Slavoj Žižek (1949 —)
Slavoj Žižek is a Slovenian-born political philosopher and cultural critic. He was described by British literary theorist, Terry Eagleton, as the “most formidably brilliant” recent theorist to have emerged from Continental Europe.
Žižek’s work is infamously idiosyncratic. It features striking dialectical reversals of received common sense; a ubiquitous sense of humor; a patented disrespect towards the modern distinction between high and low culture; and the examination of examples taken from the most diverse cultural and political fields. Yet Žižek’s work, as he warns us, has a very serious philosophical content and intention. He challenges many of the founding assumptions of today’s left-liberal academy, including the elevation of difference or otherness to ends in themselves, the reading of the Western Enlightenment as implicitly totalitarian, and the pervasive skepticism towards any context-transcendent notions of truth or the good.
One feature of Žižek’s work is its singular philosophical and political reconsideration of German idealism (Kant, Schelling and Hegel). Žižek has also reinvigorated the challenging psychoanalytic theory of Jacques Lacan, controversially reading him as a thinker who carries forward founding modernist commitments to the Cartesian subject and the liberating potential of self-reflective agency, if not self-transparency. Žižek’s works since 1997 have become more and more explicitly political, contesting the widespread consensus that we live in a post-ideological or post-political world, and defending the possibility of lasting changes to the new world order of globalization, the end of history, or the war on terror.
This article explains Žižek’s philosophy as a systematic, if unusually presented, whole; and it clarifies the technical language Žižek uses, which he takes from Lacanian psychoanalysis, Marxism, and German idealism. In line with how Žižek presents his own work, this article starts by examining Žižek’s descriptive political philosophy. It then examines the Lacanian-Hegelian ontology that underlies Žižek’s political philosophy. The final part addresses Žižek’s practical philosophy, and the ethical philosophy he draws from this ontology.
Table of Contents
- Žižek’s Political Philosophy
- Criticism of Ideology as “False Consciousness”
- Ideological Cynicism and Belief
- Jouissance as Political Factor
- The Reflective Logic of Ideological Judgments (or How the King is King)
- Sublime Objects of Ideology
- Žižek’s Fundamental Ontology
- The Fundamental Fantasy & the Split Law
- Excursus: Žižek’s Typology of Ideological Regimes
- Kettle Logic, or Desire and Theodicy
- Fantasy as the Fantasy of Origins
- Exemplification: the Fall and Radical Evil (Žižek’s Critique of Kant)
- From Ontology to Ethics—Žižek’s Reclaiming of the Subject
- Žižek’s Subject, Fantasy, and the Objet Petit a
- The Objet Petit a & the Virtuality of Reality
- Forced Choice & Ideological Tautologies
- The Substance is Subject, the Other Does Not Exist
- The Ethical Act Traversing the Fantasy
- References and Further Reading
- Primary Literature (Books by Žižek)
- Secondary Literature (Texts on Žižek)
Slavoj Žižek was born in 1949 in Ljubljana, Slovenia. He grew up in the comparative cultural freedom of the former Yugoslavia’s self-managing socialism. Here—significantly for his work— Žižek was exposed to the films, popular culture and theory of the noncommunist West. Žižek completed his PhD at Ljubljana in 1981 on German Idealism, and between 1981 and 1985 studied in Paris under Jacques AlainMiller, Lacan’s son-in-law. In this period, Žižek wrote a second dissertation, a Lacanian reading of Hegel, Marx and Kripke. In the late 1980s, Žižek returned to Slovenia where he wrote newspaper columns for the Slovenian weekly “Mladina,” and cofounded the Slovenian Liberal Democratic Party. In 1990, he ran for a seat on the four-member collective Slovenian presidency, narrowly missing office. Žižek’s first published book in English, The Sublime Object of Ideology, appeared in 1989. Since then, Žižek has published over a dozen books, edited several collections, published numerous philosophical and political articles, and maintained a tireless speaking schedule. His earlier works are of the type “Introductions to Lacan through popular culture / Hitchcock / Hollywood …” Since at least 1997, however, Žižek’s work has taken on an increasingly engaged political tenor, culminating in books on September 11 and the Iraq war. As well as being visiting professor at the Department of Psychoanalysis, Universite ParisVIII in 1982-3 and 1985-6, Žižek has lectured at the Cardozo Law School, Columbia, Princeton, the New School for Social Research, the University of Michigan, Ann Arbor, and Georgetown. He is currently a returning faculty member of the European Graduate School, and founder and president of the Society for Theoretical Psychoanalysis, Ljubljana.
In a way that is oddly reminiscent of Nietzsche, Žižek generally presents his work in a polemical fashion, knowingly striking out against the grain of accepted opinion. One untimely feature of Žižek’s work is his continuing defense and use of the unfashionable term “ideology.” According to the classical Marxist definition, ideologies are discourses that promote false ideas (or “false consciousness”) in subjects about the political regimes they live in. Nevertheless, because these ideas are believed by the subjects to be true, they assist in the reproduction of the existing status quo, in an exact instance of what Umberto Eco dubs “the force of the fake.” To critique ideology, according to this position, it is sufficient to unearth the truth(s) the ideologies conceal from the subject’s knowledge. Then, so the theory runs, subjects will become aware of the political shortcomings of their current regimes, and be able and moved to better them. As Žižek takes up in his earlier works, this classical Marxian notion of ideology has come under theoretical attack in a number of ways. First, to criticize a discourse as ideological implies access to a Truth about political things the Truth that the ideologies, as false, would conceal. But it has been widely disputed in the humanities that there could ever be any One such theoretically accessible Truth. Secondly, the notion of ideology is held to be irrelevant to describe contemporary sociopolitical life, because of the increased importance of what Jurgen Habermas calls “mediasteered subsystems” (the market, public and private bureaucracies), and also because of the widespread cynicism of today’s subjects towards political authorities. For ideologies to have political importance, critics comment, subjects would have to have a level of faith in public institutions, ideals and politicians which today’s liberal-cosmopolitan subjects lack. The widespread notoriety of left-leaning authors like Michael Moore of Noam Chomsky, as one example, bears witness to how subjects today can know very well what Moore claims is the “awful truth,” and yet act as if they did not know.
Žižek agrees with critics about this “false consciousness” model of ideology. Yet he insists that we are not living in a post-ideological world, as figures as different as Tony Blair, Daniel Bell or Richard Rorty have claimed. Žižek proposes instead that in order to understand today’s politics we need a different notion of ideology. In a typically bold reversal, Žižek’s position is that today’s widespread consensus that our world is post-ideological gives voice to what he calls the “archideological” fantasy. Since “ideology” since Marx has carried a pejorative sense, no one who taken in by such an ideology has ever believed that they were so duped, Žižek comments. If the term “ideology” has any meaning at all, ideological positions are always what people impute to Others (for today’s left, for example, the political right are the dupes of one or another noble lie about natural community; for the right, the left are the dupes of well-meaning but utopian egalitarianism bound to lead to economic and moral collapse, and so forth). For subjects to believe in an ideology, it must have been presented to them, and been accepted, as non-ideological indeed, as True and Right, and what anyone sensible would believe. As we shall see in 2e, Žižek is alert to the realist insight that there is no more effective political gesture than to declare some contestable matter above political contestation. Just as the third way is said to be post-ideological or national security is claimed to be extra-political, so Žižek argues that ideologies are always presented by their proponents as being discourses about Things too sacred to profane by politics. Hence, Žižek’s bold opening in The Sublime Object of Ideology is to claim that today ideology has not so much disappeared from the political landscape as come into its own. It is exactly because of this success, Žižek argues, that ideology has also been able to be dismissed in accepted political and theoretical opinion.
Today’s typical first world subjects, according to Žižek, are the dupes of what he calls “ideological cynicism.” Drawing on the German political theorist Sloterdijk, Žižek contends that the formula describing the operation of ideology today is not “they do not know it, but they are doing it”, as it was for Marx. It is “they know it, but they are doing it anyway.” If this looks like nonsense from the classical Marxist perspective, Žižek’s position is that nevertheless this cynicism indicates the deeper efficacy of political ideology per se. Ideologies, as political discourses, are there to secure the voluntary consent—or what La Boétie called servitude volontaire of people about contestable political policies or arrangements. Yet, Žižek argues, subjects will only voluntarily agree to follow one or other such arrangement if they believe that, in doing so, they are expressing their free subjectivity, and might have done otherwise.
However false such a sense of freedom is, Žižek insists that it is nevertheless a political instance of what Hegel called an essential appearance. Althusser’s understanding of ideological identification suggests that an individual is wholly “interpellated” into a place within a political system by the system’s dominant ideology and ideological state apparatuses. Contesting this notion by drawing on Lacanian psychoanalysis, however, Žižek argues that it is a mistake to think that, for a political position to win peoples’ support, it needs to effectively brainwash them into thoughtless automatons. Rather, Žižek maintains that any successful political ideology always allows subjects to have and to cherish a conscious distance towards its explicit ideals and prescriptions—or what he calls, in a further technical term, “ideological disidentification.”
Again bringing the psychoanalytic theory of Lacan to bear in political theory, Žižek argues that the attitude of subjects towards authority revealed by today’s ideological cynicism resembles the fetishist’s attitude towards his fetish. The fetishist’s attitude towards his fetish has the peculiar form of a disavowal: “I know well that (for example) the shoe is only a shoe, but nevertheless, I still need my partner to wear the shoe in order to enjoy.” According to Žižek, the attitude of political subjects towards political authority evinces the same logical form: “I know well that (for example) Bob Hawke / Bill Clinton / the Party / the market does not always act justly, but I still act as though I did not know that this is the case.” In Althusser’s famous “Ideology and Ideological State Apparatuses,” Althusser staged a kind of primal scene of ideology, the moment when a policeman (as bearer of authority) says “hey you!” to an individual, and the individual recognizes himself as the addressee of this call. In the “180 degree turn” of the individual towards this Other who has addressed him, the individual becomes a political subject, Althusser says. Žižek’s central technical notion of the “big Other” [grand Autre] closely resembles—to the extent that it is not modelled on Althusser’s notion of the Subject (capital “S”) in the name of which public authorities (like the police) can legitimately call subjects to account within a regime—for example, “God” in a theocracy, “the Party” under Stalinism, or “the People” in today’s China. As the central chapter of The Sublime Object of Ideology specifies, ideologies for Žižek work to identify individuals with such important or rallying political terms as these, which Žižek calls “master signifiers.” The strange but decisive thing about these pivotal political words, according to Žižek, is that no one knows exactly what they mean or refer to, or has ever seen with their own eyes the sacred objects which they seem to name (for example: God, the Nation, or the People). This is one reason why Žižek, in the technical language he inherits (via Lacan) from structuralism, says that the most important words in any political doctrine are “signifiers without a signified” (that is, words that do not refer to any clear and distinct concept or demonstrable object).
This claim of Žižek’s is connected to two other central ideas in his work:
- First: Žižek adapts the psychoanalytic notion that individuals are always “split” subjects, divided between the levels of their conscious awareness and the unconscious. Žižek contends throughout his work that subjects are always divided between what they consciously know and can say about political things, and a set of more or less unconscious beliefs they hold concerning individuals in authority, and the regime in which they live (see 3a). Even if people cannot say clearly and distinctly why they support some political leader or policy, for Žižek no less than for Edmund Burke, this fact is not politically decisive, as we will see in 2e below.
- Second: Žižek makes a crucial distinction between knowledge and belief. Exactly where and because subjects do not know, for example, what “the essence” of “their people” is, the scope and nature of their beliefs on such matters is politically decisive, according to Žižek (again, see 2e below).
Žižek’s understanding of political belief is modelled on Lacan’s understanding of transference in psychoanalysis. The belief or “supposition” of the analysand in psychoanalysis is that the Other (his analyst) knows the meaning of his symptoms. This is obviously a false belief, at the start of the analytic process. But it is only through holding this false belief about the analyst that the work of analysis can proceed, and the transferential belief can become true (when the analyst does become able to interpret the symptoms). Žižek argues that this strange intersubjective or dialectical logic of belief in clinical psychoanalysis also what characterizes peoples’ political beliefs. Belief is always “belief through the Other,” Žižek argues. If subjects do not know the exact meaning of those “master signifiers” with which they political identify, this is because their political belief is mediated through their identifications with others. Although they each themselves “do not know what they do” (which is the title one of Žižek’s books [Žižek, 2002]), the deepest level of their belief is maintained through the belief that nevertheless there are Others who do know. A number of features of political life are cast into new relief given this psychoanalytic understanding, Žižek claims:
- First, Žižek contends that the key political function of holders of public office is to occupy the place of what he calls, after Lacan, “the Other supposed to know.” Žižek cites the example of priests reciting mass in Latin before an uncomprehending laity, who believe that the priests know the meaning of the words, and for whom this is sufficient to keep the faith. Far from presenting an exception to the way political authority works, for Žižek this scenario reveals the universal rule of how political consensus is formed.
- Second, and in connection with this, Žižek contends that political power is primarily “symbolic” in its nature. What he means by this further technical term is that the roles, masks, or mandates that public authorities bear is more important politically than the true “reality” of the individuals in question (whether they are unintelligent, unfaithful to their wives, good family women, and soforth). According to Žižek, for example, fashionable liberal criticisms of George W. Bush the man are irrelevant to understanding or evaluating his political power. It is the office or place an individual occupies in their political system (or “big Other”) that ensures the political force of their words, and the belief of subjects in their authority. This is why Žižek maintains that the resort of a political leader or regime to “the real of violence” (such as war or police action) amounts to a confession of its weakness as a political regime. Žižek sometimes puts this thought by saying that people believe through the big Other, or that the big Other believes for them, despite what they might inwardly think or cynically say.
A further key point that Žižek takes from Louis Althusser’s later work on ideology is Althusser’s emphasis on the “materiality” of ideology, its embodiment in institutions and peoples’ everyday practices and lives. Žižek’s realist position is that all the ideas in the world can have no lasting political effect unless they come to inform institutions and subjects’ day-to-day lives. In The Sublime Object of Ideology, Žižek cites Blaise Pascal’s advice that doubting subjects should get down on their knees and pray, and then they will believe. Pascal’s position is not any kind of simple proto-behaviorism, according to Žižek. The deeper message of Pascal’s directive, he asserts, is to suggest that once subjects have come to believe through praying, they will also retrospectively see that they got down on their knees because they always believed, without knowing it. In this way, in fact, Žižek can be read as a consistent critic not only of the importance of knowledge in the formation of political consensus, but also of the importance of “inwardness” in politics per se in the tradition of the younger Carl Schmitt.
Prior political philosophy has placed too little emphasis, Žižek asserts, on communities’ cultural practices that involve what he calls “inherent transgression.” These are practices sanctioned by a culture that nevertheless allow subjects some experience of what is usually exceptional to or prohibited in their everyday lives as civilized political subjects—things like sex, death, defecation, or violence. Such experiences involve what Žižek calls jouissance, another technical term he takes from Lacanian psychoanalysis. Jouissance is usually translated from the French as “enjoyment.” As opposed to what we talk of in English as “pleasure”, though, jouissance is an always sexualized, always transgressive enjoyment, at the limits of what subjects can experience or talk about in public. Žižek argues that subjects’ experiences of the events and practices wherein their political culture organizes its specific relations to jouissance (in first world nations, for example, specific sports, types of alcohol or drugs, music, festivals, films) are as close as they will get to knowing the deeper Truth intimated for them by their regime’s master signifiers: “nation”, “God”, “our way of life,” and so forth (see 2b above). Žižek, like Burke, argues that it is such ostensibly nonpolitical and culturally specific practices as these that irreplaceably single out any political community from its others and enemies. Or, as one of Žižek’s chapter titles in Tarrying With the Negative puts it, where and although subjects do not know their Nation, they “enjoy (jouis) their nation as themselves.”
According to Žižek, like and after Althusser, ideologies are thus political discourses whose primary function is not to make correct theoretical statements about political reality (as Marx’s “false consciousness” model implies), but to orient subjects’ lived relations to and within this reality. If a political ideology’s descriptive propositions turn out to be true (for example: “capitalism exploits the workers,” “Saddam was a dictator,” “the Spanish are the national enemy,” and so forth), this does not in any way reduce their ideological character, in Žižek’s estimation. This is because this character concerns the political issue of how subjects’ belief in these propositions, instead of those of opponents, positions subjects on the leading political issues of the day. For Žižek, political speech is primarily about securing a lived sense of unity or community between subjects, something like what Kant called sensus communis or Rousseau the general will. If political propositions seemingly do describe things in the world, Žižek’s position is that we nevertheless need always to understand them as Marx understood the exchange value of commodities—as “a relation between people being concealed behind a relation between things.” Or again: just as Kant thought that the proposition “this is beautiful” really expresses a subject’s reflective sense of commonality with all other subjects capable of being similarly affected by the object, so Žižek argues that propositions like “Go Spain!” or “the King will never stop working to secure our future” are what Kant called reflective judgments, which tell us as much or more about the subject’s lived relation to political reality as about this reality itself.
If ideological statements are thus performative utterances that produce political effects by their being stated, Žižek in fact holds that they are a strange species of performative utterance overlooked by speech act theory. Just because, when subjects say “the Queen is the Queen!” they are at one level reaffirming their allegiance to a political regime, Žižek at the same time holds that this does not mean that this regime could survive without appearing to rest on such deeper Truths about the way the world is. As we saw in 2b, Žižek maintains that political ideologies always present themselves as naming such deeper, extra-political Truths. Ideological judgments, according to Žižek, are thus performative utterances which, in order to perform their salutary political work, must yet appear to be objective descriptions of the way the world is (exactly as when a chairman says “this meeting is closed!” only thereby bringing this state of affairs into effect). In Sublime Object of Ideology, Žižek cites Marx’s analysis of being a King in Das Capital to illustrate his meaning. A King is only King because his subjects loyally think and act like he is King (think of the tragedy of Lear). Yet, at the same time, the people will only believe he is King if they believe that this is a deeper Truth about which they can do nothing.
In line with Žižek’s ideas of “ideological disidentification” and “jouissance as a political factor” (see 2b and 2c above) and in a clear comparison with Derrida’s deconstruction, arguably the unifying thought in Žižek’s political philosophy is that regimes can only secure a sense of collective identity if their governing ideologies afford subjects an understanding of how their regime relates to what exceeds, supplements or challenges its identity. This is why Kant’s analytic of the sublime in The Critique of Judgment, as an analysis of an experience in which the subject’s identity is challenged, is of the highest theoretical interest for Žižek. Kant’s analytic of the sublime isolates two moments to its experience, as Žižek observes. In the first moment, the size or force of an object painfully impresses upon the subject the limitation of its perceptual capabilities. In a second moment, however, a “representation” arises where “we would least expect it,” which takes as its object the subject’s own failure to perceptually take the object in. This representation resignifies the subject’s perceptual failure as indirect testimony about the inadequacy of human perception as such to attain to what Kant calls Ideas of Reason (in Kant’s system, God, the Universe as a Whole, Freedom, the Good).
According to Žižek, all successful political ideologies necessarily refer to and turn around sublime objects posited by political ideologies. These sublime objects are what political subjects take it that their regime’s ideologies’ central words mean or name extraordinary Things like God, the Fuhrer, the King, in whose name they will (if necessary) transgress ordinary moral laws and lay down their lives. When a subject believes in a political ideology, as we saw in 2b above, Žižek argues that this does not mean that they know the Truth about the objects which its key terms seemingly name—indeed, Žižek will finally contest that such a Truth exists (see 3c, d). Nevertheless, by drawing on a parallel with Kant on the sublime, Žižek makes a further and more radical point. Just as in the experience of the sublime, Kant’s subject resignifies its failure to grasp the sublime object as indirect testimony to a wholly “supersensible” faculty within herself (Reason), so Žižek argues that the inability of subjects to explain the nature of what they believe in politically does not indicate any disloyalty or abnormality. What political ideologies do, precisely, is provide subjects with a way of seeing the world according to which such an inability can appear as testimony to how Transcendent or Great their Nation, God, Freedom, and so forth is—surely far above the ordinary or profane things of the world. In Žižek’s Lacanian terms, these things are Real (capital “R”) Things (capital “T”), precisely insofar as they in this way stand out from the reality of ordinary things and events.
In the struggle of competing political ideologies, Žižek hence agrees with Ernesto Laclau and Chantal Mouffe, the aim of each is to elevate their particular political perspective (about what is just, best, and so forth) to the point where it can lay claim to name, give voice to or to represent the political whole (for example: the nation). In order to achieve this political feat, Žižek argues, each group must succeed in identifying its perspective with the extra-political, sublime objects accepted within the culture as giving body to this whole (for example: “the national interest,” “the dictatorship of the proletariat”). Or else, it must supplant the previous ideologies’ sublime objects with new such objects. In the absolute monarchies, as Ernst Kantorowicz argued, the King’s so called “second” or “symbolic” body exemplified paradigmatically such sublime political objects as the unquestionable font of political authority (the particular individual who was King was contestable, but not the sovereign’s role itself). Žižek’s critique of Stalinism, in a comparable way, turns upon the thought that “the Party” had this sublime political status in Stalinist ideology. Class struggle in this society did not end, Žižek contends, despite Stalinist propaganda. It was only displaced from a struggle between two classes (for example, bourgeois versus proletarian) to one between “the Party” as representative of the people or the whole and all who disagreed with it, ideologically positioned as “traitors” or “enemies of the people.”
For Žižek, as we have seen, no political regime can sustain the political consensus upon which it depends, unless its predominant ideology affords subjects a sense both of individual distance or freedom with regard to its explicit prescriptions (2b), and that the regime is grounded in some larger or “sublime” Truth (2e). Žižek’s political philosophy identifies interconnected instances of these dialectical ideas: his notion of “ideological disidentification” (2b); his contention that ideologies must accommodate subjects’ transgressive experiences of jouissance (2c); and his conception of exceptional or sublime objects of ideology (2e). Arguably the central notion in Žižek’s political philosophy intersects with Žižek’s notion of “ideological fantasy”. “Ideological fantasy” is Žižek’s technical name for the deepest framework of belief that structures how political subjects, and/or a political community, comes to terms with what exceeds its norms and boundaries, in the various registers we examined above.
Like many of Žižek’s key notions, Žižek’s notion of the ideological fantasy is a political adaptation of an idea from Lacanian psychoanalysis: specifically, Lacan’s structuralist rereading of Freud’s psychoanalytic understanding of unconscious fantasy. As for Lacan, so for Žižek, the civilizing of subjects necessitates their founding sacrifice (or “castration”) of jouissance, enacted in the name of sociopolitical Law. Subjects, to the extent that they are civilized, are “cut” from the primal object of their desire. Instead, they are forced by social Law to pursue this special, lost Thing in Žižek’s technical term, the “objet petit a” (see 4a, 4b) by observing their societies’ linguistically mediated conventions, deferring satisfaction, and accepting sexual and generational difference. Subjects’ “fundamental fantasies,” according to Lacan, are unconscious structures which allow them to accept the traumatic loss involved in this founding sacrifice. They turn around a narrative about the lost object, and how it was lost (see 3d). In particular, the fundamental fantasy of a subject resignifies the founding repression of jouissance by Law—which, according to Lacan, is necessary if the individual is to become a speaking subject—as if it were a merely contingent, avoidable occurrence. In the fantasy, that is, what for Žižek is a constitutive event for the subject, is renarrated as the historical action of some exceptional individual (in Enjoy Your Symptom! the pre-Oedipal “anal father”). Equally, the jouissance the subject considers itself to have lost is posited by the fantasy as having been taken from it by this persecutory “Other supposed to enjoy” (see 3b).
In the notion of ideological fantasy, Žižek takes this psychoanalytic framework and applies it to the understanding of the constitution of political groups. If after Plato, political theory concerns the Laws of a regime, the Laws for Žižek are always split or double in kind. Each political regime has a body of more or less explicit, usually written Laws which demand that subjects forego jouissance in the name of the greater good, and according to the letter of its proscriptions (for example, the US or French constitutions). Žižek identifies this level of the Law with the Freudian ego ideal. But Žižek argues that, in order to be effective, a regime’s explicit Laws must also harbor and conceal a darker underside, a set of more or less unspoken rules which, far from simply repressing jouissance, implicate subjects in a guilty enjoyment in repression itself, which Žižek likens to the “pleasure-in-pain” associated with the experience of Kant’s sublime (see 2d). The Freudian superego, for Žižek, names the psychical agency of the Law, as it is misrepresented and sustained by subjects’ fantasmatic imaginings of a persecutory Other supposed to enjoy (like the archetypal villain in noir films). This darker underside of the Law, Žižek agrees with Lacan, is at its base a constant imperative to subjects to jouis!, by engaging in the “inherent transgressions” of their sociopolitical community (see 2b).
Žižek’s notion of the split in the Law in this way intersects directly with his notion of ideological disidentification examined in 2b. While political subjects maintain a conscious sense of freedom from the explicit norms of their culture, Žižek contends, this disidentification is grounded in their unconscious attachment to the Law as superego, itself an agency of enjoyment. If Althusser famously denied the importance of what people “have on their consciences” in the explanation of how political ideologies work, then for Žižek the role of guilt—as the way in which the subject enjoys his subjection to the laws—is vital to understanding subjects’ political commitments. Individuals will only turn around when the Law hails them, Žižek argues, insofar as they are finally subjects also of the unconscious belief that the “big Other” has access to the jouissance they have lost as subjects of the Law, and which they can accordingly reattain through their political allegiance (see 2b). It is this belief, what could be termed this “political economy of jouissance,” that the fundamental fantasies underlying political regimes’ worldviews are there to structure in subjects.
With these terms of Žižek’s Lacanian ontology in place, it becomes possible to lay out Žižek’s theoretical understanding of the differences between different types of ideological-political regimes. Žižek’s works maintain a lasting distinction between modern and premodern political regimes, which he contends are grounded in fundamentally different ways of organizing subjects’ relations to Law and jouissance (3a). In Žižek’s Lacanian terms, premodern ideological regimes exemplified what Lacan calls in Seminar XVII the discourse of the master. In these authoritarian regimes, the word and will of the King or master (in Žižek’s mathemes, S1) was sovereign—the source of political authority, with no questions asked. Her/His subjects, in turn, are supposed to know (S2) the edicts of the sovereign and the Law (as the classical legal notion has it, “ignorance is no excuse”). In this arrangement, while jouissance and fantasy are political factors, as Žižek argues, regimes’ quasi-transgressive practices remain exceptional to the political arena, glimpsed only in such carnivalesque events as festivals or the types of public punishment Michel Foucault (for example) describes in the introduction to Discipline and Punish.
Žižek agrees with both Foucault and Marx that modern political regimes exert a form of power that is both less visible and more far-reaching than that of the regimes they replaced. Modern regimes, both liberal capitalist and totalitarian, for Žižek, are no longer predominantly characterized by the Lacanian discourse of the master. Given that the Oedipal complex is associated by him with this older type of political authority, Žižek agrees with the Frankfurt School theorists that, contra Deleuze and Guattari, today’s subjectivity as such is already post- or anti-Oedipal. Indeed, in Plague of Fantasies and The Ticklish Subject, Žižek contends that the characteristic discontents of today’s political world—from religious fundamentalism to the resurgence of racism in the first world—are not archaic remnants of, or protests against traditional authoritarian structures, but the pathological effects of new forms of social organization. For Žižek, the defining agency in modern political regimes is knowledge (or, in his Lacanian mathemes, S2). The enlightenment represented the unprecedented political venture to replace belief in authority as the basis of polity with human reason and knowledge. As Schmitt also complained, the legitimacy of modern authorities is grounded not in the self-grounding decision of the sovereign. It is grounded in the ability of authorities to muster coherent chains of reasons to subjects about why they are fit to govern. Modern regimes hence always claim to speak not out of ignorance of what subjects deeply enjoy (“I don’t care what you want; just do what I say!”) but in the very name of subjects’ freedom and enjoyment.
Whether fascist or communist, Žižek argues in his early books, totalitarian (as opposed to authoritarian) regimes justified their rule by final reference to quasi-scientific metanarratives. These metanarratives—a narrative concerning racial struggle in Nazism, or the Laws of History in Stalinism—each claimed to know the deeper Truth about what subjects want, and accordingly could both justify the most striking transgressions of ordinary morality, and justify these transgressions by reference to subjects’ jouissance. The most disturbing or perverse features of these regimes can only be explained by reference to the key place of knowledge in these regimes. Žižek describes, for instance, the truly Catch 22esque logic of the Soviet show trials, wherein it was not enough for subjects to be condemned by the authorities as enemies, but they were made to avow their “objective” error in opposing the party as agent of the laws of history.
Žižek’s statements on today’s liberal capitalism are complex, if not in mutual tension. At times, Žižek tries to formalize the economic generation of surplus value as a meaningfully “hysterical” social arrangement. Yet Žižek predominantly argues, that the market driven consumerism of later capitalist subjects is characterized by a marketing discourse which—like totalitarian ideologies—does not appeal to subjects in the name of any collective cause justifying individuals’ sacrifice of jouissance. Instead, as social conservatives criticize, it musters the quasi-scientific discourses of marketing and public relations, or (increasingly) Eastern religion, in order to recommend products to subjects as necessary means in the liberal pursuit of happiness and self-fulfillment. In line with this change, Žižek contends in The Ticklish Subject that the paradigmatic type of leader today is not some inaccessible boss but the uncannily familiar figure of Bill Gates—more like a little brother than the traditional father or master. Again: for Žižek it is deeply telling that at the same time as the nuclear family is being eroded in the first world, other institutions, from the so-called “nanny” welfare state to private corporations, are increasingly becoming “familiarized” (with self-help sessions for employees, company days, casual days, and so forth).
We saw how Žižek claims that the truth of political ideologies concerns what they do, not what they say (2d). At the level of what political ideologies say, Žižek maintains, a Lacanian critical theory maintains that ideologies must be finally inconsistent. Freud famously talked of the example of a man who returns a borrowed kettle back to its owner broken. The man adduces mutually inconsistent excuses which are united only in terms of his ignoble desire to evade responsibility for breaking the kettle: he never borrowed the kettle, the kettle was already broken when he borrowed it, and when he gave the kettle back it was not really broken anyway. As Žižek reads political ideologies, they function in the same way in the political field—this is the sense of the subtitle of his 2004 Iraq: The Borrowed Kettle. As we saw in 2d, Žižek maintains that the end of political ideologies is to secure and defend the idea of the polity as a wholly unified community. When political strife, uncertainty or division occur, political ideologies and the fundamental fantasies upon which they lean (3a) operate to resignify this political discontent so that the political ideal of community can be sustained, and to deny the possibility that this discontent might signal a fundamental injustice or flaw within the regime. In what amounts to a kind of political theodicy, Žižek’s work points to a number of logically inconsistent ideological responses to political discontents, which are united only by the desire that informs them, like Freud’s “kettle logic”:
- Saying that these divisions are politically unimportant, transient or merely apparent.
Or, if this explanation fails:
- Saying that the political divisions are in any case contingent to the ordinary run of events, so that if their cause is removed or destroyed, things will return to normal.
Or, more perilously:
- Saying that the divisions or problems are deserved by the people for the sake of the greater good (in Australia in the 90s, for example, we experienced “the recession we had to have”), or as punishment for their betrayal of the national Thing.
Žižek’s view of the political functioning of sublime objects of ideology can be charted exactly in terms of this political theodicy. (see 2e) We saw in 3a, how Žižek argues that subjects’ fantasy is what allows them to come to terms with the loss of jouissance fundamental to being social or political animals. Žižek centrally maintains that such narrative attempts at political self-understanding—whether of individuals or political regimes—are ultimately unable to achieve these ends, except at the price of telling inconsistencies.
As Žižek highlights in his analyses of the political discontents in former Yugoslavia following the fall of communism, each national or political community tends to claim that its sublime Thing is inalienable, and hence utterly incapable of being understood or destroyed by enemies. Nevertheless, the invariable correlative of this emphasis on the inalienable nature of one’s Thing, Žižek argues in Tarrying with the Negative (1993), is the notion that It is simultaneously deeply fragile if not under active threat. For Žižek, this mutual inconsistency is only theoretically resolvable if, despite first appearances, we posit a materialist teaching that says that the “substance” seemingly named by political regimes’ key rallying terms (see 2e) is only sustained in their lived communal practices (as we say when someone does not get a joke, “you had to be there”). Yet political ideologies, as such, cannot avow this possibility (see 2d). Instead, ideological fantasies posit various exemplars of a persecutory enemy or, as Žižek says, “the Other of the Other” to whom the explanation of political disunity or discontent can be traced. If only this other or enemy could be removed, the political fantasy contends, the regime would be fully equitable and just. Historical examples of such figures of the enemy include “the Jew” in Nazi ideology, or the “petty bourgeois” in Stalinism.
Again: a type of “kettle logic” applies to the way these enemies are represented in political ideologies, according to Žižek. “The Jew” in Nazi ideology, for example, was an inconsistent condensation of features of both the ruling capitalist class (money grabbing, exploitation of the poor) and of the proletariat (dirtiness, sexual promiscuity, communism). The only consistency this figure has, that is, is precisely as a condensation of everything that Nazi ideology’s Aryan Volksgemeinschaft (roughly, “national community”) was constructed in response and political opposition to.
In a way that has drawn some critics (Bellamy, Sharpe) to question how finally political Žižek’s political philosophy is, Žižek’s critique of ideology ultimately turns on a set of fundamental ontological propositions about the necessary limitations of any linguistic or symbolic system. These propositions concern the widely known paradoxes that bedevil any attempt by a semantic system to explain its own limits, and/or how it came into being. If what preceded the system was radically different from what subsequently emerged, how could the system have emerged from it, and how can the system come to terms with it at all? If we name the limits of what the system can understand, do not we, in that very gesture, presuppose some knowledge of what is beyond these limits, if only enough to say what the system is not? The only manner in which we can explain the origin of language is within language, Žižek notes in For They Know Not What They Do. Yet we hence presuppose, again in the very act of the explanation, the very thing we were hoping to explain. Similarly, to take the example from political philosophy of Hobbes’ explanation of the origin of sociopolitical order, the only way we can explain the origin of the social contract is by presupposing that Hobbes’ wholly pre-social men nevertheless possessed in some way the very social abilities to communicate and make pacts that Hobbes’ position is supposed to explain.
For Žižek, fantasy as such is always fundamentally the fantasy of (one’s) origins. In Freud’s “Wolf Man” case, to cite the psychoanalytic example Žižek cites in For They Know Not What They Do, the primal scene of parental coitus is the Wolf Man’s attempt to come to terms with his own origin—or to answer the infant’s perennial question “where did I come from?” The problem here is this: who could the spectacle of this primal scene have been staged for or seen by, if it really transpired before the genesis of the subject that it would explain (see 3e, 4e)? The only answer is that the Wolf Man has imaginatively transposed himself back into the primal scene if only as an impassive object-gaze—whose historical occurrence he had yet hoped would explain his origin as an individual.
Žižek’s argument is that, in the same way, political or ideological systems cannot and do not avoid deep inconsistencies. No less than Machiavelli, Žižek is acutely aware that the act that founds a body of Law is never itself legal, according to the very order of Law it sets in place. He cites Bertolt Brecht: “what is the robbing of a bank, compared to the founding of a bank?” What fantasy does, in this register, is to try to historically renarrativize the founding political act as if it were or had been legal—an impossible application of the Law before the Law had itself come into being. No less than the Wolf Man’s false transposition of himself back into the primal scene that was to explain his origin, Žižek argues that the attempt of any political regime to explain its own origins in a political myth that denies the fundamental, extralegal violence of these origins is fundamentally false. (Žižek uses the example of the liberal myth of primitive accumulation to illustrate his position in For They Know Not What They Do, but we could cite here Plato’s myth of the reversed cosmos in the Laws and Statesman, or historical cases like the idea of terra nullius in colonial Australia).
In a series of places, Žižek situates his ontological position in terms of a striking reading of Immanuel Kant’s practical philosophy. Žižek argues that in “Religion Within the Bounds of Reason Alone” Kant showed that he was aware of these paradoxes that necessarily attend any attempt to narrate the origins of the Law. The Judeo-Christian myth of the fall succumbs to precisely these paradoxes, as Kant analyses: if Adam and Eve were purely innocent, how could they have been tempted?; if their temptation was wholly the fault of the tempter, why then has God punished humans with the weight of original sin?; but if Adam and Eve were not purely innocent when the snake lured them, in what sense was this a fall at all? According to Žižek, Kant’s text also provides us with theoretical parameters which allow us to explain and avoid these paradoxes. The problems for the mythical narrative, Kant argues, hail from its nature as a narrative—or how it tries to render in a historical story what he argues is truly a logical or transcendental priority. For Kant, human beings are, as such, radically evil. They have always already chosen to assert their own self-conceit above the moral Law. This choice of radical evil, however, is not itself a historical choice either for individuals or for the species, for Kant. This choice is what underlies and opens up the space for all such historical choices. However, as Žižek argues, Kant withdraws from the strictly diabolical implications of this position. The key place in which this withdrawal is enacted is in the postulates of The Critique of Practical Reason, wherein Kant defends the immortality of the soul as a likely story on the basis of our moral experience. Because of radical evil, Kant argues, it is impossible for humans to ever act purely out of duty in this life—this is what Kant thinks our irremovable sense of moral guilt attests. But because people can never act purely in this life, Kant suggests, it is surely reasonable to hope and even to postulate that the soul lives on after death, striving ever closer towards the perfection of its will.
Žižek’s contention is that this argument does not prove the immortality of a disembodied soul. It proves the immortality of an embodied individual soul, always struggling guiltily against its selfish corporeal impulses (this, incidentally, is one reason why Žižek argues, after Lacan, that de Sade is the truth of Kant). In order to make his proof even plausible, Žižek notes, Kant has to tacitly smuggle the spatiotemporal parameters of embodied earthly existence into the postulated hereafter so that the guilty subject can continue endlessly to struggle against his radically evil nature towards good. In this way, though, Kant himself has to speak as if he knew what things are like on the other side of death—which is to say, from the impossible, because impossibly neutral, perspective of someone able to impassively see the spectacle of the immortal subject striving guiltily towards the good (see 4d). But in this way, also, Žižek argues that Kant enacts exactly the type of fantasmatic operation his reading of the fall (as a) narrative declaims, and which represents in nuce the basis operation also of all political ideologies.
Perhaps Žižek’s most radical challenge to accepted theoretical opinion is his defense of the modern, Cartesian subject. Žižek knowingly and polemically positions his writings against virtually all other contemporary theorists, with the significant exception of Alain Badiou. Yet for Žižek, the Cartesian subject is not reducible to the fully self-assured “master and possessor of nature” of Descartes’ Discourses. It is what Žižek calls in “Kant With (Or Against) Kant,” an out of joint ontological excess or clinamen. Žižek takes his bearings here as elsewhere from a Lacanian reading of Kant, and the latter’s critique of Descartes’ cogito ergo sum. In the “Transcendental Dialectic” in The Critique of Pure Reason, Kant criticized Descartes’ argument that the self-guaranteeing “I think” of the cogito must be a thinking thing (res cogitans). For Kant (as for Žižek), while the “I think” must be capable of accompanying all of the subject’s perceptions, this does not mean that it is itself such a substantial object. The subject that sees objects in the world cannot see itself seeing, Žižek notes, any more than a person can jump over her own shadow. To the extent that a subject can reflectively see itself, it sees itself not as a subject but as one more represented object, what Kant calls the “empirical self” or what Žižek calls the “self” (versus the subject) in The Plague of Fantasies. The subject knows that it is something, Žižek argues. But it does not and can never know what Thing it is “in the Real”, as he puts it (see 2e). This is why it must seek clues to its identity in its social and political life, asking the question of others (and of the big Other (see 2b)) which Žižek argues defines the subject as such: che voui? (what do you want from me?). In Tarrying With the Negative, Žižek hence reads the Director’s Cut of Ridley Scott’s Bladerunner as revelatory of the Truth of the subject. Within this version of the film, as Žižek emphasizes, the main character Deckard literally does not know what he is—a robot that perceives itself to be human. According to Žižek, the subject is a “crack” in the universal field or substance of being, not a knowable thing (see 4d). This is why Žižek repeatedly cites in his books the disturbing passage from the young Hegel describing the modern subject not as the “light” of the modern enlightenment, but “this night, this empty nothing …”
It is crucial to Žižek’s position, though, that Žižek denies the apparent implication of this that the subject is some kind of supersensible entity, for example, an immaterial and immortal soul, and so forth. The subject is not a special type of Thing outside of the phenomenal reality we can experience, for Žižek. As we saw in 1e above, such an idea would in fact reproduce in philosophy the type of thinking which, he argues, characterizes political ideologies and the subject’s fundamental fantasy (see 3a). It is more like a fold or crease in the surface of this reality, as Žižek puts it in Tarrying With the Negative, the point within the substance of reality wherein that substance is able to look at itself, and see itself as alien to itself. According to Žižek, Hegel and Lacan add to Kant’s reading of the subject as the empty “I think” that accompanies any individual’s experience the caveat that, because objects thus appear to a subject, they always appear in an incomplete or biased way. Žižek’s “formula” of the fundamental fantasy (see 2a, 2d) “$ <> a” tries to formalize exactly this thought. Its meaning is that the subject ($), in its fundamental fantasy, misrecognizes itself as a special object (the objet petit a or lost object (see 2a)) within the field of objects that it perceives. In terms which unite this psychoanalytic notion with Žižek’s political philosophy, we can say that the objet petit a is exactly a sublime object (2e). It is an object that is elevated or, in Freudian terms, “sublimated” by the subject to the point where it stands as a metonymic representative of the jouissance the subject unconsciously fantasizes was taken from her/him at castration (3a). It hence functions as the object-cause of the subject’s desire that exceptional “little piece of the Real” that s/he seeks out in all of her/his love relationships. Its psychoanalytic paradigms are, to cite the title of a collection Žižek edited, “the voice and gaze as love objects”. Examples of the voice as object petit a include the persecutor’s voice in paranoia, or the very silence that some TV advertisements now use, and which captures our attention by making us wonder whether we may not have missed something. The preeminent Lacanian illustration of the gaze as object petit a is the anamorphotic skull at the foot of Holbein’s Ambassadors, which can only be seen by a subject who looks at it awry, or from an angle. Importantly, then, neither the voice nor the gaze as objet petit a attest to the subject’s sovereign ability to wholly objectify (and hence control) the world it surveys. In the auditory and visual fields (respectively), the voice and the gaze as objet petit a represent objects like Kant’s sublime things that the subject cannot wholly get its head around, as we say. The fact that they can only be seen or heard from particular perspectives indicates exactly how the subject’s biased perspective—and so his/her desire, what s/he wants—has an effect on what s/he is able to see. They thereby bear witness to how s/he is not wholly outside of the reality s/he sees. Even the most mundane but telling example of this subjective objet petit a of Lacanian theory is someone in love, of whom we commonly say that they are able to see in their lover something special, an “X factor,” which others are utterly blind to. In the political field, similarly—and as we saw in part 2c—subjects of a particular political community will claim that others cannot understand their regime’s sublime objects. Indeed, as Žižek comments about the resurgence of racism across the first world today, it is often precisely the strangeness of others’ particular ethnic or national Things that animates subjects’ hatred towards them.
In Žižek’s theory, the objet petit a stands as the exact opposite of the object of the modern sciences, that can only be seen clearly and distinctly if it is approached wholly impersonally. If the objet petit a is not looked at from a particular, subjective perspective—or, in the words of one of Žižek’s titles, by “looking awry” —it cannot be seen at all. This is why Žižek believes this psychoanalytic notion can be used to structure our understanding of the sublime objects postulated by ideologies in the political field, which as we saw in 3c show themselves to be finally inconsistent when they are looked at dispassionately. What Žižek’s Lacanian critique of ideology aims to do is to demonstrate such inconsistencies, and thereby to show us that the objects most central to our political beliefs are Things whose very sublime appearance conceals from us our active agency in constructing and sustaining them. (We will return to this thought in 4d and 4e below).
Žižek argues that the first place that the objet petit a appeared in the history of Western philosophy was with Kant’s notion of the transcendental object in The Critique of Pure Reason. Analyzing this Kantian notion allows us to elaborate more precisely the ontological status of the objet petit a. Kant defines the transcendental object as “the completely indeterminate thought of an object in general.” Like the objet petit a, then, Kant’s transcendental object is not a normal phenomenal object, although it has a very specific function in Kant’s epistemological conception of the subject. The avowedly anti-Humean function of this Kantian positing in the “Transcendental Deduction” is to ensure that the purely formal categories of the subject’s understanding can actually affect and indeed structure the manifold of the subject’s sensuous intuition. As Žižek stresses, that is, the transcendental object functions in Kant’s epistemology to guarantee that sense will continue to emerge for the subject, no matter what particular objects s/he might encounter.
We saw in 3c how Žižek argues that ideologies adduce ultimately inconsistent reasons to support the same goal of political unity. According to Žižek, as we can now elaborate, this is because the deepest political function of sublime objects of ideology is to ensure that the political world will make sense for subjects no matter what events transpire, in a way that he directly compares with Kant’s transcendental object. No matter what evidence someone might produce that all Jewish people are not acquisitive, capitalist, cunning, for example, a true Nazi will be able to immediately resignify this evidence by reference to his ideological notion of “the Jew”: “surely it is part of their cunning to appear as though they are not truly cunning,” and so forth. Importantly, it follows for Žižek that political community is always, in its very structure, an anticipated community. Subjects’ sense of political belonging is always mediated, according to him, by their shared belief in their regime’s key words or master signifiers. But these are words whose only “meaning” lies finally in their function, which is to guarantee that there will (continue to) be meaning. There is, Žižek argues, ultimately no actual, Real Thing better than the other real things subjects encounter that these words name (2e). It is only by acting as if there were such a Thing that community is maintained. This is why Žižek specifies in The Indivisible Reminder that political identification can only be, “at its most basic, identification with the very gesture of identification”:
…the coordination [between subjects in a political community] concerns not the level of the signified [of some positive shared concern] but the level of the signifier. [In political ideologies], undecidability with regard to the signified (do others really intend the same as me?) converts into an exceptional signifier, the empty Master-Signifier, the signifier-without-signified. ‘Nation’, ‘Democracy’, ‘Socialism’ and other Causes stand for that ‘something’ about which we are never sure what, exactly, it is - the point is, rather, that identifying with the Nation we signal our acceptance of what others accept, with a Master-Signifier which serves as the rallying point for all the others. (Žižek, 1996: 142)
This is the sense also in which Žižek claims in Plague of Fantasies that today’s virtual reality is “not virtual enough.” It is not virtual enough because the many options it offers subjects to enjoy (jouis) are transgressive or exotic possibilities. VR leaves nothing to the imagination or, in Žižek’s Lacanian terms, to fantasy. Fantasy, as we saw in 2a, operates to structure subjects’ beliefs about the jouissance which must remain only the stuff of imagination, purely “virtual” for subjects of the social law. For Žižek, then, it is identification with this law, as mediated via subjects’ anticipatory identifications with what they suppose others believe, that involves true virtuality.
As 4b confirms (and as we commented in 1c), Žižek’s political philosophy turns around the idea that the central words of political ideologues are at base “signifiers without signified,” words that only appear to refer to exceptional Things, and which thereby facilitate the identification between subjects. As Žižek argues, these sublime objects of ideology have exactly the ontological status of what Kant called “transcendental illusions”—illusions whose semblance conceals that there is nothing behind them to conceal. Ideological subjects do not know what they do when they believe in them, Žižek contends. Yet, through the presupposition that the Other(s) know (2c), and their participation in the practices involving inherent transgression of their political community (2c), they “identify with the very gesture of identification” (4b). Hence, their belief, coupled with these practices, is politically efficient.
One of Žižek’s most difficult, but also deepest, claims is that the particular sublime objects of ideology with which subjects identify in different regimes (the Nation, the People, and so forth) each give particular form to a meta-law (law about all other laws) that binds any political community as such. This is the meta-law that says simply that subjects must obey all the other laws. In 2b above, we saw how Žižek holds that political ideologies must allow subjects the sense of subjective distance from their explicit directives. Žižek’s critical position is that this apparent freedom ideologies thereby allow subjects is finally a lure. Like the choice offered Yossarian by the “catch 22” of Joseph Heller’s novel, the only option truly available to political subjects is to continue to abide by the laws. No regime can survive if it waives this meta-law. The Sublime Object of Ideology hence cites with approval Kafka’s comment that it is not required that subjects think the law is just, only that it is necessary. Yet no regime, despite Kafka, can directly avow its own basis in such naked self-assertion without risking the loss of all legitimacy, Žižek agrees with Plato. This is why it must ground itself in ideological fantasies (3a) which at once sustain subjects’ sense of individual freedom (2c) and the sense that the regime itself is grounded extra-politically in the Real, and some transcendent, higher Good (2e).
This thought underlies the importance Žižek accords in For They Know Not What They Do to Hegel’s difficult notion of tautology as the highest instance of contradiction in The Science of Logic. If you push a subject hard enough about why they abide by the laws of their regime, Žižek holds that their responses will inevitably devolve into some logical variant of Exodus 3:14’s “I am that I am” statements of the form “because the Law (God / the People/ the Nation) is … the Law (God / the People / the Nation)”. In such tautological statements, our expectation that the predicates in the second half of the sentence will add something new to the (logical) subject given at its beginning is “contradicted,” Hegel argues. There is indeed something even sinister when someone utters such a sentence in response to our enquiries, Žižek notes—as if, when (for example) “the Law” is repeated dumbly as its own predicate (“because the law is the law”), it intimates the uncanny dimension of jouissance the law as ego ideal usually proscribes (3a). What this uncanny effect of sense attests to, Žižek argues in For They Know Not What They Do, is the usually “primordially repressed” force of the universal meta-law (that everyone must obey the laws) being expressed in the different, particular languages of political regimes: “because the People are the People,” “because the Nation is the Nation”, and so forth.
Žižek’s ideology critique hence contends that all political regimes’ ideologies always devolve finally around a set of such tautological propositions concerning their particular sublime objects. In The Sublime Object of Ideology, Žižek gives the example of a key Stalinist proposition: “the people always support the party.” On its surface, this proposition looks like a proposition that asserts something about the world, and which might be susceptible of disproof: perhaps there are some Soviet citizens who do not support the party, or who disagree with this or that of the party’s policies. What such an approach misses, however, is how in this ideology, what is referred to as “the people” in fact means “all those who support the party.” In Stalinism, that is, “the party” is the fetishized particular that stands for the people’s true interests (see 1e). Hence, the sentence “the people always support the party” is a concealed form of tautology. Any apparent people who in fact do not support the party by that fact alone are no longer “people” within Stalinist ideology.
In 4b, we saw how Žižek argues that political identification is identification with the gesture of identification. In 4c, we saw how the ultimate foundation of a regimes’ laws is a tautologous assertion of the bare political fact that there is law. What unites these two positions is the idea that the sublime objects of a political regime and the ideological fantasies that give narratives about their content conceal from subjects the absence of any final ground for Law beyond the fact of its own assertion, and the fact that subjects take it to be authoritative. Here as elsewhere, Žižek’s work surprisingly approaches leading motifs in the political philosophy of Carl Schmitt.
Importantly, once this position is stated, we can also begin to see how Žižek’s post-Marxist project of a critique of ideology intersects with his philosophical defense of the Cartesian subject. At several points in his oeuvre, Žižek cites Hegel’s statement in the “Introduction” to the Phenomenology of Spirit that “the substance is subject” as a rubric that describes the core of his own political philosophy. According to Žižek, critics have misread this statement by taking it to repeat the founding, triumphalist idea of modern subjectivity as such—namely, that the subject can master all of nature or “substance.” Žižek contends, controversially, that Hegel’s claim ought to be read in a directly opposing sense. For him, it indicates the truth that there can be no dominant political regime or, in Hegel’s terms, no “social substance” that does not depend for its authority upon the active, indeed finally anticipatory (4c) investment of subjects in it. Like the malign computer machines in The Matrix that literally run off the human jouissance they drain from deluded subjects, for Žižek the big Other of any political regime does not exist as a self-sustaining substance. It must ceaselessly run on the belief and actions of its subjects, and their jouissance (2c)—or, to recur to the example we looked at in 2d, the King will not be the King, for Žižek, unless he has his subjects. It is certainly telling that the leading examples of ideological tautology For They know What They Do discusses invoke precisely some subject’s will or decision as when a parent says to a child “do this … because I said so,” or when people do something “… because the King said so,” which means that no more questions can be asked.
In 4a, we saw how Žižek denies that the subject, because it is not itself a perceptible object, belongs to an order of being wholly outside of the order of experience. To elevate such a wholly Other order would, he argues, reproduce the elementary operation of the fundamental fantasy. We can now add to this thought the further position that the Cartesian subject is, according to Žižek, is finally nothing other than the irreducible point of active agency responsible for the always minimally precipitous political gesture of laying down a regime’s law. For Žižek, accordingly, the critical question to be asked of any theoretical or political position that posits some exceptional Beyond, as we saw in his reading of Kant (2e) is: from which subject-position do you speak when you claim a knowledge of this Beyond? As we saw in 2e, Žižek’s Lacanian answer is that the perspective that one always presupposes when one speaks in this manner is one that is always “superegoic” (see 2a)—tied to what he terms in Metastases of Enjoyment a “malevolently neutral” God’s eye view from nowhere. It is deeply revealing, from Žižek’s perspective, that the very perspective which allows the Kantian subject in the “dynamic sublime” to resignify its own finitude as itself a source of pleasure-in-pain (jouissance) is precisely one which identifies with the supersensible moral Law, before which the sensuous subject remains irredeemably guilty, infinitely striving to pay off its moral debt. As Žižek cites Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit:
It is manifest that beyond the so-called curtain [of phenomena] which is supposed to conceal the inner world, there is nothing to be seen unless we go behind it ourselves as much in order that we may see, as that there may be something behind there which can be seen. (Žižek, 1989: 196, emphasis added)
In other words, Žižek’s final position about the sublime objects of political regimes’ ideologies is that these belief inspiring objects are so many ways in which the subject misrecognizes its own active capacity to challenge existing laws, and to found new laws altogether. Žižek repeatedly argues that the most uncanny or abyssal Thing in the world is the subject’s own active subjectivity—which is why he also repeatedly cites the Eastern saying that “Thou art that.” It is finally the singularity of the subject’s own active agency that subjects misperceive in fantasies concerning the sublime objects of their regimes’ ideologies, in the face of which they can do nothing but reverentially abide by the rules. In this way, it is worth noting, Žižek’s work can claim a heritage not only of Hegel, but also from the Left Hegelians, and Marx’s and Feuerbach’s critiques of religion.
Žižek’s technical term for the process whereby we can come to recognize how the sublime objects of our political regimes’ ideologies are, like Marx’s commodities, fetish objects that conceal from subjects their own political agency is “traversing of the fantasy.” Traversing the fantasy, for Žižek, is at once the political subject’s deepest form of self-recognition, and the basis for his own radical political position or defense of the possibility of such positions. Žižek’s entire theoretical work directs us towards this “traversing of the fantasy” in the many different fields on which he has written, and despite the widespread consensus at the beginning of the new century that fundamental political change is no longer possible or desirable.
Insofar as political ideologies for Žižek, like for Althusser (see 2c), remain viable only because of the ongoing practices and beliefs of political subjects, this traversal of fantasy must always involve an active, practical intervention in the political world, which changes a regime’s political institutions. As for Kant, so for Žižek, the practical bearing of critical reason comes first, in his critique of ideology, and last, in his advocacy of the possibility of political change. Žižek hence also repeatedly speaks of traversing the fantasy in terms of an “Act” (capital “A”), which differs from normal human speech and action. Everyday speech and action typically does not challenge the framing sociopolitical parameters within which it takes place, Žižek observes. By contrast, what he means by an Act is an action which “touches the Real” (as he says) of what a sociopolitical regime has politically repressed or wiped its hands of, and which it cannot publicly avow without risking fundamental political damage (see 2c). In this way, the Žižekian Act extends and changes the very political and ideological parameters of what is permitted within a regime, in the hope of bringing into being new parameters in the light of which its own justice will be able to be retrospectively seen. This is the point of significant parallel with Alain Badiou’s work, whose influence Žižek has increasingly avowed in his more recent books. Notably, as Žižek specifies in The Indivisible Remainder, the Act as what it is effectively repeats the very act that he claims founds all political regimes as such, namely, the excessive, law founding gesture we examined in 4c. Just as the current political regime originated in a founding gesture excessive with regard to the laws it set in place, Žižek argues, so too can this political regime itself be superseded, and a new one replace it. In his reading of Walter Benjamin’s “Theses on the Philosophy of History” in The Sublime Object of Ideology, Žižek indeed argues that such a new Act also effectively repeats all previous, failed attempts at changing an existing political regime, which otherwise would be consigned forever to historical oblivion.
Slavoj Žižek’s work represents a striking challenge within the contemporary philosophical scene. Žižek’s very style, and his prodigious ability to write and examine examples from widely divergent fields, is a remarkable thing. His work reintroduces and reinvigorates for a wider audience ideas from the works of German Idealism. Žižek’s work is framed in terms of a polemical critique of other leading theorists within today’s new left or liberal academy (Derrida, Habermas, Deleuze), which claims to unmask their apparent radicality as concealing a shared recoil from the possibility of a subjective, political Act which in fact sits comfortably with a passive resignation to today’s political status quo. Not the least interesting feature of his work, politically, is indeed how Žižek’s critique of the new left both significantly mirrors criticisms from conservative and neoconservative authors, yet hails from an avowedly opposed political perspective. In political philosophy, Žižek’s Lacanian theory of ideology presents a radically new descriptive perspective that affords us a unique purchase on many of the paradoxes of liberal consumerist subjectivity, which is at once politically cynical (as the political right laments) and politically conformist (as the political left struggles to come to terms with). Prescriptively, Žižek’s work challenges us to ask questions about the possibility of sociopolitical change that have otherwise rarely been asked after 1989, including: what forms such changes might take?; and what might justify them or make them possible?
Looked at in a longer perspective, it is of course too soon to judge what the lasting effects of Žižek’s philosophy will be, especially given Žižek’s own comparative youth as a thinker (Žižek was born in 1949). In terms of the history of ideas, in particular, while Žižek’s thought certainly turns on their heads many of today’s widely accepted theoretical notions, it is surely a more lasting question whether his work represents any more lasting a break with the parameters that Kant’s critical philosophy set out in the three Critiques.
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