Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Zhuangzi (Chuang-Tzu, 369—298 B.C.E.)

zhuangziZhuangzi, or “Master Zhuang” (also known in the Wade-Giles romanization as Chuang-tzu) was, after Laozi, one of the earliest thinkers to contribute to the philosophy that has come to be known as Daojia, or school of the Way. According to traditional dating, he was an almost exact contemporary of the Confucian thinker Mencius, but there appears to have been little to no communication between them.  He is ranked among the greatest of literary and philosophical giants that China has produced.  His style is complex—mythical, poetic, narrative, humorous, indirect, and polysemic.
Zhuangzi espoused a holistic philosophy of life, encouraging disengagement from the artificialities of socialization, and cultivation of our natural “ancestral” potencies and skills, in order to live a simple and natural, but full and flourishing life. He was critical of our ordinary categorizations and evaluations, noting the multiplicity of different modes of understanding between different creatures, cultures, and philosophical schools, and the lack of an independent means of making a comparative evaluation. He advocated a mode of understanding that is not committed to a fixed system, but is fluid and flexible, and that maintains a provisional, pragmatic attitude towards the applicability of these categories and evaluations.
The text through which we know his work was the result of the editing and arrangement of the Jin dynasty thinker and commentator Guo Xiang (Kuo Hsiang, d. 312 CE), who reduced what had been a work in fifty-two chapters to the current edition of thirty-three chapters, excising material that he considered to be spurious.  Zhuangzi’s version of Daoist philosophy was highly influential in the reception, interpretation, and transformation of Buddhism in China.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Zhuangzi Text
  3. Central Concepts in the “Inner Chapters”
    1. Chapter 1: Xiao Yao You (Wandering Beyond)
    2. Chapter 2: Qi Wu Lun (Discussion on Smoothing Things Out)
    3. Chapter 3: Yang Sheng Zhu (The Principle of Nurturing Life)
    4. Chapter 4: Ren Jian Shi (The Realm of Human Interactions)
    5. Chapter 5: De Chong Fu (Signs of the Flourishing of Potency)
    6. Chapter 6: Da Zong Shi (The Vast Ancestral Teacher)
    7. Chapter 7: Ying Di Wang (Responding to Emperors and Kings)
  4. Key Interpreters of Zhuangzi
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

According to the great Han dynasty historian, Sima Qian, Zhuangzi was born during the Warring States (403-221 BCE), more than a century after the death of Confucius. During this time, the ostensibly ruling house of Zhou had lost its authority, and there was increasing violence between states contending for imperial power. This situation gave birth to the phenomenon known as the baijia, the hundred schools: the flourishing of many schools of thought, each articulating its own conception of a return to a state of harmony. The first and most important of these schools was that of Confucius, who became the chief representative of the Ruists (Confucians), the scholars and propagators of the wisdom and culture of the tradition. Their great rivals were the Mohists, the followers of Mozi (“Master Mo”), who were critical of what they perceived to be the elitism and extravagance of the traditional culture. The recent archaeological discovery at Guo Dian of an early Laozi manuscript suggests that the philosophical movement associated with the Daodejing also began to emerge during this period. Zhuangzi’s brand of Daoist philosophy developed within the context defined by these three schools.

Scholars are increasingly beginning to recognize the connection of Daojia with the culture of the state of Chu in the southern part of China around the Yangzi River valley. In recent years, the diversity of regions and cultures in early China has increasingly been acknowledged. Most interest has been directed to the state of Chu, in large part because of the wealth of archaeological evidence that is being unearthed there. According to Sima Qian, Zhuangzi was born in a village called Meng, in the state of Song; according to Lu Deming, the Sui-Tang dynasty scholar, the Pu River in which Zhuangzi was said to have fished was in the state of Chen which, as Wang Guowei points out, had become a territory of Chu. We might say that Zhuangzi was situated in the borderlands between Chu and the central plains—the plains centered around the Yellow River which were the home of the Shang and Zhou cultures. Certainly, as one learns more about the culture of Chu, one senses deep resonances with the aesthetic sensibility of the Daoists, and with Zhuangzi’s style in particular. The silks and bronzes of Chu, for example, are rich and vibrant; the patterns and images on fabrics and pottery are fanciful and naturalistic.

If the traditional dating is reliable, then Zhuangzi would have been an exact contemporary of the Ruistthinker Mencius, but there appears to have been little to no communication between them. There are a few remarks in the Zhuangzi that could be alluding to Mencius’ philosophy, but there is nothing in Mencius that shows any interest in Zhuangzi. The philosopher Hui Shi, or Huizi (“Master Hui,” 380-305 BCE), was a close friend of Zhuangzi, although not a follower of Daojia. There appears to have been a friendly rivalry between the broad and mythic-minded Zhuangzi and the more shortsighted paradox-monger, Huizi. Despite their very deep philosophical distance, and the limitations of Huizi, Zhuangzi expresses great appreciation both for his linguistic abilities and for his friendship. The other “logician,” Gongsun Longzi, would also have been a contemporary of Zhuangzi, and although Zhuangzi does not, unfortunately, engage in any direct philosophical discussion with him, one does find an occasional wink in his direction.

2. The Zhuangzi Text

The currently extant text known as the Zhuangzi is the result of the editing and arrangement of the Jin dynasty thinker and commentator Guo Xiang (Kuo Hsiang, d. 312 CE). He reduced what was then a work in fifty-two chapters to the current edition of thirty-three chapters, excising material that he considered to be spurious. His commentary on the text provides an interpretation that has been highly influential over the subsequent centuries.

Guo Xiang divided the thirty-three chapters into three collections, known as the Inner Chapters (Neipian), the Outer Chapters (Waipian), and the Miscellaneous Chapters (Zapian). The Inner Chapters are the first seven chapters and are considered to be the work of Zhuangzi himself. The Outer Chapters are chapters 8 to 22, and the Miscellaneous Chapters are chapters 23 to 33. The Outer and Miscellaneous Chapters can be further subdivided. Much modern research has been devoted to a sub-classification of these chapters according to philosophical school. Kuan Feng made some scholarly breakthroughs early in the twentieth century; A. C. Graham continued his classification in the tradition of Kuan Feng. Harold Roth has also taken up a consideration of this issue and come up with some very interesting results. What follows is a simplified version of the results of the research of Liu Xiaogan.

According to Liu, chapters 17 to 27 and 32 can be considered to be the work of a school of Zhuangzi’s followers, what he calls the Shu Zhuang Pai, or the “Transmitter” school. Graham, following Kuan Feng, considers chapters 22 to 27 and 32 not to be coherent chapters, but merely random “ragbag” collections of fragments. Liu considers chapters 8 to 10, chapters 28 to 31, and the first part of chapter 11 to be from a school of Anarchists whose philosophy is closely related to that of Laozi. Graham, again following in the tradition of Kuan Feng, sees these as two separate but related schools: the first he attributes to a writer he calls the “Primitivist,” the second he considers to be a school of followers of Yang Zhu. Liu classifies chapters 12 to 16, chapter 33, and the first part of chapter 11 as belonging to the Huang-Lao school. (Graham refers to the supposed author of these chapters as the “Syncretist.”) Graham finds the classification of chapter 16 to be problematic.

In the following chart the further to the right the chapters are listed, the further away they are from the central ideas of the Inner Chapters:

The Inner Chapters School of Zhuang Anarchist chapters Huang-Lao school
1. Wandering Beyond 17. Autumn Floods 8. Webbed Toes 11. Let it Be, Leave it Alone
2. Discussion on Smoothing Things Out 18. Utmost Happiness 9. Horse’s Hooves 12. Heaven and Earth
3. The Principle of Nurturing Life 19. Mastering Life 10. Rifling Trunks 13. The Way of Heaven
4. In the Human Realm 20. The Mountain Tree 11. Let it Be, Leave it Alone 14. The Turning of Heaven
5. Signs of Abundant Potency 21. Tian Zi Fang 15. Constrained in Will
6. The Vast Ancestral Teacher 22. Knowledge Wandered North (16?. Mending the Inborn Nature) (16?. Mending the Inborn Nature)
7. Responding to Emperors and Kings 23. Geng Sang Chu
24. Xu Wugui 28. Yielding the Throne 33. The World
25. Ze Yang 29. Robber Zhi
26. External Things 30. Discoursing on Swords
27. Imputed Words 31. The Old Fisherman
32. Lie Yukou

3. Central Concepts in the “Inner Chapters”

The following is an account of the central ideas of Zhuangzi, going successively through each of the seven Inner Chapters. This discussion is not confined to the content of the particular chapters, but rather represents a fuller articulation of the inter-relationships of the ideas between the Inner Chapters, and also between these ideas and those expressed in the Outer and Miscellaneous Chapters, where these appear to be relevant.

a. Chapter 1: Xiao Yao You (Wandering Beyond)

The title of the first chapter of the Zhuangzi has also been translated as “Free and Easy Wandering” and “Going Rambling Without a Destination.” Both of these reflect the sense of the Daoist who is in spontaneous accord with the natural world, and who has retreated from the anxieties and dangers of social life, in order to live a healthy and peaceful natural life. In modern Mandarin, the word xiaoyao has thus come to mean “free, at ease, leisurely, spontaneous.” It conveys the impression of people who have given up the hustle and bustle of worldly existence and have retired to live a leisurely life outside the city, perhaps in the natural setting of the mountains.

But this everyday expression is lacking a deeper significance that is expressed in the classical Chinese phrase: the sense of distance, or going beyond. As with all Zhuangzi’s images, this is to be understood metaphorically. The second word, ‘yao,’ means ‘distance’ or ‘beyond,’ and here implies going beyond the boundaries of familiarity. We ordinarily confine ourselves with our social roles, expectations, and values, and with our everyday understandings of things. But this, according to Zhuangzi, is inadequate for a deeper appreciation of the natures of things, and for a more successful mode of interacting with them. We need at the very least to undo preconceptions that prevent us from seeing things and events in new ways; we need to see how we can structure and restructure the boundaries of things. But we can only do so when we ourselves have ‘wandered beyond’ the boundaries of the familiar. It is only by freeing our imaginations to reconceive ourselves, and our worlds, and the things with which we interact, that we may begin to understand the deeper tendencies of the natural transformations by which we are all affected, and of which we are all constituted. By loosening the bonds of our fixed preconceptions, we bring ourselves closer to an attunement to the potent and productive natural way (dao) of things.

Paying close attention to the textual associations, we see that wandering is associated with the word wu, ordinarily translated ‘nothing,’ or ‘without.’ Related associations include: wusuo (no place), wuyou (no ‘something’), and most famously wuwei (no interference). Roger Ames and David Hall have commented extensively on these wu expressions. Most importantly, they are not to be understood as simple negations, but have a much more complex function. The significance of all of these expressions must be traced back to the wu of Laozi: a type of negation that does not simply negate, but places us in a new kind of relation to ‘things’—a phenomenological waiting that allows them to manifest, one that acknowledges the space that is the possibility of their coming to presence, one that appreciates the emptiness that is the condition of the possibility of their capacity to function, to be useful (as the hollow inside a house makes it useful for living). The behavior of one who wanders beyond becomes wuwei: sensitive and responsive without fixed preconceptions, without artifice, responding spontaneously in accordance with the unfolding of the inter-developing factors of the environment of which one is an inseparable part.

But it is not just the crossing of horizontal boundaries that is at stake. There is also the vertical distance that is important: one rises to a height from which formerly important distinctions lose what appeared to be their crucial significance. Thus arises the distinction between the great and the small, or the Vast (da) and the petty (xiao). Of this distinction Zhuangzi says that the petty can not come up to the Vast: petty understanding that remains confined and defined by its limitations cannot match Vast understanding, the expansive understanding that wanders beyond. Now, while it is true that the Vast loses sight of distinctions noticed by the petty, it does not follow that they are thereby equalized, as Guo Xiang suggests. For the Vast still embraces the petty in virtue of its very vastness. The petty, precisely in virtue of its smallness, is not able to reciprocate.

Now, the Vast that goes beyond our everyday distinctions also thereby appears to be useless. A soaring imagination may be wild and wonderful, but it is extremely impractical and often altogether useless. Indeed, Huizi, Zhuangzi’s friend and philosophical foil, chides him for this very reason. But Zhuangzi expresses disappointment in him: for his inability to sense the use of this kind of uselessness is a kind of blindness of the spirit. The useless has use, only not as seen on the ordinary level of practical affairs. It has a use in the cultivation and nurturing of the ‘shen‘ (spirit), in protecting the ancestral and preserving one’s life, so that one can last out one’s natural years and live a flourishing life. Now, this notion of a flourishing life is not to be confused with a ‘successful’ life: Zhuangzi is not impressed by worldly success. A flourishing life may indeed look quite unappealing from a traditional point of view. One may give up social ambition and retire in relative poverty to tend to one’s shen and cultivate one’s xing (nature, or life potency).

To summarize: When we wander beyond, we leave behind everything we find familiar, and explore the world in all its unfamiliarity. We drop the tools that we have been taught to use to tame the environment, and we allow it to teach us without words. We imitate its spontaneous behavior and we learn to respond immediately without fixed articulations.

b. Chapter 2: Qi Wu Lun (Discussion on Smoothing Things Out)

If the Inner Chapters form the core of the Zhuangzi collection, then the Qi Wu Lun may be thought of as forming the core of the Inner Chapters. It is, at any rate, the most complex and intricate of the chapters of the Zhuangzi, with allusions and allegories, highly condensed arguments, and baffling metaphors juxtaposed without explanation. It appears to be concerned with the deepest and most ‘abstract’ understanding of ourselves, our lives, our world, our language, and our understanding itself. The most perplexing sections concern language and judgment, and are filled with paradox, sometimes even contradiction. But the contradictions are not easy to dismiss: their context indicates that they have a deep significance. In part, they appear to attempt to express an understanding about the limits of understanding itself, about the limits of language and thought.

This creates a problem for the interpreter, and especially for the translator. How do we deal with the contradictions? The most common solution is to paraphrase them so as to remove the direct contradictoriness, under the presupposition that no sense can be made of a contradiction. The most common way to remove the contradictions is to insert references to points of view. Those translators, such as A. C. Graham, who do this are following the interpretation of the Jin dynasty commentator Guo Xiang, who presents the philosophy as a form of relativism: apparently opposing judgments can harmonized when it is recognized that they are made from different perspectives.

According to Guo Xiang’s interpretation, every thing has its place, its own nature (ziran); every thing has its own value that follows from its own nature. So nothing should be judged by values appropriate to the natures of other things. According to Guo Xiang the vast and the small are equal in significance: this is his interpretation of the word qi in the title, “equalization of all viewpoints”. Now, such a radical relativism usually has the goal of issuing a fundamental challenge to the status quo, arguing that the established values have no more validity than any of the minority values, no matter how shocking they may seem to us. Thus, its effect is usually one of destabilization of the social structure. Here, however, we see another of the possible consequences of such a position: paradoxically enough, its inherent conservativeness. Guo Xiang’s purpose in asserting this radical uniqueness and necessity of each position is conservative in this way. Indeed, it appears to be articulated precisely in response to those who oppose the traditional Ruist values of humanity and rightness (ren and yi) by claiming to have a superior mystical ground from which to judge them to be lacking. Guo Xiang’s aim in asserting the equality of every thing, every position, and every function, is to encourage each thing, and each person, to accept its own place in the hierarchical system, to acknowledge its value in the functioning of the whole. In this way, radical relativism actually forestalls the possibility of radical critique altogether!

According to this reading, the Vast perspective of the giant Peng bird is no better than the petty perspectives of the little birds who laugh at it. And indeed, Guo Xiang, draws precisely this conclusion. But there is a problem with taking this reading too seriously, and it is the kind of problem that plagues all forms of radical relativism when one attempts to follow them through consistently. Simply put, Zhuangzi would have to acknowledge that his own position is no better than those he appears to critique. He would have to acknowledge that his Daoist philosophy, indeed even this articulation of relativism, is no improvement over Confucianism after all, and that it is no less short-sighted than the logic-chopping of the Mohists. This, however, is a consequence that Zhuangzi does not recognize. This is surely an indication that the radical relativistic interpretation is clearly a misreading. No intelligent radical relativist could fail to see this most obvious and direct consequence of their position. And the level of Zhuangzi’s intelligence clearly is above the ordinary.

Recently, some western interpreters (Lisa Raphals and Paul Kjellberg, for example) have focused their attention on aspects of the text that express affinities with the Hellenistic philosophy of Skepticism. Now, it is important not to confuse this with what in modern philosophy is thought of as a doctrine of skepticism, the most common form of which is the claim that we cannot ever claim to know anything, for at least the reason that we might always be wrong about anything we claim to know—that is, because we can never know anything with absolute certainty. This is not quite the claim of the ancient Skeptics. Arguing from a position of fallibilism, these latter feel that we ought never to make any final judgments that go beyond the immediate evidence, or the immediate appearances. We should simply accept what appears at face value and have no further beliefs about its ultimate consequences, or its ultimate value. In particular, we should refrain from making judgments about whether it is good or bad for us. We bracket (epoche) these ultimate judgments. When we see that such things are beyond our ability to know with certainty, we will learn to let go of our anxieties and accept the things that happen to us with equanimity. Such a state of emotional tranquility they call ‘ataraxia.’

Now, the resonances with Zhuangzi’s philosophy are clear. Zhuangzi also accepts a form of fallibilism. While he does not refrain from making judgments, he nevertheless acknowledges that we cannot be certain that what we think of as good for us may not ultimately be bad for us, or that what we now think of as something terrible to be feared (death, for example) might not be an extraordinarily blissful awakening and a release from the toils and miseries of worldly life. When we accept this, we refrain from dividing things into the acceptable and the unacceptable; we learn to accept the changes of things in all their aspects with equanimity. In the Skeptical reading, the textual contradictions are also resolved by appealing to different perspectives from which different judgments appear to be true. Once one has learnt how to shift easily between the perspectives from which such different judgments can be made, then one can see how such apparently contradictory things can be true at the same time—and one no longer feels compelled to choose between them.

There is another way to resolve these contradictions, which involves recognizing the importance of continuous transformation between opposites. In the tradition of Laozi’s cosmology, Zhuangzi’s worldview is also one of seasonal transformations of opposites. The world is seen as a giant clod (da kuai) around which the heavens (tian) revolve about a polar axis (daoshu). All transformations have such an axis, and the aim of the sage is to settle into this axis, so that one may observe the changes without being buffeted around by them.

Now, the theme of opposites is taken up by the Mohists, in their later Mohist Canon, but with a very different understanding. The later Mohists present a detailed analysis of judgments as requiring bivalence: that is judgments may be acceptable (ke) (also, ‘affirmed’ shi) or unacceptable (buke) (also ‘rejected’fei); they must be one or the other and they cannot be both. There must always be a clear distinction between the two. It is to this claim, I believe, that Zhuangzi is directly responding. Rejecting also the Mohist style of discussion, he appeals to an allusive, aphoristic, mythological style of poetic writing to upset the distinctions and blur the boundaries that the Mohists insist must be held apart. The Mohists believe that social harmony can only be achieved when we have clarity of distinctions, especially of evaluative distinctions: true/false, good/bad, beneficial/harmful. Zhuangzi’s position is that this kind of sharp and rigid thinking can result ultimately only in harming our natural tendencies (xing), which are themselves neither sharp nor rigid. If we, on the contrary, learn to nurture those aspects of our heart-minds (xin), our natural tendencies (xing), that are in tune with the natural (tian) and ancestral (zong) within us, then we will eventually find our place at the axis of the way (daoshu) and will be able to ride the transformations of the cosmos free from harm. We will be able to sense and respond to what can only be vaguely expressed without forcing it into gross and unwieldy verbal expressions.

Put another way, our knowledge and understanding (zhi, tong, da) are not just what we can explicitly see before us and verbalize: in modern terms, they are not just what is ‘consciously,’ ‘conceptually,’ or ‘linguistically’ available to us. Zhuangzi also insists on a level of understanding that goes beyond such relatively crude modes of dividing up our world and experiences. There are hidden modes of knowing, not evident or obviously present, modes that allow us to live, breathe, move, understand, connect with others without words, read our environments through subtle signs; these modes of knowing also give us tremendous skill in coping with others and with our environments. These modes of knowing Zhuangzi callswuzhi, literally ‘without knowing,’ or ‘unknowing,’ which Hall and Ames render as ‘unprincipled knowing.’ What is known by such modes of knowing, when we attempt to express it in words, becomes paradoxical and appears contradictory. It seems that bivalent distinctions leave out too much on either side of the divide: they are too crude a tool to cope with the subtlety and complexity of our non-conceptual modes of knowing. Zhuangzi, following a traditional folk psychology of his time, calls this capacity shenming: “spirit insight.”

When we nurture that deepest and most natural, most ancestral part of our pysches, through psycho-physical meditative practices, we at the same time nurture these non-cognitive modes of understanding, embodied wisdoms, that enable us to deal successfully with our circumstances. It is then that we are able to cope directly with what from the limited perspective of our socialized and ‘linguistic’ understanding seems to be too vague, too open, too paradoxical.

c. Chapter 3: Yang Sheng Zhu (The Principle of Nurturing Life)

This chapter, like the Anarchist chapters, deals with the way to nurture and cultivate one’s ‘life force’ (sheng, xing) so as to enable one to live skillfully and last out one’s natural years (qiong qi tian nian). There is a ‘life’ within one that is a source of longevity, an ancestral place from which the phenomena of one’s life continue to arise. This place is to be protected (bao), kept whole (quan), nurtured and cultivated (yang). The result is a sagely and skillful life. We must be careful how we understand this word, ‘skill.’ Zhuangzi takes pains to point out that it is no mere technique. A technique is a procedure that may be mastered, but the skill of the sage goes beyond this. One might say that it has become an ‘art,’ a dao. With Zhuangzi’s conception, any physical activity, whether butchering a carcass, making wooden wheels, or carving beautiful ceremonial bell stands, becomes a dao when it is performed in a spiritual state of heightened awareness (‘attenuation’ xu).

Zhuangzi sees civic involvement as particularly inimical to the preservation and cultivation of one’s natural life. In order to cultivate one’s natural potencies, one must retreat from social life, or at least one must retreat from the highly complex and artificially structured social life of the city. One undergoes a psycho-physical training in which one’s sensory and physical capacities become honed to an extraordinary degree, indicating one’s attunement with the transformations of nature, and thus highly responsive to the tendencies (xing) of all things, people, and processes. The mastery achieved is demonstrated (both metaphorically, and literally) by practical embodied skill. That is, practical embodied skill is a metaphor representing the mastery of the life of the sage, and is also quite literally a sign of sagehood (though not all those who are skillful are to be reckoned as sages). Thus, we see many examples of individuals who have achieved extraordinary levels of excellence in their achievements—practical, aesthetic, and spiritual. Butcher Ding provides an example of a practical, and very lowly, skill; Liezi’s teacher, Huzi, in chapter 7, an example of skill in controlling the very life force itself. Chapter 19, Mastering Life, is replete with examples: a cicada catcher, a ferryman, a carpenter, a swimmer, and Woodcarver Qing, whose aesthetic skill reaches magical heights.

d. Chapter 4: Ren Jian Shi (The Realm of Human Interactions)

In this chapter, Zhuangzi continues the theme broached by the last chapter, but now takes on the problem of how to protect and preserve one’s life and last out one’s years while living in the social realm, especially in circumstances of great danger: a life of civic engagement in a time of social corruption.

The Daoists, and Primitivists in general, are highly critical of the artificiality required to create and sustain complex social structures. The Daoists are skeptical of the ability of deliberate planning to deal with the complexities of the world within which our social structures have their place. Even the developments of the social world when left to themselves are ‘natural’ developments, and as such escape the confines of planned, structured thinking. The more we try to control and curtail these natural meanderings, the more complicated and unwieldy the social structures become. According to the Daoists, no matter how complex we make our structures, they will never be fully able to cope with the fluid flexibility of natural changes. The Daoists perceive the unfolding of the transformations of nature as exhibiting a kind of natural intelligence, a wisdom that cannot be matched by deliberate artificial thinking, thinking that can be articulated in words. The result is that phenomena guided by such artificial structures quickly lose their course, and have to be constantly regulated, re-calibrated. This gives rise to the development and articulation of the artificial concepts of ren and yi for the Ruists, and shi and fei for the Mohists.

The Ruists emphasize the importance of cultivating the values of ren ‘humanity’ and yi‘appropriateness/rightness.’ The Mohists identify a bivalent structure of preference and evaluation. Our judgments can be positive or negative, and these arise out of our acceptance and rejection of things or of judgments, and these in turn arise out of our emotional responses to the phenomena of benefit and harm, that is, pleasure and pain. Thus, we set up one of two types of systems: the intuitive renyi morality of the Ruists, or the articulated structured shifei of the Mohists.

Zhuangzi sees both of these as dangerous. Neither can keep up with the complex transformations of things and so both will result in harm to our shen and xing. They lead to the desire of rulers to increase their personal profit, their pleasure, and their power, and to do so at the expense of others. The best thing is to steer clear of such situations. But there are times when one cannot do so: there is nothing one can do to avoid involvement in a social undertaking. There are also times—if one has a Ruist sensibility—when one will be moved to do what one can and must in order to improve the social situation. Zhuangzi makes up a story about Confucius’ most beloved and most virtuous follower, Yen Hui, who feels called to help ‘rectify’ the King of a state known for his selfishness and brutality.

Zhuangzi thinks that such a motivation, while admirable, is ultimately misguided. There is little to nothing one can do to change things in a corrupt world. But if you really have to try, then you should be aware of the dangers, be aware of the natures of things, and of how they transform and develop. Be on the lookout for the ‘triggers’: the critical junctures at which a situation can explode out of hand. In the presence of danger, do not confront it: always dance to one side, redirect it through skilled and subtle manipulations, that do not take control, but by adding their own weight appropriately, redirect the momentum of the situation. One must treat all dangerous social undertakings as a Daoist adept: one must perform xinzhai, fasting of the heart-mind. This is a psycho-physical discipline of attenuation, in which one nurtures one’s inner potencies, until one achieves a heightened sensitivity to the tendencies of things. One then responds with the skill of a sage to the dangerous moods and intentions of one’s worldly ruler.

e. Chapter 5: De Chong Fu (Signs of the Flourishing of Potency)

This chapter is populated with a collection of characters with bodily eccentricities: criminals with amputated feet, people born with ‘ugly’ deformities, hunchbacks with no lips. Perhaps some of these are moralistic advisors, like those of chapter 4, who were unsuccessful in bringing virtue and harmony to a corrupt state, and instead received the harsh punishment of their offended ruler? But it is also possible that some were born with these physical ‘deformities.’ As the Commander of the Right says in chapter 3, “When tian (nature) gave me life, it saw to it that I would be one footed.” These then are people whose natural capacity (de) has been twisted somehow, redirected, so that it gives them a potency (de) that is beyond the normal human range. At any rate, this out of the ordinary appearance, this extraordinary physical form, is a sign of something deeper: a potency and a power (de) that connects them more closely to the ancestral source. These are the sages that Zhuangzi admires: those whose virtue (de) is beyond the ordinary, and whose signs of virtue indicate that they have gone beyond.

But what goes beyond is also the source of life. To hold fast to that which is beyond both living and dying, is perhaps also to hold fast to something that is beyond human and inhuman. To identify with and nurture this source is to nurture that which is at the root of our humanity. Thus to go to that which is beyond is not necessarily to become inhuman. Indeed, one might argue that it is to create the possibility of deepening one’s most genuine humanity, insofar as this is a deeper nature still.

f. Chapter 6: Da Zong Shi (The Vast Ancestral Teacher)

The first part of this chapter is devoted to a discussion of the zhenren: the “True Man,” the “genuine person,” or “genuine humanity.” It begins by asking about the relation between tian and ren, the natural/heaven and the human, and suggests that the greatest wisdom lies in the ability to understand both. Thus, to be forced to choose between being natural or being human is a mistake. A genuinely flourishing human life cannot be separated from the natural, but nor can it on that account deny its own humanity. Genuine humanity is natural humanity.

There are several sections devoted to explicating this genuine humanity. We find that the genuinely human person, the zhen ren, is in tune with the cycles of nature, and is not upset by the vicissitudes of life. Thezhenren like Laozi’s sage is somehow simultaneously unified with things, and yet not tied down by them. The zhenren is in tune with the cycles of nature, and with the cycles of yin yang, and is not disturbed or harmed by them. In fact, the zhenren is not harmed by them either in what appears to us to be their negative phases, nor are their most extreme phases able to upset the balance of the zhenren. This is sometimes expressed with what I take to be the hyperbole that the sage or zhenren can never be drowned by the ocean, nor burned by fire. However, followers of what has come to be known as “religious” Daoism would, I believe, probably take these statements more literally.

In the second part of the chapter, Zhuangzi hints at the process by which we are to cultivate our genuine and natural humanity. These are meditative practices and psycho-physical disciplines—”yogas” perhaps—by which we learn how to nourish the ancestral root of life that is within us. We learn how to identify with that center which functions as an axis of stability around which the cycles of emotional turbulence flow. By maintaining ourselves as a shifting and responding center of gravity we are able to maintain an equanimity without giving up our feelings altogether. We enjoy riding the dragon without being thrown around by it. Ordinarily, we are buffeted around like flotsam in a storm, and yet, by holding fast to our ancestral nature, and by following the nature of the environment—by “matching nature with nature”—we free ourselves from the mercy of random circumstances.

In this chapter we see a mature development of the ideas of life and death broached in the first three chapters. Zhuangzi continues musing on the significance of our existential predicament as being inextricably tied into interweaving cycles of darkness and light, sadness and joy, living and dying. In chapter two, it was the predicament itself that Zhuangzi described, and he tried to focus on the inseparability and indistinguishability of the two aspects of this single process of transformation. In this chapter, Zhuangzi tries to delve deeper to reach the center of balance, the ‘axis of the way,’ that allows one to undergo these changes with tranquility, and even to accept them with a kind of ‘joy.’ Not an ecstatic affirmation, to be sure, but a tranquil appreciation of the richness, beauty, and “inevitability” of whatever experiences we eventually will undergo. Again, not that we must experience whatever is ‘fated’ for us, or that we ought not to minimize harm and suffering where we can do so, but only that we should acknowledge and accept our situatedness, our thrownness into our situation, as the ‘raw materials’ that we have to deal with.

There are mystical practices hinted at that enable the sage to identify with the datong, the greater flow, not with the particular arisings of these particular emotions, or this particular body, but with what lies within (and below and above) as their ancestral root. These meditative and yogic practices are hinted at in this chapter, and also in chapter 7, but nothing in the text reveals what they are. It is not unreasonable to believe that similar techniques have been handed down by the practitioners of religious Daoism. It is clear, nonetheless, that part of the change is a change in self-understanding, self-identification. We somehow learn to expand, to wander beyond, our boundaries until they include the entire cosmic process. This entire process is seen as like a potter’s wheel, and simultaneously as a whetstone and as a grindstone, on which things are formed, and arise, sharpened, and are ground back down only to be made into new forms. With each ‘birth’ (sheng) some ‘thing’ (wu) new arises, flourishes, develops through its natural (tian) tendencies (xing), and then still following its natural tendencies, responding to those of its natural environment, it winds down: enters (ru) back into the undifferentiated (wu) from which it emerged (chu). The truest friendship arises when members of a community identify with this unknown undifferentiated process in which they are embedded, “forgotten” differences between self and other, and spontaneously follows the natural developments of which they are inseparable “parts.”

g. Chapter 7: Ying Di Wang (Responding to Emperors and Kings)

The last of the Inner Chapters does not introduce anything new, but closes by returning to a recurring theme from chapters 1, 3, 5, and 6: that of withdrawing from society. This ‘withdrawal’ has two functions: the first is to preserve one’s ‘life’; the second is to allow society to function naturally, and thus to bring itself to a harmonious completion. Rather than interfering with social interactions, one should allow them to follow their natural course, which, Zhuangzi believes, will be both imaginative and harmonious.

These themes resonate with those of the Anarchist chapters in the Outer (and Miscellaneous) chapters: 8 to 11a and 28 to 32. These encourage a life closer to nature in which one lets go of deliberate control and instead learns how to sense the tendencies of things, allowing them to manifest and flourish, while also adding one’s weight to redirect their momentum away from harm and danger. Or, if harm and danger are unavoidable, then one learns how to minimize them, and how to accept whatever one does have to suffer with equanimity.

4. Key Interpreters of Zhuangzi

The earliest of the interpreters of Zhuangzi’s philosophy are of course his followers, whose commentaries and interpretations have been preserved in the text itself, in the chapters that Liu Xiaogan ascribes to the “Shu Zhuang Pai,” chapters 17 to 27. Most of these chapters constitute holistic developments of the ideas of the Inner Chapters, but some of them concentrate on particular issues raised in particular chapters. For example, the author of Chapter 17, the Autumn Floods, elaborates on the philosophy of perspective and overcoming boundaries that is discussed in the first chapter, Xiao Yao You. This chapter develops the ideas in several divergent directions: relativism, skepticism, pragmatism, and even a kind of absolutism. Which of these, if any, is the overall philosophical perspective is not easy to discern. The author of chapter 19, Da Sheng, Mastering Life, takes up the theme of the cultivation of the wisdom of embodied skill that is introduced in chapter 3, Yang Sheng Zhu, The Principle of Nurturing Life. The author of chapter 18, Zhi Le, Utmost Happiness, and chapter 22, Zhi Bei You, Knowledge Wanders North, continues the meditations on life and death, and the cultivation of meditative practice, that are explored in chapter 6, Da Zong Shi, The Vast Ancestral Teacher.

The next group of interpreters have also become incorporated into the extant version of the text. They are the school of anarchistically inclined philosophers, that Graham identifies as a “Primitivist” and a school of “Yangists,” chapters 8 to 11, and 28 to 31. These thinkers appear to have been profoundly influenced by the Laozi, and also by the thought of the first and last of the Inner Chapters: “Wandering Beyond,” and “Responding to Emperors and Kings.” There are also possible signs of influence from Yang Zhu, whose concern was to protect and cultivate one’s inner life-source. These chapters combine the anarchistic ideals of a simple life close to nature that can be found in the Laozi with the practices that lead to the cultivation and nurturing of life. The practice of the nurturing of life in chapter 3, that leads to the “lasting out of one’s natural years,” becomes an emphasis on maintaining and protecting xing ming zhi qing “the essentials of nature and life’s command” in these later chapters.

The third main group, whose interpretation has been preserved in the text itself, is the Huang-Lao school, an eclectic school whose aim to is promote an ideal of mystical rulership, influenced by the major philosophical schools of the time, especially those that recommend a cultivation of inner potency. They scoured the earlier philosophers in order to extract what was valuable in their philosophies, the element of the dao that is to be found in each philosophical claim. In particular, they sought to combine the more ‘mystically’ inclined philosophies with the more practical ones to create a more complete dao. The last chapter, Tian Xia, The World, considers several philosophical schools, and comments on what is worthwhile in each of them. Zhuangzi’s philosophy is here characterized as “vast,” “vague,” “outrageous,” “extravagant,” and “reckless”; he is also recognized for his encompassing modes of thought, his lack of partisanship, and his recklessness is acknowledged to be harmless. Nevertheless, it is stated that he did not succeed in getting it all.

Perhaps the most important of the pre-Qin thinkers to comment on Zhuangzi is Xunzi. In his “Dispelling Obsessions” chapter, anticipating the eclecticism of the Huang-Lao commentators of chapter 33, he considers several philosophical schools, mentions the corner of ‘truth’ that each has recognized, and then goes on to criticize them for failing to understand the larger picture. Xunzi mentions Zhuangzi by name, describes him as a philosopher who recognizes the value of nature and of following the tendencies of nature, but who thereby fails to recognize the value of the human ‘ren’. Indeed, Zhuangzi seems to be aware of this kind of objection, and even delights in it. He revels in knowing that he is one who wanders off into the distance, far from human concerns, one who is not bound by the guidelines. Perhaps in doing so he corroborates Xunzi’s fears.

Another text that reveals what might be a development of Zhuangzi’s philosophy is the Liezi. This is a philosophical treatise that clearly stands in the same tradition as the Zhuangzi, dealing with many of the same issues, and on occasion with almost identical stories and discussions. Although the Daoist adept, Liezi, to whom the text is attributed lived before Zhuangzi, the text clearly dates from a later period, perhaps compiled as late as the Eastern Han, though in terms of linguistic style the material appears to date from around the same period as Zhuangzi. The Liezi continues the line of philosophical thinking of the Xiao Yao You, and the Qiu Shui, taking up the themes of transcending boundaries, and even cosmic realms, by spirit journeying. The leaving behind and overturning of human values is a theme that is repeated in this text, though again not without a certain paradoxical tension: after all, the purpose of such journeying and overturning of values is ultimately to enable us in some sense to live ‘better’ lives. While Zhuangzi’s own philosophy exerted a significant influence on the interpretation of Buddhism in China, theLiezi appears to provide a possible converse case of Mahayana Buddhist influence on the development of the ideas of Zhuangzi.

The Jin dynasty scholar, Guo Xiang, is the most influential of the early interpreters. His “relativistic” reading of the text has become the received interpretation, and his own distinctive style of philosophical thinking has in this way become almost inseparable from that of Zhuangzi. The task of interpreting Zhuangzi independently of Guo Xiang’s reading is not easy to accomplish. His contribution and interpretation have already been discussed in the body of the entry (See sections above: The Zhuangzitext, and Chapter 2: Qi Wu Lun (Discussion on Smoothing Things Out) ). The Sui dynasty scholar, Lu Deming, produced an invaluable glossary and philological commentary on the text, enabling later generations to benefit from his vast linguistic expertise. The Ming dynasty Buddhist poet and scholar, Han Shan, wrote a commentary on the Zhuangzi from a Chan Buddhist perspective. In a similar vein, the Qing dynasty scholar, Zhang Taiyan, constructed a masterful interpretation of the Zhuangzi in the light of Chinese Buddhist Idealism, or Weishilun. Guo Qingfan, a late Qing, early twentieth century scholar, collected and synthesized the work of previous generations of commentators. The scholarly work of Takeushi Yoshio in Japan has also been of considerable influence. Qian Mu is a twentieth century scholar who has exerted considerable efforts with regard to historical scholarship. Currently, in Taiwan, Chen Guying is the leading scholar and interpreter of Zhuangzi, and he uses his knowledge of western philosophy, particularly western epistemology, cosmology, and metaphysics, to throw new light on this ancient text.

In the west, probably the most important and influential scholar was A. C. Graham, whose pioneering work on this text, and on the later Mohist Canon, has laid the groundwork and set an extraordinarily high standard for future western philosophical scholarship. Graham, following the reading of Guo Xiang, develops a relativistic reading based on a theory of the conventional nature of language. Chad Hansen is a current interpreter who sees the Daoists as largely theorists of language, and he interprets Zhuangzi’s own contribution as a form of “linguistic skepticism.” Recently, there has been a growth of interest in the aspects of Zhuangzi’s philosophy that resonate with the Hellenistic school of Skepticism. This was proposed by Paul Kjellberg, and has been pursued by other scholars such as Lisa Raphals.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger, ed. Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Chuang Tzu. Basic Writings. Translated by Burton Watson. New York: Columbia University Press, 1964.
  • Chuang Tzu. The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu. Translated by Burton Watson. New York: Columbia University Press, 1968.
  • Chuang Tzu. Chuang-Tzu The Inner Chapters: A Classic of Tao. Translated by A. C. Graham. London: Mandala, 1991.
  • Chuang Tzu. Chuang tzu. Translated by James Legge, Sacred Books of the East, volumes 39, 40. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1891.
  • Cook, Scott. Hiding the World Within the World: Ten Uneven Discourses on Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Coutinho, Steve. Zhuangzi and Early Chinese Philosophy: Vagueness, Transformation, and Paradox. London: Ashgate Press, forthcoming, December, 2004.
  • Fung, Yu-Lan. Chuang-Tzu: A New Selected Translation with an Exposition of the Philosophy of Kuo Hsiang. 2nd ed. New York: Paragon Book Reprint Corporation, 1964.
  • Graham, Angus Charles. Later Mohist Logic, Ethics and Science. London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1978.
  • Graham, Angus Charles. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
  • Graham, A. C. “Chuang-tzu’s Essay on Seeing things as Equal.” History of Religions 9 (1969/1970), pp. 137—159. Reproduced in Roth, 2003.
  • Graham, A. C. “Chuang-tzu: Textual Notes to a Partial Translation.” London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1982. Reproduced in Roth, 2003.
  • Hansen, Chad. A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought: A Philosophical Interpretation. New York, Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Ivanhoe, P. J. & Paul Kjellberg, ed. Essays on Skepticism, Relativism, and Ethics in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Kaltenmark, Max. Lao Tzu and Taoism. Translated by Roger Greaves. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1969.
  • Kjellberg, Paul. Zhuangzi and Skepticism. PhD dissertation, Department of Philosophy, Stanford University, 1993.
  • Lawton, Thomas, ed. New Perspectives on Chu Culture During the Eastern Zhou Period. Washington, D.C.: Smithsonian Institution, 1991.
  • Li, Xueqin. Eastern Zhou and Qin Civilizations. Translated by Kwang-chih Chang. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1985.
  • Liu, Xiaogan. Classifying the Zhuangzi Chapters. Translated by Donald Munro. Michigan Monographs in Chinese Studies, no. 65. Ann Arbor, Michigan: The University of Michigan, 1994.
  • Mair, Victor H., ed. Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1983.
  • Mair, Victor. ed. Chuang-tzu: Composition and Interpretation. Symposium issues, Journal of Chinese Religions 11, 1983.
  • Mair, Victor. Wandering on the Way: Early Taoist Tales and Parables of Chuang Tzu. New York: Bantam Books, 1994.
  • Maspero, Henri. Le Taoïsme. Vol. II, Mélanges Posthumes sur les Religions et l’histoire de la Chine. Paris: Civilisations du Sud S.A.E.P., 1950.
  • Roth, Harold. “Who Compiled the Chuang-tzu?” in Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts. edited by Henry Rosemont. La Salle: Open Court, 1991.
  • Roth, Harold. A Companion to A. C. Graham’s Chuang Tzu: The Inner Chapters. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 2003.
  • Wu, Kuang-ming. The Butterfly as Companion: Meditations on the First Three Chapters of the Chuang Tzu. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.

Author Information

Steve Coutinho
Email: coutinho@muhlenberg.edu
Muhlenberg College
U. S. A.

Last updated: September 3, 2004 | Originally published: