogical nature of Confucianism.  Hearkening back to the example of Confucius, the text presumes that the reader is engaging with the teachings as if face-to-face with the teacher, the “old model,” (laoshi) who, in this case, is Zhou himself.  Chapter 7 (appropriately entitled “The Teacher”) opens: “Someone asks: ‘Who makes all under Heaven good?’" Reply: "The teacher." Question: "What do you mean?" Reply: "[He is one whose] nature is simply in equilibrium between firm and yielding good and evil.” Over the next few chapters, the Teacher reminds us of the good fortune at being able to correct our errors, the importance of thinking as an activity rooted in our primal authenticity, and stresses devotion to learning as we progress towards Sageliness.

Chapters 17-19, on the other hand, deal with what might seem to be a minor consideration: music, and, by extension, the “arts” in general. However, this topic is, in fact, central to Confucianism, which consistently upholds the importance of cultural refinement (wen) as part of the Way.  Echoing words from Confucius himself, Zhou speaks of music as a positive influence on people, helping attune them to each other.  Thus he says in chapter 17, “[The ancient sages and kings] created music to give expression to the airs of the eight [directional] winds and to pacify the dispositions of all under Heaven.”  Not only does music attune the mind-hearts of all people, it also harmonizes us with animals and spiritual beings.  We see in this short section the inseparability of the aesthetic, ethical, and spiritual dimensions of sagely learning.

Chapter 20 both summarizes Zhou’s points so far and leads us into the next half.  It is fitting, then, that the chapter is entitled “Learning to be a Sage,” and, like chapters 7-10, it is a dialogue between student and teacher.  The teacher explains the essentials of the Way of the sage, saying, “Unity is essential. To be unified is to have no desire. Without desire one is unoccupied when still and direct when active. Being unoccupied when still, one will be clear; being clear one will be penetrating. Being direct in activity one will be impartial; being impartial one will be all-embracing. Being clear and penetrating, impartial and all-embracing, one is almost [a sage].”

The Daoist flavor in the first half of the Tongshu is unmistakable, but Zhou is not suggesting that the sage observes the world with an empty mind. Rather, he observes that striving for sageliness means uniting all of one’s faculties.  Rooted in one’s true nature, undistracted by wayward desires, and unoccupied by selfish lusts or passing whims, one is directly involved with all things.  One can then see clearly and thus respond appropriately.

Part 2: Tongshu, Chapters 21-40

This second half of the Tongshu shifts from the more metaphysical stance of the first part to a more explicitly ethical orientation.  Zhou starts off in a typically Confucian fashion by focusing on governing society, stressing the importance of being “impartial” (gong) —scrupulously avoiding selfishness—in order to attain “clarity” (ming). Much like the “Explanation,” the first few chapters correlate moral virtue with the cosmic processes of yin, yang, and the wu xing.  Following contemporary Confucian Tu Weiming, we can say that Zhou articulates an “anthropocosmic” vision here.  However, the references to the Zhongyong as well as the necessity for intelligence in perceiving truth remind us that metaphysical knowledge is but the first step towards enacting the Way.

One of the most interesting things in this second half of the Tongshu is the central role played by Yan Yuan (Yan Hui), Confucius’ most mystically-inclined disciple. At one point, for instance, Zhou exalts Yan Hui’s example: “Seeing what was great, his mind was at peace. With his mind at peace, nothing was insufficient. With nothing insufficient, then wealth and honor, poverty and humble station were all the same [to him]. Being all the same, then he was able to transform and equalize [others, that is regard others as equal]. Thus Yanzi [ Yan Hui] was second only to the Sage [Confucius].” Zhou underscores this same point a little later on in chapter 29 where Zhou exalts Confucius’ “comprehensiveness,” after which he immediately praises Yan Hui as the only one who was able to discern this quality and model it for succeeding generations.

While the entire Tongshu draws on the Yijing, it focuses most explicitly on that work in the last 10 chapters.  Much of this section reads as if Zhou were leading the reader through a ritual consultation of that most enigmatic of Chinese classics, referring to hexagrams #1, 24, 25, and 37, among others. Furthermore, it quotes passages from the Xici (“Appended Remarks”), the most philosophically rich section of the Yijing.

Zhou begins the last section of the treatise (chapters 37-40) very simply, invoking the cosmic basis of the sagely Way and stressing the sage’s impartiality while recalling the pedagogical dialogue of earlier sections: “The Way of the sage is perfectly impartial,” I said. Someone asked, "What does that mean?" I replied, "Heaven and Earth are perfectly impartial." Finally, in the very last chapter, Zhou concludes the Tongshu by giving guidance towards the sagely Way through lines of the Yijing.  The last few sentences warrant special attention: “Be cautious! This means [to follow] the ‘timely mean’!  ‘Keep the back still,’ for the back is not seen. When still, one can stop [at the right point]. To stop is not to act [deliberately]. To act [deliberately] is not to stop [at the right point]. This Way is profound!”

All told, the Tongshu is a rich, evocative text, appropriately mirroring the mysterious and compelling wisdom of the Yijing.  Zhou’s elusive yet allusive style draws on multiple sources, encouraging the reader to make connections between the different sections and events within her own life. While revealing an inspiring cosmic vision, however, it continually reminds readers that its truth can only be realized when enacted daily.

c. “On the Love of the Lotus”

While not a philosophical treatise, “On the Love of the Lotus” (Ai lian shuo) remains Zhou’s most beloved work and reveals surprising spiritual depths.  According to tradition, Zhou composed the poem in 1071 after he built his retreat, Lianxi, at the foot of Mount Lu.  As was common practice among retired literati (Chinese scholar-bureaucrats), he dug a pond in front of his study and planted it with lotus blossoms, spending much of his leisure time contemplating the scene.

“On the Love of the Lotus” totals some 119 characters in addition to its title, arranged in eleven lines.  Each of the lines is a couplet of verses, varying in length.  Zhou wrote this piece in the gu wen (“ancient writing”) style, a literary style hearkening back to the elegant prose of the Han dynasty.  This style had become increasingly common during the Confucian Renaissance, was a favorite of the late Tang Confucian critic Han Yu, and contrasts with the “parallel prose” style  that had dominated Chinese prose previously with the latter’s very strict meter and rhyme scheme. During the Song era, gu wen became the style of choice among the literati, and was a rhetorical signal that the writer and reader were dealing with a work of “special writing” concerning high-minded ideals, versus low or vulgar subjects, much as “the King’s English” functioned in the British Empire during the 19th and 20th centuries. A mark of education and culture, gu wen was still accessible to a degree by members of the lower classes, and thus exemplified the power of wen as a culturally binding force among the Chinese populace.

On the surface, “On the Love of the Lotus” is Zhou’s heartfelt ode to the flourishing blossoms in his garden, evoking the serene presence of flowering chrysanthemums, peonies, and lotuses, each with its distinctive aura and beautiful form.  Yet, the piece hints at subtle depths of meaning, pointing to the anthropocosmic vision that Zhou so explicitly discusses in his other works. For Zhou, the lotus exemplifies the cosmic/spiritual harmony that we should all seek.  Thus he says, “Inside, it is open; outside, it is straight (zhi)” – a line recalling the time-honored Chinese ideal of Dao.  Zhou contrasts this with the chrysanthemum, which is the “recluse” among the flowers, and the peony, which he speaks of as “wealthy,” or showy, gaudy, and appealing to the masses.  The lotus, on the other hand, is the “gentleman among flowers.”  The term “gentleman” (junzi), of course, has since the time of Confucius been the ideal human being.

Like other Chinese literary works, “On the Love of the Lotus” draws on cultural tropes shared by Confucian, Daoist, and Buddhist traditions.  This is most obvious with the image of the lotus itself.  As Zhou writes, “I love only the lotus, for rising from the mud yet remaining unstained; bathed by pure currents and yet not seductive.” “On the Love of the Lotus” pulses with subtle yet powerful symbolism, evoking a deep, tranquil mood while encouraging a dynamic and attentive state of awareness.   It thus gives a glimpse of the sagely mind itself.

3. Key Concepts

Zhou’s works, while creative and eclectic in nature, establish the basic parameters of Neo-Confucian philosophy. While he never articulates a full-fledged system, most of the concepts he discusses support each other.  This overview, therefore, looks at key themes running through Zhou’s writings, explaining what they entail and how they connect to each other.

a. Fundamental Unity within Diversity

A perennial issue in philosophy as expressed in all cultures is the relationship between the myriads of phenomena in the world, which are diverse and seemingly constantly changing, and the underlying unity and stability within this vast whole.  A pond is filled with dozens of lotus blossoms, each distinct and with its own unique hue, some in bloom while others wither.  Yet all seem to embody the same “lotus-ness,” and each specific blossom remains its own, separate self throughout its life cycle.  Similarly, our world is peopled with thousands of different human beings, and every single person has his or her own unique background, thoughts and feelings.  And yet, each person’s life follows a similar pattern and each person embodies the same “human-ness.”  What is the relationship between the oneness and many-ness that characterizes our world?  This problem, the problem of “the One and the Many,” lies at the heart of many of the world’s philosophies, from the Pre-Socratics of ancient Greece, such as Thales, Anaximander, Heraclitus, and others, to the nameless ṛṣis who composed the Upaniṣads, to the various thinkers of classical Chinese civilization.  While answers have varied, most solutions assume that the world is “one thing” and so there has to be a unifying aspect to the obvious diversity.

For Zhou Dunyi, the answer is that a fundamental unity encompasses the myriads of things, including human beings.  This unity, however, does not consist in some static metaphysical mush wherein all things collapse into a formless One, nor some immaterial Divine Being (“God”).  Rather, this unity is a dynamic, integrated system in which all things function together.  We can see this clearly in the Tongshu, chapter 22, where Zhou succinctly summarizes the cosmic process: “The two [modes of] qi and the five phases transform and generate the myriad things. The five are the differentia and the two are the actualities; the two are fundamentally one. Thus the many are one, and the one actuality is divided into the many.”

Despite such an all-encompassing metaphysical scheme, Zhou maintains the decidedly human focus typically associated with Confucianism, offering an anthropocosmic vision in which the root metaphors for understanding humanity itself are drawn from the workings of Nature.  We can see this most clearly in Zhou’s “Explanation,” where he quotes from the commentary section of the Yijing: “the sage’s virtue equals that of Heaven and Earth; his clarity equals that of the sun and the moon; his timeliness equals that of the four seasons.” In this passage Zhou describes the Way of the sage, the ideal of humanity, in explicitly cosmological terms.  Rhetorically, the message is clear: the Way of humanity is the Way of the cosmos.

Students of Chinese thought may recognize in Zhou’s metaphysical vision yet another variant of the notion of humanity forming a triad with Heaven and Earth, perhaps best expressed in the statement, “the unity of Heaven and Humanity” (tianren heyi).  This harmonious unity of human beings and the cosmos lies at the center of Zhou’s philosophy and draws quite explicitly on earlier Confucian thinkers, notably Dong Zhongshu (c. 195-105 B.C.E.).  In some respects, Zhou Dunyi merely expands upon this basis by borrowing insights from Buddhism and Daoism which he integrates into Confucian tradition. Human beings, along with all other natural phenomena, are integral parts of a larger whole, and in Zhou’s view, we can see this teaching both metaphysically and ethically.  Julia Ching suggests that, under Buddhist influence, this idea transformed into the increasingly abstract adage “The Ten Thousand Things are One” (wanwu yiti), and although we can see aspects of such “pantheism” in Zhou’s writings, he never advocates pure withdrawal into metaphysical contemplation; for Zhou, embracing the actual embodied situation trumps mystical wonder.

Not surprisingly, this insistence on a non-dual unity-cum-diversity defies clear articulation.  As with many mystical philosophers (for example, Zhuangzi, Huineng, Pseudo-Dionysius, Śaṅkara, Ibn Arabi, and others), Zhou often resorts to the language of paradox.  Perhaps the most famous example is in the opening words of the “Explanation”: wuji er taiji (“Non-Polar(ity), and yet Supreme Polarity!”).  This most curious of lines is comprised of a negation and a positive affirmation linked by a conjunction.  Grammatically, this phrase both distinguishes the wuji and taiji yet joins them together in some sort of identity. This simultaneous identity and difference echoes chapter one of the Daodejing: ce liang zhe tong chu er yi ming (“these two [wu – ‘non-being’ – and you –‘being’] interpenetrate, yet, after emerging, differ in name”).  Zhou resorts to paradox elsewhere in his writings as well.  Rhetorically, paradoxical language poses difficulty for rational understanding.  No doubt this more mystical dimension of Zhou’s work has encouraged interpretations that emphasize his debts to Daoism and Buddhism.

The paradoxical harmonious unity of humanity and the larger cosmos also shows in Zhou’s discussion of “stillness” and “activity.”  As the second line of the “Explanation” reads: “The Supreme Polarity in activity generates yang; yet at the limit of activity it is still.  In stillness it generates yin; yet at the limit of stillness it is active.  Activity and stillness alternate; each is the basis of the other.” Much like yin and yang, so cosmic stillness and activity are complementary opposites, not antithetical, but rather co-entailing each other.  This cosmic pattern forms the model for the sage as well, who remains still in the midst of activity but also active while keeping still.  Such active stillness and still activity expresses the fundamental dynamism governing existence as a whole.

One issue that arises with Zhou’s notion of unity within diversity is whether he is speaking strictly cosmologically, concerning the “physical” functioning of the reality, or metaphysically, concerning the ultimate structure of the cosmos. Zhou’s writings are ambiguous on this point, and lend themselves to both readings.  A. C. Graham, however, argues that Zhou is speaking cosmologically, and that the tendency to read Zhou metaphysically is due to Zhu Xi’s reading in which he equates the taiji with li (principle).

Zhou provides a subtle way to understand the psychological dimension of such unity when he speaks of “impartiality” (gong).  One who is “impartial” remains unswayed by petty desires, and thus can respond to any situation without complications.  As Zhou says, “Being direct in activity, one will be impartial; being impartial one will be all-embracing.”   There is no sense of withdrawal, but rather an active embracing of existence.  Moreover, such engaging with the world at large is the sage’s Way, a state that mirrors the cosmos.

b. Human Nature

Zhou’s anthropocosmic vision, centering as it does on the unity of Heaven, humanity, and all things, entails a specific notion of human nature (xing).  Indeed, discussion of human nature is one of the hallmarks of Neo-Confucian tradition. Unlike the Chengs and Zhu Xi, Zhou does not explicitly spell out his view of human nature, but we can infer quite a lot from his writings.

Zhou never uses the actual term xing in the “Explanation” but he mentions it several times in the Tongshu.  Much like what we see in Mencius and the Zhongyong, Zhou implies that the nature of human beings is endowed by Heaven and is fundamentally good. Zhou once more turns to the Yijing: “"The alternation of yin and yang is called the Way. That which issues from it is good. That which fulfills [ or constitutes] it is human nature.” Zhou closes this important chapter on a particularly reverent note: “Great indeed is change, the source of human nature and endowment!”  Further on in chapter 3, Zhou extolls behavior in accord with the Five Constant Virtues (humanness, righteousness, propriety, wisdom, and honesty), observing that “One who is by nature like this, at ease like this, is called a sage. One who recovers it and holds onto it is called a worthy.”   

Clearly, Zhou espouses the Mencian view of human nature as innately good.  Human beings are naturally moral creatures.  However, there is a tension in Zhou’s philosophical anthropology, in that the distinction between good and evil does not reside at the primary level of cosmic origin. As he states in the “Explanation”: “Only humans receive the finest and most spiritually efficacious [qi]. Once they are formed, they are born; when spirit [shen] is manifested, they have intelligence; when their fivefold natures are stimulated into activity, good and evil are distinguished and the myriad affairs ensue.”  Similarly, in chapter 3 of the Tongshu Zhou cryptically says, “In being authentic there is no [intentional] acting [wuwei]. In incipience there is good and evil.” Here Zhou’s insistence on stillness as cosmically fundamental means that this ultimate level transcends the distinction between good and evil; the latter distinction only arises when human beings begin to interact with actual things.  Later commentators have spilled much ink arguing about what Zhou means.

Broadly speaking, Zhou espouses the cultivation of the “mind-heart” (xin) that became a hallmark of Neo-Confucian religiosity, yet he apparently draws heavily on Daoism.  Certainly Zhou uses terms often associated with Daoist neidan (“inner alchemy”), notably qi, the basic “stuff” of the universe, shen (“spirit”), and even jing (“essence”), although he mentions the latter only once or twice. By contrast, Zhou says quite a bit about shen, which he associates with cognitive abilities.  Thus, as Zhou observes in the Tongshu, “That which ‘penetrates when stimulated’ is spirit (shen).”  Apparently shen lies dormant until it is stimulated by external phenomena, at which point it is activated and “knowing” begins.

The place of qi in Zhou’s view of human nature is vague.  That is, qi is a vital component of human beings and all things, yet Zhou never discusses it to the same extent that we find in the writings of later Neo-Confucians. Nor does he differentiate it explicitly from “Principle” (li).  In the “Explanation,” Zhou speaks of the wu xing as the basic phases of qi, and hence fundamental to the workings of the cosmos, going on to note that “Only humans receive the finest and most spiritually efficacious [qi].” This statement implies that human nature is unique; people have a special status in the world albeit not as beings of a different order than the myriads of other things.  Joseph Adler suggests that for Zhou, humans naturally manifest shen because they are endowed with the most refined qi.  It is due to the functioning of shen, then, that we are able to encompass all things.  Here, Zhou clearly anticipates later Neo-Confucian views concerning human cultivation as a refining of qi, although he does not speak of differences between people in terms of the “coarseness” and “refinement” of qi. We should note, however, that he does not articulate the full explanation we find in Zhu Xi’s works.

c. Authenticity as Humanity’s Ethical and Ontological Basis

Following the spiritual current of Confucian tradition exemplified in Mencius and the Zhongyong, Zhou maintains that authenticity (cheng) is essential to be fully human. In fact, Zhou opens the Tongshu by declaring, “Being authentic is the foundation of the sage.”  He goes on to add that it is “the foundation of the Five Constant [Virtues]” as well as being “perfectly easy, yet difficult to practice.”  Later, he underscores this rather paradoxical point by saying, “In being authentic, there is no [intentional] acting.”  This seems decidedly Daoist (Zhou actually uses the term wuwei here), but Zhou’s meaning can only be understood through it.  For Zhou, authenticity expresses human nature as it truly is; to be authentic is to manifest one’s Heavenly endowment.  Speaking metaphorically, to be authentic is to remain  still in one’s nature while acting in the world.  Authenticity is, thus, both ontological and ethical; it is a manifestation of our fundamental being, while also serving as the root of moral activity.

For Zhou, being authentic is intimately tied to self-cultivation, a central concern of Song Confucianism that forms the heart of Neo-Confucian spirituality.  In some sense, authenticity is a “given,” as it is rooted in our nature, yet we must work to develop it, just as with any innate ability.  Zhou stresses the importance of such ethical/ontological striving throughout the Tongshu.  Moreover, Zhou states that it is possible to be inauthentic (bu cheng) when in chapter 2 of the Tongshu he speaks of the Five Constant [Virtues] and the “hundred practices”  of moral behavior as being “wrong” or “blocked by depravity and confusion.”  Presumably, such cases arise when one is gripped by selfishness and egotism.

One of the most intriguing and controversial points that Zhou makes about striving for authenticity is that, being authentic, a way of retuning to one’s true human nature, is also the way for a person to “become One” (yi).  Moreover, Zhou also says that to be in such a state is “to have no desire.”  Zhou strikes a decidedly mystical tone here, with a slight ascetic edge that resonates strongly with Buddhism and Daoism.  Contra Max Weber, the sociologist of religion who famously distinguished between ascetic and mystical forms of religion, Zhou suggests a spirituality that straddles this dichotomy.  Certainly when read in context, Zhou actually seems to mean a state of clear, yet active engagement with one’s situation.  Zhu Xi and later commentators, perhaps at pains to distance Zhou from accusations of Buddhist and Daoist influence, explain that Zhou means that one should attain an unbiased, undistracted state rather than renounce the world.

d. Inseparability of Ethical Life from the Workings of the Cosmos

As we have seen in his understanding of authenticity, Zhou also proclaims the integral relationship of cosmology and ethics. While this is a central theme in the “Explanation” and the Tongshu, one of the best hints of this point comes in “On the Love of the Lotus,” where he refers to the lotus blossom as the “gentleman (junzi) among flowers.”  The junzi, the “noble person,” is the highest ethical ideal in early Confucianism and, essentially, the equivalent of the Sage in Neo-Confucian tradition. What’s more, not only is Zhou speaking of a natural phenomenon -- a blossoming lotus flower -- in moral terms here, he is also underscoring the deeply aesthetic dimension involved. Like the beautiful lotus, so the junzi marks the full flowering of human life.

The intertwining of the ethical and cosmological in Zhou’s thought shows, above all, in his practical focus.  Throughout the “Explanation” and the Tongshu, Zhou speaks of our sagely dimension in dynamic, active terms.  Be it in his admonitions regarding continual striving, his reminders of the importance of ordering society, and his cautious approach to acting in the world, Zhou maintains that the moral life reflects the cosmic order; sagely behavior is in tune with the creative guidance of Heaven and the nurturing vitality of Earth.

In his work, Zhou freely mixes metaphysical and ethical language, switching from one to the other effortlessly, like a sage acting in accordance with the cosmos by establishing a good society following Confucian moral teachings. Thus as he notes in the “Explanation,” “Only humans receive the finest and most spiritually efficacious [qi]. Once formed, they are born; when spirit (shen) is manifested, they have intelligence; when their fivefold natures are stimulated into activity, good and evil are distinguished and the myriad affairs ensue. The sage settles these [affairs] with centrality (zhong) and correctness (zheng), humanity (ren) and rightness (yi). . ..”

One final point that has some bearing on the inseparability of ethics from the working of the cosmos in Zhou’s work is how it may anticipate some of the views of Wang Yangming (Wang Shouren, 1472-1529), specifically the inseparability of  “innate (moral) knowledge” (liangzhi) from action.  In Zhou’s perspective, a sage is rooted in authenticity; as he says in the Tongshu, “being a sage is nothing more than being authentic.”  Moreover, he later states, “Being perfectly authentic, one acts.”  In other words, to be a sage is to act in an authentic (sagely) way.  In a similar vein, Wang explains to his student Xu Ai in Instructions for Practical Living (Chuanxilu), “There have never been people who know but do not act.  Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not know yet.”   It seems that both Zhou and Wang would agree with Socrates’ famous dictum that “to know the good is to do the good.”

e. Sageliness as Ideal for Daily Life

The concept of sageliness as an idea to be actualized in daily life is implicit in the previous point regarding Zhou and Wang Yangming. Even a cursory reading of the “Explanation” and the Tongshu reveals Zhou’s concern for putting sagely ideals into practice.  As Zhou says, “To be active and correct is called the Way.”  In the introduction to A Short History of Chinese Philosophy, Feng Youlan quotes one of his colleagues as saying, “Chinese philosophers were all of them different grades of Socrates. . . With him, philosophy was hardly ever merely a pattern of ideas exhibited for human understanding, but was a system of precepts internal to the conduct of the philosopher.” (A Short History of Chinese Philosophy, 10).   This passage reads as if it were written specifically about Zhou himself. Clearly for Zhou, the true goal should be to realize sageliness, that is, to discover it and make it concretely real here and now.

Zhou makes clear that the sage as ideal must be engaged with society and the larger world. Not only does the sage “settle these [affairs],” according to the “Explanation,” but Zhou gives extensive guidance for sagely action in the world throughout the Tongshu.  Perhaps his most succinct discussion comes in chapter 6: “The Way of the sages is nothing more than humanity and rightness, centrality and correctness. Preserve it and it will be valuable. Practice it and it will be beneficial. Enlarge it and it will match Heaven-and-earth.” The sage is actively involved with things, guided by morality rooted in the cosmos.  We should remember, though, that this ideal is also profoundly spiritual, suggesting an “inner worldly mysticism” that embraces all of life.

Understandably, Zhou’s concern for sageliness manifests in the various models he upholds for our emulation.  The most obvious example is Confucius, whom Zhou often quotes and to whom Zhou explicitly devotes two chapters (38 and 39) of the Tongshu Zhou also holds up Confucius’ disciple Zilu and the legendary Fuxi, who is credited with writing the hexagrams of the Yijing.  However, Zhou reserves special reverence for Yan Hui, that most spiritual of Confucius’ disciples.  Thus when discussing the comprehensive nature of the sage, Zhou writes, “Master Yan was the one who brought out the Sage’s comprehensiveness and taught ten thousand generations without limit.  Was he not equally profound?”  Interestingly, Zhou himself plays a similar role for later Neo-Confucians, who held him up as a model of authenticity.

4. Principal Concerns

As is the case with all significant thinkers, Zhou Dunyi’s work provides a wealth of material for further analysis.  Some of the concerns that Zhou deals with are of universal philosophical interest while others are rather unique to Chinese, or even more specifically, Confucian, thought.

a. Lineage

In traditional Chinese culture, wherein family relations lie at the center of social life and identity, lineage is paramount.  This is true not just socially and politically, but in scholarly circles as well; after all, most “schools” of Chinese thought are called jia (“family”).  Indeed, it is a cliché to say that Chinese society is envisioned as a large family with the emperor (“Son of Heaven”) as its father. To be true to one’s jia is crucial; to deviate from its ways or to step outside its bounds is to bring shame upon the larger family, including the ancestors, and risk severe punishment, even ostracism.  To have a disreputable lineage or one that is haphazard or unknown is highly suspect in polite circles.  For scholars, lineal connection to earlier thinkers is a necessity, since that helps certify that one has truly received Dao.  The Way, if it is to continue, must be transmitted to succeeding generations.  The fact, then, that Zhou’s teachings have a questionable lineage was a major concern in later Confucian circles. In the preface to his “Conversations of Master Zhu, Arranged Topically” (Zhuzi yulei) 94:3153, Zhu Xi gets to the heart of the matter when he says, "No one knows where his (Zhou Dunyi’s) teaching tradition came from."

Most contemporary scholars agree that Zhou’s inclusion in the “orthodox” lineage of Song Neo-Confucianism is due to efforts of Zhu Xi in the late 12th century.  Almost from the start, Zhu faced conflict from various sources, notably the Lu brothers, Lu Jishuo (1120s-1190s) and Lu Jiyuan (1139-1193), two literati who argued that Zhou is far too Daoist to be considered a recipient of the Confucian Way.  In addition, there are historical issues with Zhou’s alleged connection to the Cheng brothers, among them the fact that Cheng Yi declares that his older brother Cheng Hao personally rediscovered the Way via his study of the Classics.  What’s more, neither of the Chengs refer to Zhou in terms typically reserved for teachers; instead, they call him by his personal names. Additionally, none of the Chengs’ disciples even mention Zhou in their writings. All together, these points call into question Zhou’s place in the direct line of Confucian transmission.

Joseph Adler and others investigated the historical and biographical records and discovered that during the latter part of Zhu Xi’s life there was a concerted effort on the part of Zhu and Hunan scholar-officials to elevate Zhou to sagely status despite prevailing opinion at the time – an endeavor that culminated during the reign of Emperor Lizong (1225-1264).  For his part, Zhu Xi sidesteps the tenuous historical connection by attributing the source of Zhou’s sagely mind to a transcendent source.  Thus, as Zhu writes in a record of his personal pilgrimage to the place of Zhou’s study:

“As for Master [Zhou] Lianxi, if he did not receive the propagation of this Dao by Heaven, how did he continue it so easily after such a long interruption, and bring it to light so abruptly after such extreme darkness? . . The Five Planets were in conjunction in Kui [a phase of lunar activity used to structure the ancient Chinese calendar], marking a turning point in culture. Only then did the heterogeneous qi homogenize and the divided [qi] coalesce; a clear and bright endowment was received in its entirety by one man, and the Master [Zhou Dunyi] appeared. Without following a teacher, he silently registered the substance of the Way, constructed the Diagram and attached a text to it, to give an ultimate foundation to the essentials. . . Ah! Such grandeur! Were it not for what Heaven conferred [on Zhou], how could we participate in this?”

Such appeals to Divine Authority, however, raise philosophical problems too numerous to discuss here.

b. Daoist and Buddhist Influences

Daoist and Buddhist influences on Zhou’s thought also warrant serious attention, particularly in light of the controversies surrounding Zhou’s lineage and Zhu Xi’s rather strained efforts to rope him into the Confucian camp. One common, albeit simplistic, view of Neo-Confucianism is that it began in the Southern Song (1127-1279) in response to widespread political, social, and cultural dislocation after the collapse of the Northern Song (960-1126).  With the loss of Chinese territories, especially the Yellow River Valley, the traditional Chinese “heartland,” to non-Han invaders, various scholar-officials sought to re-claim a distinctly Chinese identity linked to Confucianism. As part of their efforts, they reformed the civil service system by purging it of Daoist and Buddhist elements. In doing so, they also diminished the political and institutional power of both rival “Ways” and articulated a philosophically robust Confucian philosophy that could hold its own against Buddhist and Daoist wisdom.  Ironically, most contemporary scholars agree that Neo-Confucianism owes a great deal to Daoist and Buddhist ideas and practices.

Without doubt, Zhou’s connections to Daoism are deep.  The diagram that Zhou uses in his “Explanation,” for instance, strongly resembles several others used by Daoists, such as the Wujitu (“Wuji Diagram”), which is included in the Daoist Canon (Daozang) and the Xiantian taiji tu (“Taiji Diagram which predates Heaven”).  While there is some debate about the details, the prevalent view is that Zhou received his diagram from Mu Xiu (979-1032), a minor official who himself received it from Chong Fang (956-1015), a former official turned recluse. Chong Fang, in turn, received the diagram from Chen Tuan (d. 989), a famous Daoist master.  Several key terms that Zhou uses – wuji and wuwei, for example – also have Daoist associations, and Zhou’s priority on “stillness” over “activity” also has a strongly Daoist overtone.

Zhou’s work also shows marked influence of Buddhism.  For instance, Cheng Yi refers to Zhou as a “poor Chan [Zen] fellow,” and records indicate that Zhou counted several Buddhists among his friends and teachers, notably Shou Ya, a master at the Helin Temple in Jiangsu province.  It is possible that Zhou was even a Buddhist layman (upasaka) for a time.  Some scholars suggested connections to the work of Guifeng Zongmi (781-841), a patriarch in both the Chan and Huayan schools of Chinese Buddhism.  Zhou’s discussion of the sage as having “no desire” and being “impartial” also resonate with the Buddhist virtue of upeksha (“equanimity”) and the ideal of mahakaruna (“great compassion”).

All told, it is impossible to deny influences, direct and indirect, of Daoism and Buddhism on Zhou Dunyi.  The various issues surrounding such influences on Zhou may not matter much, however, to students of global philosophy.  In fact, they may only be problematic for those who share a more traditional Confucian concern for purity of lineage, or for scholars who approach the study of Chinese (and, indeed, all of East Asian) philosophy and religion with more Western assumptions of exclusivity.  This is not to deny the historical difficulties in pinning down Zhou’s religious and philosophical pedigree or the problems it caused later Confucian thinkers, but only to note that such concerns in no way detract from his philosophical and spiritual insights.

c. Criticism of Other Thinkers

Zhou’s oracular style (characterized by pronouncements), the fact that his writings consist mainly of commentary on the Classics, and his overall religious tone give the impression that he is not a “philosopher” in the modern academic sense. He is not, in other words, a thinker who critically engages with other thinkers, using logical arguments to disprove certain truth claims while establishing other ones;  however, when we read carefully, we can see a number of implicit criticisms of rival thinkers.

One example is in the Tongshu, chapter 16, where in distinguishing “things” (having physical form) and “spirit” (shen) he observes, “Things, then, are not penetrating. Spirit renders the myriad things subtle.”  This seems to be a counter assertion to the Huayan Buddhist doctrine of shi shi wu ai (“unobstruction of all phenomena,” that is, the interpenetration of all things).  Shi shi wu ai, according to Neo-Confucians, effectively denies the reality of the actual world.  In the next chapter, which is devoted to music and ritual, Zhou laments the present state of society: “Later generations have neglected ritual. Their governmental measures and laws have been in disorder. Rulers have indulged their material desires without restraint, and consequently the people below them have suffered bitterly.” This reads like standard Confucian boilerplate but its critical edge is unmistakable. In chapter 24, Zhou states, “The most revered thing in the world is the Way; the most honored is virtue; the most rare [difficult to attain] is the human being.”  While the echoes of Laozi are unmistakable in Zhou’s praise for Dao and de, the fact that he immediately goes on to praise human beings as having a special status strikes a decidedly Confucian tone.  Moreover, there are other examples of Zhou’s critical stance in the Tongshu. For instance, ( Zhou criticizes superficial scholars in chapters 28 and 34 whom, he says, are concerned with elegant literary style rather than striving for sageliness–a common Confucian theme.

These passages remind us that Zhou’s work did not emerge in an intellectual vacuum.  He worked from a perspective deeply informed by certain basic ideas and assumptions that arose within a highly complex and contested philosophical milieu.  Thus, as we can see, Zhou Dunyi takes a strongly critical stance in much of his writings.  Moreover, he offers insightful, albeit oblique, observations that shed light not only on his own context, but that also address ethical, political, and metaphysical issues that crop up in other cultural contexts – one of the hallmarks of any great thinker.

d. Quietism

From a global philosophical perspective, Zhou seems to espouse a form of quietism, in that he emphasizes a more interior, contemplative approach to life rather than acting boldly to shape events through force of will.  Although “quietism,” strictly speaking, refers to a Christian theological position that held sway during the 17th century before being declared heretical by the Vatican, the centrality of attaining a detached, serene state of mind within Zhou’s writings strongly resonates with quietist doctrines.  Such accusations of quietism are related to criticisms about the seemingly undue influence of Daoism and Buddhism on Zhou as well.

The charge of quietism is understandable in light of Zhou’s view of the relationship between stillness and activity.  Stillness and activity co-entail each other, and, in fact, are just another way for Zhou to explain the interaction of yin and yang.  Furthermore, Zhou does give priority to stillness as well – something several later Neo-Confucians express concerns about.  The distinctly religious dimensions of Zhou’s work also make it easy for critics to dismiss him, especially in light of common stereotypes about mysticism as an excuse to withdraw into a timidly pious passive acceptance of things “just as they are.”

Nonetheless, arguments that Zhou espouses a passive quietism are, at best, straw men.  Whatever his mystical inclinations, Zhou seems firmly focused on practical affairs.  He draws heavily on Confucian directives on how to live a good life, and, in the Tongshu, explicitly attends to stereotypically “Confucian” concerns about education, ritual, and the proper governing of society, including the necessity for punishing wrongdoers.  Even more to the point, Zhou provides clear instruction about activity, saying that one should pay attention and take great care when wielding powerAs a thinker imbued with a sense of the Classical Chinese cultural heritage, Zhou repeatedly seeks guidance for engaging with life in authoritative sources, most especially the Yijing but also other Confucian texts such as the Analects, thereby anticipating Zhu Xi’s later comment that studying the classics is like meeting the sages face-to-face.  Furthermore, as we have seen, Zhou holds up examples from Confucian history as models for our own behavior.  While there are aspects of quietism in much of Zhou’s work, overall he does not advocate passive withdrawal, but a wise and attentive way of participating in the world without recklessly forcing it to conform to our selfish desires.

e. The Problem of Evil

Explaining evil, destruction, pain, cruelty, and so forth, has been a perennial problem for philosophers throughout history.  Numerous solutions have been proposed over the centuries, ranging from the Christian doctrine of “original sin,” to the Buddhist and Hindu teaching that we are bemired in samsara (literally “wandering through,” the beginningless cycle of birth-and-death) due to fundamental ignorance underlying our incessant cravings and selfishness.  For Chinese thinkers in general, evil is due to departure from Dao, which results in disharmony within individual, society and the world. Confucians are divided on some of the particulars here. Mencius, for example, holds that humans are innately good while Xunzi maintains that people are essentially animalistic. Both agree, however, that human beings can improve through the influence of a proper education and virtuous government.

Zhou by and large assumes a Mencian view of innate goodness, but he never spells it out explicitly.  In the “Explanation” he states, “Only humans receive the finest and most spiritually efficacious [qi].”  This seems to be an allusion to Mencius’ remark about nourishing his “vast, flowing qi” as a crucial component to moral and spiritual cultivation (Mencius 2A2), and certainly this is how Zhu Xi interprets Zhou.  This view of human nature is also confirmed by passages in the Tongshu such as chapter 20, where Zhou affirms that sagehood can be learned by adhering to “the essentials” (being unified, without desire, clear, impartial, and so forth), most of which are associated with the exercise of moral virtue rooted in our Heavenly endowment.

Still, while Zhou clearly speaks of the fundamental goodness of humanity, he barely touches on evil itself.  Of human beings, he says in the “Explanation,” “when their fivefold natures are stimulated into activity, good and evil are distinguished and the myriad affairs ensue.”  Zhou repeats the same idea in the Tongshu, adding only that “In incipience there is good and evil.”  The idea seems to be that good and evil, properly understood, only arise with the start of actual human activity.  Does Zhou mean that one’s inherently good human nature, when coming into contact with external things, can give rise to actual good or evil affairs?  It is unclear, but Zhou’s statements definitely provoked many later commentators.  It is really only after Zhang Zai’s explanation of the role of qi that Neo-Confucians had a way to reconcile the Mencian view of fundamental goodness with the undeniable existence of evil in the world.

5. Legacy

Zhou Dunyi was a major influence on the development of Neo-Confucian metaphysics while the spiritual dimensions of his work continue to resonate with various thinkers.  Wing-tsit Chan declares that the most accurate estimation of his work can be found in the comments of the later scholar Huang Bojia (1695), a passage that deserves to be quoted in full:

Since the time of Confucius and Mencius, Han (206 B.C.E.-220 C.E.) Confucianists merely had textual studies of the Classics. The subtle doctrines of the Way and the nature of man and things have disappeared for a long time. Master Zhou rose like a giant. . . . Although other Neo-Confucianists had opened the way, it was Master Zhou who brought light to the exposition of the subtlety and refinement of the mind, the nature, and moral principles.” (quoted in Chan, A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy, 461; pinyin romanization substituted for Wade-Giles in original).

 C. Graham, however, argues in his landmark Two Chinese Philosophers: The Metaphysics of the Brothers Ch’eng that Zhou had little direct influence on these seminal thinkers. Certainly in light of evidence that Zhu Xi’s creative work in establishing the orthodox “transmission of the Way” (Daotong), we should not consider Zhou to be the historical “founder” of Neo-Confucianism.

Still, while any direct connection between Zhou and later Neo-Confucians is tenuous, his inspirational role cannot be doubted.  One famous story, attributed to Cheng Hao in Reflections on Things at Hand, says that Zhou refused to cut the grass growing outside his window, saying, “[The feeling of the grass] and mine are the same.” While this tale seems the stuff of hagiography, it does give us a sense of the reverence for Zhou within Confucianism.  Indeed, as an affirmation of the fundamental continuity of all life, this story is a poignant example of what living out Zhou’s metaphysical vision might be like.  Such stories have helped cement the image of Zhou as a “latter day Sage,” an image that fits well with the specific models of Sageliness he holds up ( Yan Hui, Confucius, to name two). In this regard, it is noteworthy that in chapter 14 of Reflections on Things At Hand, entitled “On the Dispositions of Sages and Worthies,” Zhu Xi says of Zhou that “[his] mind was free, pure, and unobstructed, like a breeze on a sunny day and the clear moon.”  Elsewhere, Zhu says that Zhou’s mind was “harmonious with the ‘Supreme Polarity’,” and that he “had the joy of Confucius and Yanzi.”

Joseph Adler argues that Zhou’s importance lies in the fact that his work provided a basis for Zhu Xi’s own religious practice. Specifically, Zhou’s teaching on the interrelationship of “stillness” and “activity” enabled Zhu to ground his methods of self-cultivation in the words of an earlier figure revered for his own spiritual example.  Regardless, Zhou Dunyi is a profound thinker whose poetic words still provide philosophical and religious guidance.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adler, Joseph A. Reconstructing the Confucian Dao: Zhu Xi’s Appropriation of Zhou Dunyi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2014.
    • The single best scholarly discussion of Zhou’s thought and his place within Neo-Confucianism currently available.  In addition to his insightful analysis of the “Explanation” and the Tongshu, Adler argues that Zhou’s work provided the solution to Zhu Xi’s personal spiritual crisis by providing a cosmological and metaphysical underpinning for Zhu’s own religious practice.  Includes clear annotated translations of the “Explanation” and the Tongshu along with Zhu Xi’s commentaries, prefaces, and postscripts, as well as passages from the writings (commentaries, prefaces and so forth) on Zhou’s work from other Neo-Confucian thinkers.
  • Adler, Joseph A. “Response and Responsibility: Chou Tun-I and Neo-Confucian Resources for Environmental Ethics.”  In Confucianism and Ecology: The Interrelation of Heaven, Earth, and Humans, edited by Mary Evelyn Tucker and John Berthrong, 123-49. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Center for the Study of World Religions, 1998.
    • Excellent discussion of Zhou’s thought highlighting the ecological dimensions of his ethical/spiritual scheme.
  • Adler, Joseph A. “Zhou Dunyi: The Metaphysics and Practice of Sagehood.” In Sources of Chinese Tradition, 2nd ed., vol. 1, edited by Wm. Theodore de Bary and Irene Bloom, 669-78. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999.
    • Good annotated English translations of Zhou’s “Explanation” in its entirety (including the Diagram itself) along with selections from the Tongshu (chapters 1, 3, 4, 16, and 20).  Includes a useful introductory discussion of Zhou’s life and work.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed.  A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy.  Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • A must-read for anyone interested in Chinese thought.  Chan’s own perspective is heavily colored by Neo-Confucianism (particularly the Chen-Zhu line).  Chapter 28 is devoted entirely to Zhou, and includes not only biographical information and philosophical analysis, but annotated English translations of both the “Explanation” and the Tongshu in their entirety.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Chu Hsi and Lu Tsu-Ch’ien. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • Masterful philosophical translation of the primary text of Neo-Confucian thought.  Heavily annotated with a 27-page introduction that includes biographical information about Zhou and the other three “founders” of the Cheng-Zhu line.  Also includes a 25-page glossary of key Chinese terms (Wade-Giles Romanization and traditional characters) and a short (11-page) essay entitled “On Translating Certain Chinese Philosophical Terms.”  Not only does this anthology open with Chan’s translation of the “Explanation,” the index makes it easy to locate all 12 of the passages from Zhou’s writings that Master Zhu included.
  • Fung Yu-lan [Feng Youlan]. A History of Chinese Philosophy. Volume II: The Period of Classical Learning (from the Second Century B.C. to the Twentieth Century A.D.). Translated by Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • Rather dated but masterful overview of the history of Chinese thought. Like Chan’s Source Book, a must read for students of Asian philosophy.  Section 1 of Chapter XI focuses on Zhou’s thought.  The condensed A Short History of Chinese Philosophy (a single volume distillation of Fung’s larger two-volume work) is also informative.
  • Tu Wei-Ming and Mary Evelyn Tucker, eds.  Confucian Spirituality. Volume Two.  New York: The Crossroad Publishing Company, 2004.
    • Part of the “World Spirituality” series, this collection of nearly 20 essays examines Confucian religious thought and practice from the Song era down to the present, covering the spread of Neo-Confucianism to Korea, Japan, Vietnam and its development into a truly a global tradition. Although Zhou Dunyi is not the focus of any specific essay, discussion of his thought and influence figure prominently in several pieces in the first part of the volume.
  • Tu Wei-Ming. Confucian Thought: Selfhood as Creative Transformation. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1985.
    • Classic discussion of the spiritual dimensions of Confucian tradition (particularly the more Mencian Neo-Confucian dimensions) by its foremost proponent.  While not explicitly devoted to Zhou, Tu’s discussion illuminates themes that run throughout the Song master’s work.
  • Wang, Robin. “Zhou Dunyi’s Diagram of the Supreme Ultimate Explained: A Construction of the Confucian Metaphysics.” Journal of the History of Ideas 66/3 (July 2005): 307-323.
    • Highlights ways that Zhou’s thought traces a notion of gender complementarity in his depiction of human beings as arising from and embodying the original and sustaining energies of the cosmos (yin and yang). Human persons are its highest exemplification and as such are a prime phenomenon of this dynamic cosmic creation.
  • Zhou Dunyi.  Zhou Dunyi ji (Collected Works of Zhou Dunyi).  Edited by Chen Keming. Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1990.
    • Good contemporary Chinese edition of Zhou’s primary works.


Author Information

John Thompson
Email: john.thompson@cnu.edu
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.