A preeminent scholar, classicist and a first-rate analytic and synthetic thinker, Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi) created the supreme synthesis of Song-Ming dynasty (960-1628 CE) Neo-Confucianism. Moreover, by selecting the essential classical Confucian texts–the Analects (Lunyu) of Confucius, the Book of Mencius (Mengzi, the Great Learning (Daxue) and the Doctrine of the Mean (Zhongyong)—then editing and compiling them, with commentary, as the Four Books (Sishu). In doing so, Zhu redefined the Confucian tradition and outlook. He restored its original focus on moral cultivation and realization from the more bureaucratic stance of Confucians of the preceding Han and Tang dynasty (206 BCE-905 CE) who concentrated on the Five Classics (Wujing) of classical antiquity. The Four Books became required reading for the imperial examination system from the Yuan dynasty (1280-1341) until the system was abolished near the end of the Qing dynasty (1644-1911) in 1908. In his philosophical work, Zhu fused the concepts of the principal Northern Song (960-1126 CE) thinkers, Shao Yong (1011-77), Zhou Dunyi (1017-73), Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-77) and the brothers Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Cheng Hao (1032-85) into a rich, grand synthesis. Zhu Xi’s thought has been the starting point for intellectual discourse and the focus of disputation for the last 800 years. His influence spread to Korea and Japan, which adopted Confucianism and the imperial examination system and were enamored of Zhu’s intellectual achievements. To study traditional Chinese philosophy, especially Confucian thought, one must engage the ideas and works of Zhu Xi.
Zhu Xi was born in Youqi in Fujian province, China in 1130. A precocious child, he asked what lay beyond Heaven at age five and grasped the import of the Classic of Filiality (Xiaojing) at age eight. After losing his father, Zhu Song (1097-1143), in his youth, he was raised in the company of several eclectic scholars, including Buddhists. A prodigy, he passed the top-level jinshi exam (the “presented scholar” exam) at the young age of nineteen, drawing on Chan Buddhist notions in his answers. He continued to nurture an eclectic interest in Daoism and Buddhism until he became the student of the Neo-Confucian master Li Tong (1093-1163) in 1160. Zhu’s father had recommended that he study under Li, but Zhu delayed seeing him until age 30, when he had spiritual doubts. A master in the tradition of the Cheng brothers, Li convinced Zhu of the superiority of the Confucian Way and cultivation, to which Zhu devoted himself for the next forty years. Having passed the jinshi examination, Zhu was qualified to hold office and was assigned to several prefectural administrative posts. But Zhu was critical of central court policy on several key issues and preferred temple guardianships, which gave him leisure to read, write and teach. (This also shielded him from the cutthroat politics at court where his frankness would have been literally fatal to him.) He thus became a productive scholar who made lasting contributions to classicism, historiography, literary criticism and philosophy. He was also a master of elegant prose and poetry.
As a renowned teacher, Zhu taught the classics and Neo-Confucianism to hundreds, if not thousands, of students. His oral teachings are preserved in the Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu (Zhuzi yulei). He also published critical, annotated editions of several classics, including the Book of Change (Yijing) and the Book of Odes (Shijing), of specific Neo-Confucianism works, including the works of Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai and the Cheng brothers, and a more encompassing Neo-Confucian anthology, Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu). Devoted to his work, he kept busy virtually to his last breath when he was rethinking and discussing the Great Learning. Throughout life, he sought to reestablish the fundamental principles and ideals of Confucianism in order to restore the vitality of China’s cultural and political integrity as a Confucian society, since those seeking spiritual guidance and solace were inclined to favor Daoism and Buddhism over the spiritually impoverished alternative of bureaucratic Confucianism. Moreover, he thought the empire needed the spiritual élan of authentic Confucian values to meet the challenge of barbarian encroachers. His patriotism, commitment to the tradition and devotion to scholarship and education remain an inspiration to this day in East Asia and throughout the world.
Zhu’s complex theory of human nature registered the possibility of evil as well as that of sagehood. On his theory, while (following Mencius, 372-289 BCE) people are fundamentally good (that is, originally sensitive and well-disposed), how one manifests this original nature will be conditioned by one’s specificqi endowment (one’s native talents and gifts), and one’s family and social environment. These together yield one’s empirical personality, intelligence and potential for cultivation and success. Zhu thought difference in individual disposition, character and aptitude for moral self-realization are due to variations inqi endowments and environments.
Preceding generations of Neo-Confucian scholars had tended not to register the complexity of human nature and the wide range of individual differences and advocated relatively straightforward approaches to self-cultivation as purifying the mind to elicit the natural responses of one’s original goodness. They tended to understand this process in itself to constitute self-realization. For example, Zhu’s teacher Li Tong had strongly advocated a form of meditation called “quiet sitting,” the efficacy of which the active young Zhu had doubted from the outset, at least for himself. Several years later, Zhu held discussions with Zhang Shi (1133-80), a follower of Hu Hong (1106-61), who had advocated “introspection in action.” Zhu initially embraced this approach, but soon found that it was not viable for himself. He found that such introspection in the heat of action could not inform or guide action. It tended to impede the flow of effective deliberate action by making one too self-conscious.
Zhu Xi’s ingenious solution was a two-pronged approach to cultivation that involved nurturing one’s feeling of reverence (jing) while investigating things to discern their defining patterns (li). Reverence, a virtue taught by Confucius (551-479 BCE) and the classics, serves to purify the mind, attune one to the promptings of the original good nature and impel one to act with appropriateness (yi). At the same time, by grasping the defining, interactive patterns that constitute the world, society, people and upright conduct, one gains the key to acting appropriately. The mind that is imbued with a feeling of reverence and comprehends these patterns will develop into a good will (zhuzai) dedicated to rectitude and appropriate conduct.
Interestingly, in later life, Zhu regarded this conception of cultivation and realization as too complicated, gradual and difficult to complete. Like Confucius, he came to accept that one must, on embarking on moral self-cultivation, establish the resolve (lizhi) to realize the Confucian virtues and become an exemplary person (junzi), a master of appropriateness in human conduct and interpersonal affairs.
In “A Treatise on Humanity” (Renshuo), Zhu Xi articulates and systematizes the classical Confucian ideal of humanity (ren) in simultaneously cosmic and human perspective. At the same time, he effectively criticizes competing accounts of “humanity” on logical, semantic and ethical grounds. Following early tradition, Zhu associates humanity with cosmic creativity. At its root, humanity is the impulse of “heaven and earth” (the cosmos) to produce things. It is manifested vividly in the cycle of seasons and the fecundity of nature. (The settled Chinese terrain and climate were moderate and productive, supporting the view that nature generally was fecund and afforded suitable conditions for human flourishing.) This impulse to produce is instilled in all of the myriad creatures, but in man it is sublimated into the virtue of “humanity” (“authoritative personhood”), which, when fully realized, involves being caring and responsible to others in due degree. Zhu Xi similarly correlates the four stages of creativity and production in the cosmos and nature — origination, growth, flourishing and firmness — that were first indicated in the Book of Change, with the four cardinal virtues enunciated by Confucius — humanity, appropriateness, ritual conduct and wisdom. He thus portrays the realized person as both a vital participant in cosmic creativity and a catalyst for the flourishing and self-realization of others. On this basis, Zhu goes on to formulate the definitive definition of ren (humanity, authoritative personhood) for the subsequent tradition: “the essential character of mind” and “the essential pattern of love.” The virtue of ren grounds the disposition of mind as commiserative and describes the core of moral self-realization as love for others (other-directed concern), appropriately manifested.
Zhu Xi erected a metaphysical synthesis that has been compared broadly to the systems of Plato, Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas and Whitehead. These “Great Chain” systems are hierarchical and rooted in the distinction between form and matter. Zhu advanced Zhou Dunyi’s dynamic conception of reality as shown in the “Diagram of the Supreme Polarity” (Taiji tu), in order to conceive the Cheng brother’s concept of li (pattern, principle) and Zhang Zai’s notion of qi (cosmic vapor) as organically integrated in a holistic system. In Zhou’s treatise, Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity (Taiji tu shuo), Zhu discerned a viable account of the formation of the world in stages from the original unformed qi, to yin and yang, the five phases — earth, wood, fire, water and metal — and on to heaven, earth and the ten thousand things. Zhu blended this conception with ideas from the Book of Change and its commentaries in setting forth a comprehensive philosophy of cosmic and human creativity, providing philosophical grounds for the received Confucian concepts of human nature and self-cultivation. Zhu’s penchant for thinking in polarities—li and qi, in particular—has continued to stir critics to regard him as a dualist who used two concepts to explain reality. For his part, any viable account of the complexity of phenomena must involve two or more facets in order to register their complexity and changes.
Zhu Xi was an active scholar-intellectual who held discussions and disputes with other scholars, both in correspondence and in person. He can be known by contrast with others as well as through his positive views. For example, his series of letters with Zhang Shi on the topic of self-cultivation, preserved in theCollected Writings of Master Zhu (Zhuzi wenji), provides an enlightening record of these dedicated Confucians’ quest for a well-grounded, effective approach to self-cultivation. He debated with Lu Zuqian (1134-1181) on the nature of education. Zhu focused on the Confucian Way and moral practice, while Lu argued for a broader-based humanities approach. He held a series of debates with Lu Jiuyuan (Xiangshan, 1139-93) on the nature of realization and moral conduct. Whereas Zhu advocated regimens of study, reflection, observation and practice, Lu spoke simply of reflecting on the self and clarifying the mind, considering that once the mind was clear one would know spontaneously what to do in any situation. Zhu also corresponded with the “utilitarian” Confucian scholar Chen Liang (1143-94), who disputed Zhu’s focus on individual moral realization and the received “Way” with a broader institutional approach that was more sensitive to empirical facts and conditions. Zhu generally eclipsed all of the other scholars of his day, partly because he outlived them and had so many students, but mainly because his system was so compelling. It was comprehensive yet nuanced, tightly reasoned yet accommodating of individual differences. It preserved the essential Confucian Way yet ramified it to meet the challenges of Buddhism and Daoism as spiritual teachings. Zhu’s influence rose at the end of the Southern Song dynasty and became decisive during the Yuan dynasty, which adopted his edition of the Four Books as the basis of the imperial examination system arranged by scholars trained in his approach.
While raising his standing in pedagogy, this focus on the Four Books at the expense of Zhu’s deeper, more nuanced texts and dialogues opened the door to philosophic criticism. A schematic presentation of Zhu’s cosmic theory of pattern (li) and qi lay in the background of his commentary to the Four Books, which easily opened him to charges of dualism and of reading abstract categories into the essentially practical ancient texts. Because his commentary was focused on reading and understanding the meaning, intent and cultivation message of the Four Books, critics generalized that Zhu and his method were essentially scholastic and would be myopic and stilted in facing real situations. Anyone who peruses the corpus of Zhu’s writings and dialogues, however, will find that his ontology is not a crude dualism but a holism built of mutually implicative elements that never exist in separation. Also, his reflections are always informed by knowledge of history, current events and practical observation, as his method of observation applies generally to objects (and self) and phenomena while respecting but not privileging texts. Even his comments on Confucius and Mencius often refer back to the person and the speech context, and, thus, are not entirely scholastic. His method of observation opened the door to breakthroughs beyond the “verities” of the classics, though he was careful not to play up this fact because most of his colleagues sought the truth in the texts, thinking empirical facts were distractions from the essential Heavenly-patterning (tianli) reflected more adequately in the canonical texts.
Whereas early generations of Zhu’s followers were acquainted with his broader learning, style and spirit, Confucians of the Ming and Qing dynasties knew him mostly through his edition of the Four Books, through which they targeted their criticisms of his thought. Zhu’s most eminent critic was the Ming scholar-official Wang Yangming (Wang Yang-ming, 1472-1529). In youth, Wang had admired Zhu’s learning and once even attempted to try out his approach to observation, “investigate things to discern their defining patterns.” But, after diligently “observing” bamboo for several days, Wang became ill and got no special insight into the pattern or meaning of bamboo or anything else. He therefore rejected Zhu’s approach to observation as too objective, as outward rather than inward. In the twentieth century, Qian Mu observed that Zhu would only make such observations with guiding questions in mind, around which to focus his observations; he never would have countenanced just looking, which would turn up nothing that wasn’t obvious. For example, having heard a monk claim that bean sprouts grow faster by night than by day, Zhu measured the growth of some bean plants after twelve hours of daylight and of nocturnal darkness, respectively, and found that the plants exhibited the same rate of growth day and night. (The monk’s claim had been based on Mencius’ idea that the qi was more vital at night.) For his part, Wang transformed Zhu’s theory of observation into a pragmatic theory, thereby gearing observation directly to discernment and response—knowing how to act. Thus, Wang formulated a famous slogan that “knowledge and action form a unity.” Later, he argued that knowledge is not essentially objective and factual, but rooted in an inborn moral sensitivity (liangzhi), which is elicited by clarifying the mind so that one becomes actively responsive to one’s moral impulses (liangneng). It could be said that, in his criticisms, Wang was reacting more to the scholastic attitudes fostered by the examination system than to Zhu Xi himself. Wang ultimately respected Zhu and went on to compile a text attempting to show that in later life Zhu had changed his approach in a subjective, practical way that anticipated Wang’s approach.
Scholars of the late Ming through early Qing period (mid-seventeenth to early eighteenth century), notably, Wang Fuzhi (1619-92) and Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1723-77), disputed Zhu on philosophical and textual grounds. Whereas Zhu had insisted on the priority of “pattern” over qi, (roughly, form over matter), Wang and Dai followed the Northern Song thinker Zhang Zai in affirming the priority of qi, viewing patterns as a posteriori evolutionary realizations of qi interactions. They thought this account dissolved the threat of any hint of dualism in cosmology, ontology and human nature. For his part, Zhu Xi would have responded that, fundamentally, “pattern” is implicated in the very make-up and possible configurations of qi; which is why the regular a posteriori patterns can emerge. “Pattern” provides for the standing orders and processes, based on the steady interactions of yin-yang, five phases, etc., that give rise to the heaven-earth world order, with its full complement of ten thousand things. The fundamental a priori patterns are thus necessary to the world order and provide the fecund context in which the a posteriori forms emerge continuously. Wang and Dai’s qi-based view could not account for existence and the world order in this sense. At the same time, Zhu did not think that “patterns” were absolutely determinative. They just set certain “possibilities of order” that are realized when the necessary qiconditions obtain. For the most part, he registered the range of randomness and free flow in qi activity that is best exemplified in the randomness of weather systems and seismic events.
As to textual grounds, Wang and Dai argued that Zhu was so enamored of his metaphysics of pattern andqi that he constantly read them into the classical texts. For example, Dai said Zhu blandly associated Confucius’ term tian (heaven) with his own notion of li (pattern; principle), quoting Analects 11:9 where Confucius, in sorrow over the death of his disciple Yan Hui, cried that “Heaven had forsaken” him. Could Zhu reasonably claim that Confucius was crying that li had forsaken him? Critics tend to find Dai’s counter-intuitive example against Zhu’s approach compelling. However, consulting Zhu’s original commentary, we find that he noted that this phrase expressed Confucius’ utmost sorrow, that he felt Yan Hui’s death as if it was his own, without mentioning “pattern.” This example does not prove Wang and Dai’s claim. It illustrates that Zhu’s commentary was nuanced and sensitive to pragmatic, situational usages despite his penchant to see his own notion of “pattern” in some of Confucius’ usages of “heaven.” Moreover, the classicist Daniel Gardner shows that Zhu’s commentary was not intended as simply a glossary with comments. It was intended as a guide to self-cultivation. Hence, Zhu sometimes recast passages in the Analects more generally to show their broader implications for self-cultivation and realization, often with the isolated countryside student in mind. Gardner shows that Zhu thus had enriched the text as a vital tool for self-cultivation, whereas the earlier commentaries of the Han and Tang dynasties had just given glosses necessary for answering examination questions.
Known in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries in the West due to the work of Jesuits in China, Zhu Xi’s thought and texts were made more widely available to western scholarship in the late nineteenth century. Early in the twentieth century, a Chinese student of John Dewey (1859-1951) at Cornell, Hu Shi (1891-1962), initially followed the empirical, textual Qing scholars in viewing Zhu as a scholastic metaphysician. But, after reading Zhu’s Dialogues in old age, Hu contended that Zhu’s method of observation was not scholastic but essentially scientific in nature. J.C. Bruce, who translated a book of Zhu’s collected writings in the 1920s, viewed Zhu’s notion of li (pattern; principle) in light of Stoic natural law. From the 1930s, the eminent historian of Chinese philosophy, Feng Youlan, interpreted li along the lines of platonic Forms making Zhu Xi appear to be an idealist and abstract thinker. In the 1950s, Carsun Chang naturalized the notion of li by aligning it with the Aristotelian “nature” or “essence,” thereby locking Zhu’s thought into a sort of descriptive metaphysics.
From the 1960s, Mou Zongsan interpreted and criticized Zhu’s ontology and ethics on Kantian grounds, saying he erected an a priori framework but then illicitly sought to derive further a priori knowledge (of patterns) by a posteriori means (observation). In the 1970s, the intellectual historian, Qian Mu examined and explained Zhu Xi’s thought directly on its own terms, without reading western concepts and logical patterns into his system. Scholars wanting to read Zhu Xi on his own terms, unmediated by western thought, turn to the five volume Zhu Xi anthology edited by Qian Mu as a rich starting point.
In 1956, Joseph Needham, a scientist, made a highly significant breakthrough by interpreting Zhu’s system in terms of a process philosophy, Whitehead’s organic naturalism. Needham successfully recast much of Zhu’s language in naturalistic rather than metaphysical terms. The cultural, moral dimension of Needham’s account has been developed by Cheng-ying Cheng and John Berthrong, while the scientific dimension has been examined by Yung Sik Kim. In the 1980s, A.C. Graham offered the most insightful and apt account of Zhu’s terminology and pattern of thought in, “What Was New in the Ch’eng-Chu Theory of Human Nature?” and other writings. Graham showed decisively that the term li refers to an embedded contextual “pattern,” rather than to any sort of abstract form or principle. He reminded us that the term li never figures in propositions or logical sequences, as would be natural for “principle.” Rather,li are always conceived as structuring, balancing, modulating, guiding phenomena, processes, reflection and human discernment and response. For example, one never finds moral syllogisms in Zhu Xi’s writings. Everything he says is about moral emotional intelligence: attunement, sensitivity, discernment, and response. Kirill Thompson has explored and extended Graham’s interpretation in a series of studies. Joseph Adler examines the roles played by the Book of Change and Zhou Dunyi in Zhu’s thought, while Thomas Wilson and Hoyt Tillman have shown the extent to which Zhu Xi re-visioned, revised and recast the Confucian Way. Wilson is interested in Zhu’s account of the Way as a sort of educational-ideological revision, and Tillman is interested in how Zhu’s account of the Way eventually snuffed out other competing versions that might have offered more practical and liberal openings in late imperial China.
In summary, the depth and range of Zhu Xi’s thought were unparalleled in the tradition. Zhu Xi studies continue to be vital, wide-ranging and contentious, drawing growing global, cross-cultural interest.
Kirill O. Thompson
National Taiwan University
Last updated: May 22, 2007 | Originally published: