Xenophon (430—354 B.C.E.)

XenophonXenophon was a Greek philosopher, soldier, historian, memoirist, and the author of numerous practical treatises on subjects ranging from horsemanship to taxation.  While best known in the contemporary philosophical world as the author of a series of sketches of Socrates in conversation, known by their Latin title Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology which present a set of vivid and intriguing portraits of Socrates and display some sharp contrasts to the better known portraits in the works of Xenophon’s contemporary, Plato.  Xenophon’s influence in Antiquity, the Middle Ages, and in Early Modern intellectual circles was considerable; he was a pioneer in several literary genres including the first-person military memoir (Anabasis) , the biographical novel (Education of Cyrus), and the continued history (Hellenica).  The range of his areas of expertise and the glancing charm of his down-to-earth writing style continue to fascinate and repay our study. For one example of his work in moral philosophy, he emphasized the importance of self-control, which comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality. This is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said by Xenophon to have exemplified it in the very highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; but his general Araspas stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor, and ignites a chain of events described by Xenophon that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Xenophon’s Socrates
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Moral Philosophy
  5. Practical Treatises
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Times

Xenophon was born during the early years of the Peloponnesian War, in the outlying deme of Athens called Erchia.  Located in the fertile plain known as “Mesogeia” (literally “middle earth”) and overlooked by the beautiful mountains Hymettus and Penteli, Erchia was about 20 kilometers (12 miles) from the bustling center of Athens–about a three hour walk or one hour brisk horseback ride.  His father Gryllus owned and supervised an estate whose income derived chiefly from farming.  Thus, Xenophon will have grown up surrounded by a combination of small hold-farming and urban influences.   Coming of an age in turbulent political times, Xenophon is thought to have been in Athens and personally present at the return of Alcibiades (408), the trial of the Generals, and the overthrow of the 30 Tyrants, all signal events in the rough history of Athenian civic life.

Little else is known about Xenophon’s earliest years.  From his later writings it can be safely inferred that he received a good basic education and military training as befitted a young member of the Equestrian class, that he was able to ride and hunt extensively, and that in his formative years he observed the careful work needed to keep a modest farm maintained and productive.

In 401. B.C.E at the age of 29, Xenophon was invited by his friend Proxenus to join him on a mercenary military venture to Persia, ostensibly to protect the territory of a minor satrap who was under threat.  In fact, though this was not known to Xenophon or Proxenus, the campaign was rather more ambitious than that: it was a game of thrones, nothing less than an assault on the claim of the Persian king Artaxerxes II, by his brother Cyrus the Younger.  The unfolding of this journey into foreign territory, with its adventures and mortal hazards, was a formative event in Xenophon’s life.  In the very first engagement, Cyrus was himself killed.  In a peace parley that followed, the generals of the expeditionary force were executed by treachery, leaving the army stranded, leaderless and surrounded by hostile peoples whose languages they did not speak, and winter was coming.  Xenophon eventually assumed leadership of this stranded and confused army, and led them to safety – as many as survived.  The book which Xenophon later wrote about their harrowing travels ‘up country’, Anabasis, is a hair-raising and brutally graphic soldier’s journal, of which more will be said later.

Upon his return to Greece, Xenophon continued his mercenary work under a Spartan general named Agesilaus.  He even went fighting, with Agesilaus’ “10,000” soldiers who returned from the battle of Coroneia in Persia, against a combined Athenian and Theban force.  Athens issued a decree of exile against Xenophon as a result. .  Even though it is possible that his banishment was revoked in later years, Xenophon never returned to Athens.

In gratitude for his service in this decisive Lacedaimonian victory, the Spartans gave Xenophon an estate in Elis, about 2 miles from Olympia – a region of the Peloponnese which was known for its unparalleled beauty and richness.  Here in Elis over the next 23 years, Xenophon would live a life of semi-retirement and quiet rural pursuits.  Here also he would write the bulk of his works, raise a family, and keep a distanced and reflective historical eye on the political fortunes of Athens. Nothing is known of his wife beyond her name: Philesia.  He had two sons, Gryllus and Diodorus. The Former was killed in the battle of Mantinea in 362 B.C., and Xenophon received many carefully written eulogies, a testament to his prominence in his own time.

When his adoptive city of Sparta was defeated in the Battle of Leuctra in 371 B.C., Elians drove Xenophon from his rural retreat and confiscated it.  Xenophon then moved to “flowery Corinth” where he ended his days.

2. Xenophon’s Socrates

Xenophon’s portrait of Socrates in four loosely topic-organized books is known as Memorabilia.  Any reader who comes across of this work after even a minimal exposure to the better-known Socrates of Plato’s dialogues is in for a shock.  One rare reader who encountered Xenophon’s Socrates first was John Stuart Mill, who refers to it in the context of a description of Mill’s own father:

My father's moral convictions, wholly dissevered from religion, were very much of the character of those of the Greek philosophers; and were delivered with the force and decision which characterized all that came from him. Even at the very early age at which I read with him the Memorabilia of Xenophon, I imbibed from that work and from his comments a deep respect for the character of Socrates; who stood in my mind as a model of ideal excellence: and I well remember how my father at that time impressed upon me the lesson of the "Choice of Hercules."  At a somewhat later period the lofty moral standard exhibited in the writings of Plato operated upon me with great force. (Autobiography, ch.2.)

Xenophon’s Socrates is shown in conversation with various people from a wide variety of walks of life and with quite starkly different moral characters; one of his conversation partners is a famous prostitute, another is an aspiring young politician who knows little about life, another is a son of Pericles, and yet another is a grump; the colorful list goes on.  The individual books of the “Memorabilia” each contain many different conversational vignettes and set pieces, yet they consistently show a Socrates who is above all committed to helping people improve their lives in all practical dimensions; “Socrates was so useful in all circumstances and in all ways…” Memorabilia IV.i.1).  In contrast to Plato’s Socrates, who is committed to “follow the argument wherever, like a wind, it may lead us” (Plato, Republic 394D), Xenophon’s Socrates strives always to send his conversation partners away with some nuggets of practical advice which they may put to use right away.

A brief and selective thematic summary of each book follows:

Memorabilia I:   The book begins with a defense of Socrates against the legal charges which led to his execution, in a long initial section narrated by the author in his own voice.  Socrates enjoined piety and respect for divination, which should be consulted before every momentous life-choice.  He avoided speculation about the nature of the cosmos; “…(h)is own conversation was ever of human things.  The problems he discussed were: what is godly? What is ungodly; what is just, what is unjust; what is prudence; what is madness; what is courage, what is cowardice; what is a state, what is a statesman; what is government, and what is a governor; - these, and others like them…” (Memorabilia.I.1.16).   In a conversation with Aristodemus, Socrates presents an extended ‘argument from design’ to strengthen religious faith; the concept of God here manifested is strikingly monotheistic and is also woven throughout the natural world (Memorabilia I.iv.3-19). To the charge of corrupting the youth, Xenophon writes, “…in control of his own passions and appetites he was the strictest of men” (Memorabilia II.ii.1). (The theme of self-control, both in the sense of restraint of the appetites and in that of autonomy, is strong throughout the Memorabilia.) Socrates “led men up” to self-control, motivated by his love of humanity (Memorabilia I.v, I.2.60).

Memorabilia II:  The theme of self-control is here pursued, and the famous set-piece called “Choice of Herakles” is presented (Memorabilia II.i.21-33), in a version ascribed to Prodicus.  Here, while meditating in a quiet place, the young Herakles is approached by two women who represent the lives of Virtue and Vice respectively.  Each lady tries to persuade Herakles to choose her way, with Vice offering a life of pleasures and self-indulgence, and Virtue offering the rigors of self-control which she argues will lead to true happiness.  (Oddly, the anecdote ends before Herakles chooses.)  There then follows a series of forays into the topic of human relationships as components of the good life; parents give selflessly to their children (a poignant passage describes the tireless work of mothers in particular – Memorabilia II.ii.5); friends are “more useful than any possession”, and are humorously described as being ‘hunted’ and ‘seduced by Siren song’ into one’s life, but the bottom line is that friendship is a good thing based on goodness (Memorabilia II.ii.x).  The value of work as a component of the good life is underscored by a lengthy discussion between Socrates and Aristarchus (Memorabilia II.vii), who has 14 female relatives living under his roof.  Socrates advises him to start a home textile business putting these ladies to work.  They’ll be happier, and work makes for virtue.  This scheme is represented as successful.  (The importance of toil, work, even rough manual labor, to virtue is a continuing theme for Xenophon, and a topic on which his views run counter to the aristocratic mentality of his time.)

Memorabilia III: Here Socrates offers practical advice to several different individuals concerning military leadership and what it takes to become a successful general.  The end goal, he maintains, is to make the soldiers better human beings.  Thus the type of knowledge and expertise required is rather generally found in many different pursuits; even in business (for which one conversation partner has expressed contempt), the goal is the betterment of all individuals concerned; “Don’t look down on business”, Socrates warns (Memorabilia III.iv).  (The idea that there are very general skills which lead to success in a huge variety of human endeavors is a strong theme in Xenophon’s works elsewhere as well.)   General knowledge about human nature and how to be a good leader should combine with the requisite practical knowledge about one’s chosen field, and in all fields moderation and self-control are crucially valuable traits.  Eupraxia, being a good and good-oriented practitioner, is valuable in every field, whether one is a farmer, physician, or politician (Memorabilia III.ix).  In a long set-piece, Socrates is shown visiting a beautiful and famous prostitute named Theodote, and conversing with her about friendship and how to treat one’s friends.  This highly interesting passage, unique in ancient philosophy in presenting a conversation between a working woman (of dubious social standing even!) and a well-known male philosopher, is full of humor and double-entendre but ends with Socrates inviting Theodote to come philosophize with him and his ‘girlfriends’ any time (Memorabilia III.xi).  Finally, Socrates is here something of a fitness guru, advising Epigenes to get out and get some exercise;  “…(t)here is no kind of struggle, apart from war, and no undertaking in which you will be worse off by keeping your body in better fettle” (Memorabilia III.xii.5). (An emphasis on physical fitness achieved through vigorous exercise is a very significant theme throughout Xenophon’s works.)

Memorabilia IV:  The importance of self-control to success in every field of endeavor is again underscored and argued for; talented youths and high-bred horses alike need careful training and structure in order to avoid running off the rails with maturity.  The moral quality of sophrosyne, moderation, prudence, and good habits combined, is said to be most needful in our behavior toward the gods.  For the gods are such benefactors to us that it is asked: How is it possible to be grateful enough?   Socrates offers a translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”, as follows:  a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).  Socrates is described as having the mission of making his companions more law-abiding, more efficacious in their chosen work, more prudent or moderate, and more self-controlled.  Self-control is integral to that precious quality freedom, because no one is free who is ruled by bodily pleasure (Memorabilia IV.v).  This book ends with a beautiful encomium to Socrates spoken in what seems to be Xenophon’s own most authentic voice (Memorabilia IV.viii.11):

All who knew what manner of man Socrates was and who seek after virtue continue to this day to miss him beyond all others, as the chief of helpers in the quest for virtue.  For myself, I have described him as he was: so religious that he did nothing without counsel from the gods; so just that he did no injury, however small, to any man, but conferred the greatest benefits on all who dealt with him…To me then he seemed to be all that a truly good and happy man must be.

In addition to the Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology.

Xenophon’s Symposium depicts an avowedly lighthearted group of friends attending a spontaneous dinner-party in honor of young Autolycus’ victory in an Olympic event.  Entertainment is provided by young talent dancing, singing, and performing feats of agility, while the conversation turns on each guest explaining what he values most about himself: beauty, wealth, poverty, friends, and traits of character are all offered and discussed.  Socrates presents his central attribute as the ability to be a “procurer” (essentially, a pimp); he explains that he is able to improve people and make them better, more useful, more valuable to the city, and is in this analogous to a successful pimp who is able to bring out the best in his stable of prostitutes.  In a more serious vein, Socrates explains the superior value of spiritual love over physical love, and the centrality of virtue to genuine love.  “(T)he greatest blessing that befalls the man who yearns to render his favorite a good friend is the necessity of himself making virtue his habitual practice” (Symposium viii.27).  Weirdly, the evening ends with a demonstration of smooching between two of the young musicians which is so hot that everyone rushes off home to his wife (if he has one) or professes the intention to acquire a wife as soon as possible, if he is still single.

Xenophon’s Apology begins with Socrates explaining to his friend Hermogenes why he has not been working on his defense speech: he has been hindered by his divine sign, and moreover is quite ready to die.  Socrates justifies his readiness by noting the evils of old age that he will avoid, and the blamelessness of his life.  When at trial, he defends himself from the charge of impiety by noting his regular participation in all sacrifices and other public religious rituals.  Against the charge of corrupting the youth, he notes that through the oracle at Delphi, “…Apollo answered that no man was more free than I, or more just, or more prudent” (Apology 14).  After his condemnation to death, Socrates comforts his tearful friends with a Stoic-sounding thought:  “Have you not known all along that from the moment of my birth nature had condemned me to death?” (Apology 27). Xenophon concludes in his own voice (Apology 34):

And so, in contemplating the man’s wisdom and nobility of character, I find it beyond my power to forget him or, in remembering him, to refrain from praising him.  And if among those who make virtue their aim any one has ever been brought into contact with a person more helpful than Socrates, I count that man worthy to be called most blessed.

3. Political Philosophy

Xenophon’s political philosophy is a matter of interpretation and some controversy.  Did his relationship with Sparta incline him away from Athenian democratic values?  Was his evident admiration for Persian kings indicative of an allegiance to absolute monarchy?   The main works examined in an effort to reconstruct this aspect of his thought are The Education of Cyrus (also known as Cyropaedia;) a partial biography of a Persian king building an empire, the Anabasis (account of the ill-fated Greek mercenary expedition in Persia), Hiero (a conversation about tyranny), Agesilaus (biography of a Spartan general),the Constitution of the Lacedaimonians (description of the system of laws and social practices of Sparta), and Hellenica (history of Greece from 411 – 362 B.C.E., taking up where Thucydides ends). One thing is clear and beyond controversy: Xenophon has an abiding interest in describing leadership, the constellation of qualities that enables a person to function as a leader in groups, whether military, civic, or familial.

That Xenophon admires the Spartan system and the individuals it produces is evident from both the portrait of Agesilaus and the description of the Spartan political system developed by the legendary  Lycurgus (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians).  Agesilaus is a ferocious military tactician and fighter who waged campaigns in Persia and on Greek soil.  Xenophon gives minute descriptions of the strategies Ageilaus used against the deceptive Persian general Tissaphernes, the successes of which resulted in the latter losing his head (literally).  It is thought that Xenophon was among the soldiers serving under Agesilaus at the battle of Coronea, judging from the immediacy of descriptions like this word picture of the aftermath of this particularly gruesome clash (Agesilaus II.14):

Now that the fighting was at an end, a weird spectacle met the eye, as one surveyed the scene of the conflict – the earth stained with blood, friend and foe lying dead side by side, shields smashed to pieces, spears snapped in two, daggers bared of their sheaths, some on the ground, some embedded in the bodies, some yet gripped by the hand.

What Xenophon admires most about Agesilaus though is the way his character shines through in his leadership (Agesliaus  II. 8).

(H)e took care to render his men capable of meeting all calls on their endurance; he filled their hearts with confidence that they were able to withstand any and every enemy; he inspired them all with an eager determination to out-do one another in valour; and lastly he filled all with anticipation that many good things would befall them, if only they proved good men.  For he believed that men so prepared fight with all their might; nor in point of fact did he deceive himself.

Here is that general who eats with the common soldiers, fights as hard as they do or harder, sleeps on the rudest bed in the battalion, and is tireless in care for their welfare.  Here too, we find Xenophon noting the Spartan’ general’s “love of toil” (he is philoponos, AgesilausIX.3), and the fact that he had fortified his soul “against all the assaults of lucre, of pleasure, and of fear” (Agesilaus VIII.8). Thanks to all of this and more, the Spartan remained a formidable and gnarly opponent into his eighties, and left behind him the best type of monument: the admiration of all who had known him or known of him.

The Constitution of the Lacedaimonians draws a mostly admiring portrait of the creation of distinctively Spartan social customs and military might, by a (probably mythical) genius social engineer named Lycurgus.  Like the inscription over the ant-colony entrance in T. H. White’s The Sword in the Stone, (White 1938, ch.13) “EVERYTHING NOT FORBIDDEN IS COMPULSORY,” Spartan society is legislated down to the most personal details (where men are allowed to eat supper, how much female children get fed, whether an unused horse can be borrowed, etc.) to produce an efficient warrior-making machine in which accumulations of wealth and private property were rendered impossible and the famous “equality’ which made Sparta so stable (in Xenophon’s apparent view at any rate) was forged.   Spartan soldiers were required by law to practice gymnastics while out on campaign, “…and the result is that they take more pride in themselves and have a more dignified appearance than other men” (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians  XII.5).  Extreme measures are taken with young boys, to ensure that they will develop the proper level of discipline and collectivist thinking that will produce obedient and happily equal adult citizens: they are taken from their homes at age 7 and from thenceforth live in military-like barracks, subject to discipline by any adult male who might see them transgress in any way.

Should we infer that Xenophon endorses this radical social engineering program and its collectivist political philosophy, or only that he finds it a fascinating and impressive experiment which did in fact make Sparta the most feared military force in the Greek world of its time?   Whichever interpretation we choose, it is clear at the end of the treatise that the experiment was not a lasting and unambiguous success; Xenophon writes that Spartan citizens have in fact gone over to the accumulation of individual wealth, have grown fond of wielding power over remote cities, and have lost that unanimity which was Lycurgus’ energetically-sought goal.

Did Xenophon provide an answer to the question about an Ideal Polis, a most desirable form of political organization?  Some scholars have argued that we can look for glimmerings of this in the Anabasis, where the Greek army in its struggle to reach the sea can be viewed as a “polis on the move” (Waterfield 2006, p.147).  As the shattered mercenary troops struggle to stay organized and to survive their pitiless march through the foodless deserts of Assyria and the freezing mountains of Armenia, various forms of political organization surface at various times.  While an army is most naturally understood as an oligarchy, with orders coming from a few and being followed by the many, there are also moments of democracy: soldiers hold general assemblies and agree upon resolutions which they will represent to their commanding officers.  Xenophon himself is elected by popular acclaim early in the march.  As leader, he keeps his eye on the welfare of the troops: defusing anarchy, strategically seeking out food and safety, and making the tough decisions necessary for the good of all, such as abandoning the camp followers and horses in deep mountain snow when it became clear they were a mortal liability.  During its course, Xenophon emphasizes the importance of piety and ritual which bind a polis together in homonoia or like-mindedness.  At the climactic moment when the lead troops crest a rise and spot the sea, immediately after dancing for joy and famously shouting, “Thalatta!  Thalatta!” (the sea, the sea), they build a cairn of stones to honor the gods.

The political philosophies which can be discerned in Xenophon’s largest and perhaps strangest work, The Education of Cyrus, are a matter of great controversy.  Some paradoxical aspects of the work fuel the arguments about how it should be interpreted.  Cyrus is undoubtedly a terrific leader and a daunting empire-builder, but he is seen to have some off-putting traits such as arrogance, a tendency to fear his own sensuality, and questionable judgment from time to time.  Does this mean Xenophon is implicitly criticizing the Persian model of monarchy?  Yet he takes pains, in this massive book, to show Cyrus’ uncanny ability to mobilize support and suppress resistance, and his dedication to both recognizing and rewarding nobility and virtue.  Cyrus is repeatedly seen to emphasize that the best army consists of soldiers serving of their own free will, being rewarded for their merits, and feeling respect and gratitude to their leaders.

They came not from compulsion but from their own free will, and out of gratitude.  (Cyropaedia  IV.iii.11)

Perhaps we should conclude that Xenophon’s political theory is flexible, and that the most key element of any polis revolves around the leadership skills of those in charge, alongside their self-control and devotion to the good of the whole.

4. Moral Philosophy

As seen above in the discussion of Xenophon’s Socrates and of the ideal leader, certain themes recur in Xenophon’s moral reflections. Some of the most frequently recurring ideas are:

  1.  The importance of self-control: Sophrosyne, self-control, moderation, restraint of appetite, and balance, comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality, and it is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said to have exemplified it in the highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when (Cyropaedia V.i-VII.iii) he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; his general Araspas by contrast stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor and ignites a chain of events that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.
  2. A demanding work-ethic:  Hard work makes for virtue in several ways.  It conduces to health, it results in earned rewards, it keeps us off the streets of temptation, and builds character.   In the Oeconomicus, a treatise on household management, Xenophon tells the story of a visit paid by a Greek ambassador to Cyrus the Persian king in his royal gardens.  Cyrus astounds the Greek by stating that he himself laid out the garden plan and works in it regularly. Cyrus continues (Oeconomicus IV.24),
  3. "I never yet sat down to dinner when in sound health, without first working hard at some task of war or agriculture, or exerting myself somehow."
  4. The Greek replies, “I think you deserve your happiness, Cyrus, for you earn it by your virtue”.
  5. An ideal of service: It is impossible to miss this emphasis in Xenophon’s remembrances of Socrates, “…so useful in all circumstances and in all ways” (Memorabilia IV.i.1).  Socrates can frequently be seen offering practical help, life advice, and moral guidance to friends and total strangers.  Indeed Xenophon’s Socrates resembles an uncompensated life-coach in marked ways.  Do you have lots of ‘friends’ but suspect they just want something from you? Be more discerning and take better care of your real friends; then friendships will be on a more solid footing (advice to a prostitute; MemorabiliaII.xi).  Do you over-react to other peoples’ rudeness?  Adjust your attitude; it’s not always about you (MemorabiliaIII.xiii).  Feuding with your brother?  Study the natural world and observe that animals reared together feel a yearning for each other’s company; love between brothers is more natural than discord (Memorabilia II.iii.4).
  6. A certain utilitarianism: The best actions are the most practically beneficial for all.  In Xenophon there is nothing of the soul’s solitary winged journey toward fulfillment in transcendence.  Goodness is good for the here and now, and good for the city, or the army, or the whole farm.  Eupraxia, doing well and doing things beneficially, is of the highest value.
  7. A certain egalitarianism: Although Xenophon was no feminist, he does present the idea that the wife who is a full partner in household management contributes as much to the welfare of the estate as does her husband (Oeconomicus III.15).  Wives and husbands should be co-workers in the household (Oeconomicus III.x).  And he gives to Socrates these memorable lines about how hard it is to be a mother of small children, a passage unique in classical literature (Memorabilia II.ii.5):

The woman conceives and bears her burden in travail, risking her life, and giving of her own food; and, with much labor, having endured to the end and brought forth her child, she rears and cares for it, although she has not received any good thing, and the babe neither recognizes its benefactress nor can make its wants known to her; still she guesses what is good for it, and what it likes, and seeks to supply these things, and rears it for a long season, enduring toil day and night, nothing knowing what return she will get.

He writes admiringly of the general who eats with his men and eats the same food, of the king who works in his garden, of Socrates chatting with a prostitute, of the virtue of Panthea and her noble death (Cyropaedia VII.iii.14).  He admires the Spartan ideal of equality and laments its erosion.

5. Practical Treatises

  Xenophon’s collected works include several shorter dialogues and essays in which he (like his Socrates) provides useful and practically applicable advice on topics like choosing and training a war-horse (On Horsemanship), being a cavalry commander (The Cavalry Commander),  hunting (On Hunting), taxation (Ways and Means), and home economics (Oeconomicus).  These treatises are not flatly how-to manuals but also are infused with a distinctive world-view and a definite value-scheme.

So for example, in the treatise on horsemanship, Xenophon presents a definite equine psychology and a training ethic; the training should not be harsh, because “…nothing forced can ever be beautiful”.  The horse

must follow the indication of the aids to display of his own free will all the most beautiful and brilliant qualities (On Horsemanship XI.6).

Xenophon stresses commonalities between horses and humans.   Old saws apply equally to horses and to humans, as in the following text concerning the length of galloping sets: “In excess of the proper limit, nothing whatsoever is enjoyable, either to a horse or a man” (X.14).  It is noticeable that Xenophon does not simply say that running a horse ragged is counterproductive in training.  His point differs from this claim in two ways: he stresses again the commonality between horse and human; and he places the emphasis of the training advice upon what is pleasing (‘edu) to the horse.  Thus the horse is conceived as a partner, rather than an object, in the training project, and a partner whose willing and appreciative participation in the project is essential to its success.

So also, in the Oeconomicus, there is not simply practical instruction about running a successful small farm, but a general theme of praise for engagement, orderliness, and system that has sometimes a definite political ring, as in the following passage (Oeconomicus V.i):

For the pursuit of (farming) is in some sense a luxury as well as a means of increasing one’s estate and of training the body in all that a free man should be able to do.

Sometimes however it just sounds quaint; “What a beautiful sight is afforded by boots of all sorts arranged in rows!” (Oeconomicus VIII.19).

Thus, Xenophon’s philosophical projects were infused with a commitment to practical usefulness just as his practical treatises convey a philosophy that is still of interest today, with its emphasis on engagement in the world, on knowing who we are and how we can help.   Recall Socrates’ translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”; a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, J.K., 2001, Xenophon, Bristol, U.K.: Bristol Classical.
  • Brickhouse, T., 2002, The trial and execution of Socrates: sources and controversies, New York : Oxford University Press.
  • Bruell, C., “Xenophon”, in History of Political Philosophy, ed. L. Strauss and J. Cropsey, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987, 89-117.
  • Buzzetti, E., 2001, “The Rhetoric of Xenophon and the Treatment of Justice in the Memorabilia”, in Interpretation 29.1: 3-35.
  • Cooper, J., 1999, "Notes on Xenophon's Socrates”, in Cooper, J., Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press: 3-28.
  • Danzig, G. 2005, “Intra-Socratic Polemics: The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon”, in Greek, Roman, and Byzantine Studies 45: 331-357.
  • Dillery, John, 1995, Xenophon and the History of his Times, New York: Routledge.
  • Dorion, Louis-Andre, 2010, “The Straussian Exegesis of Xenophon: The Paradigmatic Case of Memorabilia IV 4”, in V. Gray. (ed.) Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 283-323.
  • Fox, R.L. (ed.), 2004, The Long March: Xenophon and the Ten Thousand, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Gray, V., 1998, The Framing of Socrates: The Literary Interpretation of Xenophon’s Memorabilia, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Gray, V. (ed.), 2010, Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Higgins, W. 1977, Xenophon the Athenian: the problem of the individual and the society of the polis, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Howland, J., 2000, “Xenophon’s Philosophical Odyssey: On the Anabasis and Plato’s Republic”, in American Political Science Review, 94.4: 875-889.
  • Johnson, D. , 2003, “Xenophon’s Socrates on Justice and the Law”, in Ancient Philosophy, 23: 255-281.
  • Judson, L. and Karasmanis, V. (edd.), 2006, Remembering Socrates, Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press
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Author Information

Eve A. Browning
Email: ebrownin@d.umn.edu
University of Minnesota Duluth
U. S. A.

Alasdair Chalmers MacIntyre (1929— )

MacIntyreAlasdair MacIntyre is a Scottish born, British educated, moral and political philosopher who has worked in the United States since 1970.  His work in ethics and politics reaches across disciplines, drawing on sociology and philosophy of the social sciences as well as Greek and Latin classical literature.

MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist, but in the late 1950s, he started working to develop a Marxist ethics that could rationally justify the moral condemnation of Stalinism.  That project eventually led him to reject Marxism along with every other form of “modern liberal individualism” and to propose Aristotle’s ethics as a more effective way to renew moral agency and practical rationality through small-scale moral formation within communities.

MacIntyre’s best known book, After Virtue (1981), is the product of this long ethical project.  After Virtue diagnoses contemporary society as a “culture of emotivism” in which moral language is used pragmatically to manipulate attitudes, choices, and decisions, so that contemporary moral culture is a theater of illusions in which objective moral rhetoric masks arbitrary choices.  MacIntyre followed After Virtue with two books examining the role that traditions play in judgments about truth and falsity, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (1988) and Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990).  MacIntyre’s next major work, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), investigates the social needs and social debts of human agents, and the role that a community plays in the formation of an independent practical reasoner.  The remainder of MacIntyre’s mature work extends and supplements the arguments of these four major works.

MacIntyre’s philosophy is important to the fields of virtue ethics and communitarian politics, but MacIntyre has denied belonging to either school of thought.  MacIntyre has identified himself as a Thomist since 1984, but some Thomists question his Thomism because he emphasizes Thomas Aquinas’s treatment of human agency but rejects the neo-Thomist project of a creating a Thomist moral epistemology based on the metaphysics of human nature.  MacIntyre continues to point out the irrelevance of conventional business ethics, conceived as an application of modern moral theories to business decision making, but some scholars in the field of business ethics have begun to apply MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of agency and virtue to the study of organizational systems, to develop ways of renewing moral agency and practical rationality within companies. MacIntyre has played an important role in the renewal of Aristotelian ethics and politics in the last three decades, and has made a valued contribution to the advancement of Thomistic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Prefatory Comment on "Modern Liberal Individualism"
  3. Development since 1951
    1. The influence of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach in MacIntyre's Moral and Political Work
    2. Three Phases in MacIntyre's Career
      1. Early Career (1949-1971)
        1. Philosophy of Religion
        2. Philosophy of the Social Sciences
        3. Ethics and Politics
      2. Interim (1971-1977)
      3. Mature Work (1977- )
  4. Major works since 1977
    1. After Virtue
      1. Critical Argument of AV
      2. The Constructive Argument of AV
      3. Aristotelian Critique of Modern Ethics and Politics
      4. Criticism of AV
    2. Two Books on Rationality: WJWR and 3RV
      1. Whose Justice? Which Rationality?
      2. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry
    3. Dependent Rational Animals
    4. The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1
    5. Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2
    6. God, Philosophy, Universities
  5. The Main Themes of MacIntyre's Philosophy
    1. The Ethics and Politics of Human Agency
    2. Ethics and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Works

1. Life

Alasdair MacIntyre was born January 12, 1929 in Glasgow, Scotland.  His parents, both of which were physicians, were born and raised in the West of Scotland.  Though Educated in England, he learned Scots Gaelic from one of his aunts.  MacIntyre grew up in and around the city of London. He earned a bachelor’s degree in classics from Queen Mary College in the University of London in the city’s East End in 1949. MacIntyre attended graduate school at Manchester University, a provincial “red brick” university in the North West of England, earning his MA in Philosophy in 1951.

MacIntyre’s family had distant ties to County Donegal, in the North of Ireland, and his knowledge of Gaelic helped MacIntyre to make connections to the people there. He has remained close to the cultural and political concerns of Ireland for many years. MacIntyre “has an intimate and extensive knowledge of Irish literature, both in English and in Irish” (O’Rourke, p. 3). An academic conference celebrating MacIntyre’s eightieth birthday, held at the University College Dublin in 2009, acknowledged and celebrated his ties to the Irish community.

Alasdair MacIntyre’s philosophy builds on an unusual foundation. His early life was shaped by two conflicting systems of values. One was “a Gaelic oral culture of farmers and fishermen, poets and storytellers.” The other was modernity, “The modern world was a culture of theories rather than stories” (MacIntyre Reader, p. 255). MacIntyre embraced both value systems, and carried those divergent worldviews into his undergraduate education.

As a classics major at Queen Mary College in the University of London (1945-1949), MacIntyre read the Greek texts of Plato and Aristotle, but his studies were not limited to the grammars of ancient languages. He also examined the ethical theories of Immanuel Kant and John Stuart Mill. He attended the lectures of analytic philosopher A. J. Ayer and of philosopher of science Karl Popper. He read Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico Philosophicus, Jean-Paul Sartre’s L'existentialisme est un humanisme, and Marx’s Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 17-18). MacIntyre met the sociologist Franz Steiner, who helped direct him toward approaching moralities substantively (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 259). MacIntyre’s mature work continues to bridge across conventional disciplinary borders.

MacIntyre’s mature writings also continue to criticize the social and economic orders of modern life. This work also began during his time at Queen Mary College, growing out of his solidarity with the poor and working classes who filled the East End of London where Queen Mary College is located. MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Marxist critiques of liberalism and capitalism (Kinesis Interview,  p. 48) drew MacIntyre into two decades of participation in Marxist organizations (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xiii-l). MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Thomist critique of English social and political life made a strong impression on MacIntyre, but he would not identify himself as a Thomist until 1984 (What happened, p. 17).

From Marxism, MacIntyre learned to see liberalism as a destructive ideology that undermines communities in the name of individual liberty and consequently undermines the moral formation of human agents (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 258; Kinesis Interview , p. 47). MacIntyre still acknowledges the insights of The Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 20, 483), a book that strips the ideological pretensions from mid-nineteenth century French political rhetoric. For MacIntyre, Marx’s way of seeing through the empty justifications of arbitrary choices to consider the real goals and consequences of political actions in economic and social terms would remain the principal insight of Marxism. MacIntyre found the predictive theories of Marxist social science less convincing. His first book, Marxism: An Interpretation, (1953), criticizes Marx’s turn to social science; similar critiques appear in nearly all of MacIntyre’s major works.

MacIntyre began his teaching career at the University of Manchester as a Lecturer in the Philosophy of Religion in 1951, and held that post until 1957. In a 1956 essay, “Manchester: The Modern University and the English Tradition,” MacIntyre writes with pride about the role of the provincial universities as centers of professional education that are tied in service to the people of their cities, as places that had traditionally been homes to radical politics and non-conformist and minority (Agnostic, Roman Catholic, and Jewish) religion. Marxism: An Interpretation, is similarly an expression of radical politics and non-conformist religion directed to the service of people’s needs. After Manchester, MacIntyre became a member of Britain’s New Left (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xxii-xxxii, 86-93) and moved through teaching, research, and administrative positions at other British universities before emigrating from Britain to the United States in 1970, where his research interests drew him to teaching posts at Brandeis, Boston University, Vanderbilt, Notre Dame, and Duke. MacIntyre returned to Notre Dame in 2000 as the Senior Research Professor in the Notre Dame Center for Ethics and Culture until his retirement in 2010.

MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist Protestant Christian philosopher of religion, basing his work on the fideism of Karl Barth and Wittgenstein’s concept of a form of life (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 257). By 1960 he had stopped writing on that subject, and he wrote as an atheist through the sixties and seventies. MacIntyre’s emigration from Great Britain roughly coincides with his break from organized Marxism. In 1968, MacIntyre published a heavily revised version of Marxism: An Interpretation as Marxism and Christianity, and noted in the preface to the new book that he had become skeptical of both. That skepticism remains in Against the Self-Images of the Age (1971).

During the years 1977 through 1984 MacIntyre transitioned to an Aristotelian worldview, returned to the Christian faith and turned from Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas. MacIntyre explains in the preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006) that the article “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC, 1977) marks the beginning of this transition.

After his retirement from teaching, MacIntyre has continued his work of promoting a renewal of human agency through an examination of the virtues demanded by practices, integrated human lives, and responsible engagement with community life. He is currently affiliated with the Centre for Contemporary Aristotelian Studies in Ethics and Politics (CASEP) at London Metropolitan University.

Alasdair MacIntyre has authored 19 books and edited five others. His most important book, After Virtue (hereafter AV, 1981), has been called one of the most influential works of moral philosophy of the late 20th century. AV and his other major works, including Marxism: An Interpretation (hereafter MI, 1953), A Short History of Ethics (hereafter SHE, 1966), Marxism and Christianity (hereafter M&C, 1968), Against the Self-Images of the Age (hereafter ASIA, 1971), Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (hereafter WJWR, 1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (hereafter 3RV, 1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (Hereafter DRA, 1999) have shaped academic moral philosophy for six decades.  SHE served as a standard text for college courses in the history of moral philosophy for many years; AV remains a widely used ethics textbook in undergraduate and graduate education. MacIntyre has published about two hundred journal articles and roughly one hundred book reviews, addressing concerns in ethics, politics, the philosophy of the social sciences, Marxist theory, Marxist political practice, the Aristotelian notion of excellence or virtue in human agency, and the interpretation of Thomistic metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics.

MacIntyre’s mature work, initiated by the 1977 essay, “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC), draws upon the study of traditions, and the examination of the narratives that inform traditions of scientific, philosophical, and social practice, as a philosophical method. AV and the whole body of work that follows it employ this philosophical method in the study of moral and political philosophy.

2. Prefatory Comment on "Modern Liberal Individualism"

AV rejects the view of “modern liberal individualism” in which autonomous individuals use abstract moral principles to determine what they ought to do. The critique of modern normative ethics in the first half of AV rejects modern moral reasoning for its failure to justify its premises, and criticizes the frequent use of the rhetoric of objective morality and scientific necessity to manipulate people to accept arbitrary decisions. The critical argument gives examples of such manipulative moral rhetoric in ordinary speech, in philosophical ethics, and in the political use of the social sciences. The second half of AV proposes a conception of practice and practical reasoning and the notion of excellence as a human agent as an alternative to modern moral philosophy, presenting what MacIntyre has called “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277).

MacIntyre’s use of the term “modern liberal individualism” in philosophy is not equivalent to “liberalism” in contemporary politics. Some readers interpreted MacIntyre’s rejection of “modern liberal individualism” to mean that he is a political conservative (AV, 3rd ed., p. xv), but MacIntyre uses “modern liberal individualism” to name a much broader category that includes both liberals and conservatives in contemporary American political parlance, as well as some Marxists and anarchists (See ASIA, pp. 280-284). Conservatism, liberalism, Marxism, and anarchism all present the autonomous individual as the unit of civil society (see “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken.”); none of these political theories can provide a well-developed conception of the common good; and none of them can adequately explain or justify any shared pursuit of any common good.

The sources of modern liberal individualism—Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau—assert that human life is solitary by nature and social by habituation and convention. MacIntyre’s Aristotelian tradition holds, on the contrary, that human life is social by nature. Modern liberal individualism seeks to justify the moral authority of various universal, impersonal moral principles to enable autonomous individuals to make morally correct decisions. But modern moral philosophers use those principles to establish the authority of universal moral norms, and modern autonomous individuals set aside the pursuit of their own goods and goals when they obey these principles and norms in order to judge and act morally. MacIntyre rejects this modern project as incoherent. MacIntyre identifies moral excellence with effective human agency, and seeks a political environment that will help to liberate human agents to recognize and seek their own goods, as components of the common goods of their communities, more effectively. For MacIntyre therefore, ethics and politics are bound together.

3. Development since 1951

Alasdair MacIntyre’s career in moral and political philosophy has passed through many changes, but two themes have remained constant. The first is his critique of modern normative ethics. The second is his approach to moral philosophy as a study of moral formation that strengthens rational human agency and helps to develop a political community of rational agents. The critique of modern normative ethics draws on two sources, the philosophy of Karl Marx, and the emotivism of early twentieth-century logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson. The search for a truthful ethics and politics of agents in communities draws on action theory, sociology, the philosophy of science and the theme of “revolutionary practice” drawn from Karl Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach.

a. The influence of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach in MacIntyre's Moral and Political Work

MacIntyre has cited the third of Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach, throughout his career (See MI, p. 61; M&C, p. 59, AV, p. 84); he explains the significance of the Theses on Feuerbach in detail in “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken” (hereafter ToF:RNT), published in 1994. Macintyre reads The Theses on Feuerbach as “a genuinely transitional text” (ToF:RNT, p. 224),” marking the end of Marx’s philosophical work with Hegel and Feuerbach, but “pointing in a direction which Marx did not in fact take” (ToF:RNT, p. 226). Hegel and Feuerbach had been critics of “the standpoint of civil society”; which is effectively the standpoint of “modern liberal individualism.” Feuerbach had criticized objects of religious belief as projections of human thought. But Marx found that the theoretical objects of Feuerbach’s philosophy were susceptible to the same critique. In the Theses on Feuerbach, Marx proposed a philosophy that sets aside the contemplation of theoretical objects in order to examine and transform human activity and practice (ToF:RNT, pp. 227-8; see Marx, fourth and first theses).

In the third thesis, Marx complained that Feuerbach and other materialist social theorists invented a determinist theory of human behavior, but applied it as if it did not encompass their own free agency, as if they were superior to society (ToF:RNT, p. 229-30; see also AV, p. 84).  Rejecting this implicit distinction between society and those superior to it, Marx insisted that the leaders and followers of the revolution can only act together, discovering together the ends and methods of the revolution (ToF:RNT, p. 230-1). Marx made this proposal, but did not pursue it. Later Marxist revivals of philosophy have followed two main roads of research, “the dialectical and historical materialism of Plekhanov . . . or . . . the rational voluntarism of the young Lukács” (ToF:RNT, p. 232). For MacIntyre, even at the beginning of his career, The Theses on Feuerbach offered a less traveled road for the recovery of Marxist philosophy that would become essential to MacIntyre’s contributions to moral and political philosophy.

b. Three Phases in MacIntyre's Career

Discussing his career in an interview for the journal Cogito in 1991, MacIntyre identified three distinct phases in his development. During the first period, from 1949 to 1971, MacIntyre published in the philosophy of religion, ethics, the philosophy of the social sciences, and Marxist political and ethical theory without integrating these studies into a unified world view. During the second period, from 1971 to 1977, MacIntyre worked toward the integration of his philosophy. In the third period, from 1977 forward, MacIntyre has been working on “a single project, to which AV, WJWR and 3RV are all central” (Interview for Cogito, in The MacIntyre Reader, p. 269)

i. Early Career (1949-1971)

In his early career, MacIntyre investigated the rational justification of theories and beliefs, and published books and articles in the philosophy of religion, the philosophy of the social sciences, and moral theory. This survey of his early career will take each of these fields in turn.

1. Philosophy of Religion

In the philosophy of religion, the young MacIntyre did not try to justify religious belief rationally; rather he tried to show that religious belief should be exempted from rational examination. The theory he developed in the 1950s was a defensive structure devised to separate MacIntyre’s religious beliefs from the rest of his academic work. MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion was influenced by the philosophy of Ludwig Wittgenstein and the theology of Karl Barth. For the fideist, religious belief is not, and cannot be rational; its only basis is the acceptance of religious authority. MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion is nothing more than a rational compartmentalization of religious belief.

The key statement of MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion is his 1957 essay, “The Logical Status of Religious Belief,” published in the book Metaphysical Beliefs. This essay faced strong criticism from the atheist Antony Flew and the Christian theologian Basil Mitchell. In a 1958 book review, Flew pointed out that traditional Christianity had a closer connection to empirical facts than MacIntyre allowed, and that even if facts about the world could not verify religious belief, it was nonetheless possible for internal incoherence to demonstrate the falsehood of doctrine. Mitchell published a fourteen page critique of MacIntyre’s fideism in 1961 entitled, “The Justification of Religious Belief.” When Metaphysical Beliefs was republished in 1970, MacIntyre added a new preface in which he thanked Flew and Mitchell, along with his colleague Ronald Hepburn, for their criticism, and rejected the essay’s “irrationalism as both false and dangerous” (“Preface to the 1970 Edition,” pp. x–xi).

From the early 1960s through the late 1970s, MacIntyre wrote as an avowed atheist. Three publications in the 1960s, “God and the Theologians,” The Religious Significance of Atheism, and Secularization and Moral Change, express MacIntyre’s atheist convictions.

The reasoning behind MacIntyre’s rejection of his early fideism continues to inform his approach to theism. MacIntyre’s 2010 lecture, “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture” does not treat theistic belief as an isolable metaphysical doctrine about the origin and fate of human life. For the mature MacIntyre, theism plays a central role in the interpretation of the world. MacIntyre’s mature theism is not a return to his early fideism; it belongs to a rational worldview that challenges “secular fideists” on the same grounds that it challenges religious ones (WJWR, p. 5).

2. Philosophy of the Social Sciences

MacIntyre’s early work in the philosophy of the social sciences is related to the rational justification of Marxist theory, and to distinguishing the more promising elements of Marx’s early philosophical work from the more pseudoscientific elements of later Marxist and Stalinist theory. Within Marxism, which presented itself through most of the twentieth century as a social science, MacIntyre directed his critique against the crude determinism of Stalinism. More broadly, MacIntyre has questioned the rational justification of any social theory that does not give a central place to the beliefs, intentions, and choices of human agents.

In his unpublished master’s thesis, The Significance of Moral Judgements (hereafter SMJ, 1951), MacIntyre cites Steven Toulmin, “The Logical Status of Psycho-Analysis,” Antony Flew, “Psycho-Analytic Explanation,” and Richard Peters, “Cause, Cure, and Motive,” to criticize Sigmund Freud’s apparent reduction of the moral account of a person’s actions to a causal account of that person’s psychological condition.

MacIntyre remained an outspoken critic of determinist social science throughout the early period of his career. Marxism: An Interpretation criticizes Marx’s turn to determinist social science in The German Ideology (MI, pp. 68-78). M&C, revises this criticism, directing the blame toward Friedrich Engels (M&C, pp.70-74). In the article, “Determinism,” MacIntyre admitted that successful predictions about human behavior from the social sciences made it difficult to dismiss determinism, but given the kinds of interpretative choices required to defend determinism, he found “it difficult to see how determinism could ever be verified or falsified” (pp. 39-40).

3. Ethics and Politics

MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics, if understood as a critique of the normative ethics characteristic of liberal modernity, is rooted partly in the work of Karl Marx. While still a student, MacIntyre had accepted much of the Marxist critique of modern liberal politics as an ideology that sets the individual against the interests of the community. Marx dismissed the notion of “natural rights” as a residue of feudal society in the book review, “On The Jewish Question.” For Marx, “rights” could arise only from laws made by governments. Marx held that “natural rights” or the “rights of man,” as used in nineteenth century liberal politics, served only to protect the individual from the society to which he belonged, and thus threatened both the society and the individual.

MacIntyre’s early Marxism led him to reject every form of modern liberal individualism, “including the liberalism of contemporary American and English conservatives, as well as that of American and European radicals, and even the liberalism of the self-proclaimed liberals.” For these ideological stances, by their constructions of civil society as a response of the individual to universal standards of reason and behavior, “impose a certain kind of unacknowledged domination, and one which in the long run tends to dissolve traditional human ties and to impoverish social and cultural relationships” (Borradori interview, p. 258)

MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics is also influenced by the theory of emotivism. C. L. Stevenson and other emotivists held that moral judgments signify only the subjective interests of their authors, rather than any objective characteristic of the agents and actions they judge. SMJ takes issue with the reductivism of Stevenson’s theory of the meaning of moral judgments, but MacIntyre agrees with most points of Stevenson’s emotivist critique of modern normative ethics, and in this way MacIntyre joins Stevenson’s critique of the intuitionism of G. E. Moore.

Moore had argued in Principia Ethica (1903) that the fundamental task of philosophical ethics was to investigate “assertions about that property of things which is denoted by the term ‘good,’ and the converse property denoted by the term ‘bad’” (Principia Ethica, §23) Moore asserted that “good” must name some specific quality that all good things share, but he found it impossible to define “good” in any adequate way (Principia Ethica, §10). Moore therefore described “good” as a simple, indefinable, non-natural quality.

Logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer (Language Truth and Logic, ch. 6) and C. L. Stevenson could find nothing objective in the “good” that Moore described, and concluded that “good” and “bad” are not objective qualities. Stevenson held that valuations, like “this is a good car” or “that is a good house,” and moral valuations, like “he is a good man,” or “theft is wrong,” are not statements of fact. For Stevenson, evaluative words like “good” and “evil” carry, “emotive meaning” which Stevenson defines as “a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses to people” (“The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” p. 23) Emotive terms are used to influence people. Thus the true meaning of any valuation, and particularly of any moral valuation—the significance of moral judgments—is either the speaker’s subjective approval and recommendation, or the speaker’s subjective rejection and proscription. In short, the emotivists held that moral judgments communicate neither facts nor beliefs; they communicate only the emotional interests of their authors.

MacIntyre criticized the reductivism of Stevenson’s conclusions in his MA thesis, but MacIntyre did not criticize Stevenson’s rejection of Moore. MacIntyre explains, “This is not to deny the emotive character of the moral judgment: it is to suggest that when we have said of moral judgments that they are emotive we have left a great deal unsaid—and even the emotive may have a logic to be mapped” (SMJ, p. 89.) MacIntyre’s 1951 assessment of emotivism accepts Stevenson’s critique of the referential meaning of moral judgments (SMJ, p. 74), and with it, the general rejection of “traditional moral philosophy” as a study that uses principles to assess facts (SMJ, p. 81).

For MacIntyre ethics is not an application of principles to facts, but a study of moral action. Moral action, free human action, involves decisions to do things in pursuit of goals, and it involves the understanding of the implications of one’s actions for the whole variety of goals that human agents seek. In this sense, “To act morally is to know how to act” (SMJ, p. 56). “Morality is not a ‘knowing that’ but a ‘knowing how’” (SMJ, p. 89). If human action is a ‘knowing how,’ then ethics must also consider how one learns ‘how.’ Like other forms of ‘knowing how,’ MacIntyre finds that one learns how to act morally within a community whose language and shared standards shape our judgment (SMJ, pp. 68-72). MacIntyre had concluded that ethics is not an abstract exercise in the assessment of facts; it is a study of free human action and of the conditions that enable rational human agency.

Human agency remains a central theme in MacIntyre’s first published book, Marxism: An Interpretation (1953). The book praises those forms of M&C that enable human agency, and criticizes those that inhibit human agency. MacIntyre traces a history from Protestant theology and practice, through the philosophies of Hegel and Feuerbach, to the work of Marx to argue that Marxism is a transformation of Christianity. MacIntyre gives Marx credit for concluding in the third of the Theses on Feuerbach, that the only way to change society is to change ourselves, and that “The coincidence of the changing of human activity or self-changing can only be comprehended and rationally understood as revolutionary practice” (Marx, Theses on Feuerbach, quoted in MI, p. 61). MacIntyre criticizes Marx’s subsequent turn to determinist social science and concludes that “Marx’s transition from prophecy to prediction” transforms Marxism into an alienating myth that divides human beings between “the good who accept Marxism, [and] the wicked who reject it” (MI, p. 89).

The book also examines some shortcomings of Protestant theology and practice, showing how the demands of the gospel inform the ideals of Feuerbach and, through Feuerbach, Marx. MacIntyre distinguishes “religion which is an opiate for the people from religion which is not” (MI, p. 83). He condemns forms of religion that justify social inequities and encourage passivity. He argues that authentic Christian teaching criticizes social structures and encourages action (MI, pp. 119-22).

The MA thesis and MI combine to chart MacIntyre’s initial reply to the emotivist critique of modern normative ethics. They also prefigure MacIntyre’s conflict with R. M. Hare’s response to emotivism. Hare sought to defend modern normative ethics from the emotivist challenge with an alternative account of the meaning of moral judgments. A central claim of Hare’s The Language of Morals (1952), renewed in Freedom and Reason (1963), is that moral judgments are descriptive—not merely emotive—because they are both universalizable and prescriptive. For Hare, universalizability stems from an agent’s commitment to use terms and judgments consistently. For example, “If a person says that a thing is red, he is committed to the view that anything which was like it in the relevant respects would likewise be red” (Freedom and Reason, I 2.2). Thus the prescriptive judgments that agents make are universalizable, insofar as those agents are committed to judging similar things similarly; and it is the universalizability of these prescriptive judgments that gives them descriptive meaning. In short, moral judgments are descriptive because they describe the values chosen by their authors.

MacIntyre rejected Hare’s defense of modern normative ethics in his 1957 essay, “What Morality Is Not.” MacIntyre focuses on Hare’s theory: “It is widely held that it is of the essence of moral valuations that they are universalizable and prescriptive. This is the contention which I wish to deny.” “What Morality is Not” explores the variety of meanings and intentions carried by moral judgments. MacIntyre lists six kinds of moral valuations that are neither universalizable nor prescriptive and concludes that the theory of universal prescriptivism is inadequate for the same reason that emotivism is inadequate; it is reductive. Universal prescriptivism simply fails to give a complete account of the meaning of moral judgments.

“What Morality is Not” also argues that the procedures of modern moral philosophy are superfluous to real moral practice. Where “moral philosophy textbooks” discuss the kinds of maxims that should guide “promise-keeping, truth-telling, and the like,” moral maxims do not guide real agents in real life at all. “They do not guide us because we do not need to be guided. We know what to do” (ASIA, p. 106). Sometimes we do this without any maxims at all, or even against all the maxims we know. MacIntyre Illustrates his point with Huckleberry Finn’s decision to help Jim, Miss Watson’s escaped slave, to make his way to freedom (ASIA, p. 107). Once again, morality is not a “knowing that” but a “knowing how,” and the use of this “knowing how” cannot be reduced to making universalizable prescriptive judgments. MacIntyre’s rejection of Hare’s universal prescriptivism renewed his critique of modern normative ethics, and carried lasting consequences for the Marxist MacIntyre’s response to the moral challenge of Stalinism.

In the late 1950s Marxists throughout the world discovered the hidden atrocities of the Stalinist regime in the Soviet Union, and witnessed the violent suppression of the Hungarian revolution of 1956 (See Virtue and Politics, pp. 134-151). The crimes of the Stalinist regime, including mass murder, mass deportation, and the execution of the intellectual, political, cultural, and ecclesial leadership of subject national communities, demanded condemnation. Yet the moral criticism of Stalinist policies presented a problem to committed Marxist atheists, including MacIntyre, who had rejected theistic notions of divine law as well as modern secular notions of “natural rights.”

MacIntyre discussed the moral condemnation of Stalinism in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” I & II, (1958 and 59). For MacIntyre, it appeared difficult to condemn Stalinism with any real authority, because any appeal to modern secular liberal moral principle seems to be essentially arbitrary. The ex-communist, liberal critic of Stalinism “can only condemn in the name of his own choice” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 34). MacIntyre’s description of the moral perplexity of these critics of Stalinism resembles his description of Huck Finn a year earlier (ASIA, p. 106); they judged the crimes of Stalin well, but lacked any adequate way to justify their judgments rationally. In “Notes From the Moral Wilderness II,” MacIntyre proposed a new Marxist ethics of human action. Rather than divorcing “the ‘ought’ of morality” from “the ‘is’ of desire” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 41), MacIntyre’s Marxist ethics would look to “the fact of human solidarity which comes to light in the discovery of what we want” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 48).

MacIntyre’s Marxist writings of the early 1960s develop his ethical project. “Communism and British Intellectuals” (1960) argues that the Communist Party of Great Britain is no longer Marxist because it has abandoned Marx’s insight from the third of the Theses on Feuerbach. “Classical Marxism . . . wants to transform the vast mass of mankind from victims and puppets into agents who are masters of their own lives,” but Stalinism had transformed Marxism into the doctrine that scientists should use “the objective and unchangeable laws of history” to manage the behavior of society (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 119). “Freedom and Revolution” (1960) discusses “human initiative” in terms of “desire, intention, and choice” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 124), and sees the full development of human freedom to require participation in the life of a community: “The problem of freedom is not the problem of the individual against society but the problem of what sort of society we want, and what sort of individuals we want to be” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 129). The individual should not seek liberation from society, but through society. Morality has to do with one’s participation in the life of one’s community.

MacIntyre develops the ideas that morality emerges from history, and that morality organizes the common life of a community in SHE (1966). The book concludes that the concepts of morality are neither timeless nor ahistorical, and that understanding the historical development of ethical concepts can liberate us “from any false absolutist claims” (SHE, p. 269). Yet this conclusion need not imply that morality is essentially arbitrary or that one could achieve freedom by liberating oneself from the morality of one’s society. In his comments on Plato’s Gorgias in chapter 4, MacIntyre rejects Callicles’ claims that breaking social rules can be liberating. “For a man whose behavior was not rule-governed in any way would have ceased to participate as an intelligible agent in human society” (SHE, p. 32). Elements of SHE return in the histories of AV (1981) and WJWR (1988).

ii. Interim (1971-1977)

The publication of ASIA in 1971 marks the end of the “heterogeneous, badly organized, sometimes fragmented and often frustrating and messy enquiries” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268) that made up the first part of MacIntyre’s career, and the beginning of “an interim period of sometimes painfully self-critical reflection” that would end with the publication of EC in 1977.

ASIA is a collection of short essays criticizing ideology, contemporary religious practice, Marxist theory and hagiography, modern moral philosophy, reductive approaches to the social sciences, and modern liberal individualism. The essays in the book address most of the issues that would appear a decade later in AV, but they are not synthesized into a single coherent narrative “because,” MacIntyre explains in the preface, “to rescue them from their form as reviews or essays written at a particular time or place would require that I should know how to tie these arguments together into a substantive whole. This I do not yet know how to do. . .” (ASIA, p. x). As MacIntyre himself reports, he spent the interim period from 1971 to 1977 working to bring unity to his philosophical writing (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268-9). ASIA is a valuable companion to AV because some issues that are treated obscurely in the latter, for example Trotsky’s assessment of the Russian Revolution, are treated in detail in the former (AV, p. 262; ASIA, pp. 52-59).

ASIA’s final essay, “Political and Philosophical Epilogue: A View of The Poverty of Liberalism by Robert Paul Wolff,” introduces some of the most characteristic claims of AV: Various forms of modern liberalism appeal to different theories and principles for their justification. The theories that are used to justify liberal principles may serve as ideological masks that enable “those who profess the principles to deceive not only others but also themselves as to the character of their political action” (ASIA, p. 282). “American conservatism,” “American liberalism,” and “American radicalism” are all forms of modern liberalism, thus “To free ourselves from liberalism, radicalism is the wrong remedy.” Marxism cannot fulfill its promise to teach us how to transform society, but “we can at least learn from it where not to begin” (ASIA, p. 284).

In the Cogito interview, MacIntyre says that by 1971 he had begun to look to Aristotle as the right place to begin to study society in order to understand it and transform it. He “set out to rethink the problems of ethics in a systematic way, taking seriously for the first time the possibility that the history both of modern morality and of modern moral philosophy could only be written adequately from an Aristotelian point of view” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268).

For MacIntyre, “an Aristotelian point of view” sees teleology inherent in the natures of things, interprets deliberate human activity as voluntary action—not as caused behavior, and finds the human person to be naturally social. From this “Aristotelian point of view,” “modern morality” begins to go awry when moral norms are separated from the pursuit of human goods and moral behavior is treated as an end in itself. This separation characterizes Christian divine command ethics since the fourteenth century and has remained essential to secularized modern morality since the eighteenth century. From MacIntyre’s “Aristotelian point of view,” the autonomy granted to the human agent by modern moral philosophy breaks down natural human communities and isolates the individual from the kinds of formative relationships that are necessary to shape the agent into an independent practical reasoner.

iii. Mature Work (1977- )

In the Preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006), MacIntyre explains that the discontinuities of ASIA left him with the question, “How then was I to proceed philosophically?” MacIntyre’s answer came in the 1977 essay “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (Hereafter EC). This essay, MacIntyre reports, “marks a major turning-point in my thought in the 1970s” (The Tasks of Philosophy, p. vii) EC may be described fairly as MacIntyre’s discourse on method, and as the title suggests, it presents three general points on the method for philosophy.

First, Philosophy makes progress through the resolution of problems. These problems arise when the theories, histories, doctrines and other narratives that help us to organize our experience of the world fail us, leaving us in “epistemological crises.” Epistemological crises are the aftermath of events that undermine the ways that we interpret our world. Epistemological crises may be deeply personal, triggered by unexpected betrayal or by the loss of religious faith or ideological commitment, or they may be highly speculative, brought on by the failure of trusted theories to explain our experience. To live in an epistemological crisis is to be aware that one does not know what one thought one knew about some particular subject and to be anxious to recover certainty about that subject.

To resolve an epistemological crisis it is not enough to impose some new way of interpreting our experience, we also need to understand why we were wrong before: “When an epistemological crisis is resolved, it is by the construction of a new narrative which enables the agent to understand both how he or she could intelligibly have held his or her original beliefs and how he or she could have been so drastically misled by them” (EC, in The Tasks of Philosophy, p. 5). The resolution of the crisis may lead one to recognize that human understanding is always incomplete and that progress in enquiry is therefore open ended. For MacIntyre, the resolution of an epistemological crisis cannot promise the neat clarity of a shift from a failed body of theory to a truthful one.

To illustrate his position on the open-endedness of enquiry, MacIntyre compares the title characters of Shakespeare’s Hamlet and Jane Austen’s Emma. When Emma finds that she is deeply misled in her beliefs about the other characters in her story, Mr. Knightly helps her to learn the truth and the story comes to a happy ending (p. 6). Hamlet, by contrast, finds no pat answers to his questions; rival interpretations remain throughout the play, so that directors who would stage the play have to impose their own interpretations on the script (p. 5). MacIntyre notes, “Philosophers have customarily been Emmas and not Hamlets” (p. 6); that is, philosophers have treated their conclusions as accomplished truths, rather than as “more adequate narratives” (p. 7) that remain open to further improvement.

The second point of EC addresses the relationship between narratives, truth, and education. The traditional education of children begins in myth, and as children mature they learn to distinguish the lessons of these stories from the fictional events, the truths from the myths. In the course of this education, however, the student grows to respect the myths as bearers of truth. The student who grows through this kind of education to become a scholar “may become . . . a Vico or a Hamann” (p. 8. Johann Georg Hamaan (1730-1788), Giambattista Vico (1668-1744)). Another approach to education is the method of Descartes, who begins by rejecting everything that is not clearly and distinctly true as unreliable and false in order to rebuild his understanding of the world on a foundation of undeniable truth.

Ironically, in the process of rejecting myth, Descartes creates a narrative that is not only mythical but profoundly false. Rather than identifying specific areas of crisis in which he had lost confidence in his understanding of the world and situating himself within the tradition that has formed his understanding and his enquiry, Descartes presents himself as willfully rejecting everything he had believed, and ignores his obvious debts to the Scholastic tradition, even as he argues his case in French and Latin. For MacIntyre, seeking epistemological certainty through universal doubt as a precondition for enquiry is a mistake: “it is an invitation not to philosophy but to mental breakdown, or rather to philosophy as a means of mental breakdown.” David Hume’s cry of pain in his Treatise of Human Nature is the outcome of this kind of philosophical practice (EC, pp. 10-11). MacIntyre contrasts Descartes’ descent into mythical isolation with Galileo, who was able to make progress in astronomy and physics by struggling with the apparently insoluble questions of late medieval astronomy and physics, and radically reinterpreting the issues that constituted those questions.

To make progress in philosophy one must sort through the narratives that inform one’s understanding, struggle with the questions that those narratives raise, and on occasion, reject, replace, or reinterpret portions of those narratives and propose those changes to the rest of one’s community for assessment. Human enquiry is always situated within the history and life of a community. There is no alternative ahistorical, non-traditional way to make progress in human enquiry. MacIntyre returns to this theme in WJWR (chapters 17, 18, 19), in 3RV, and in his Aquinas Lecture, “First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues” (1990).

The third point of EC is that we can learn about progress in philosophy from the philosophy of science. In particular, “Kuhn’s work criticized provides an illuminating application for the ideas which I have been defending” (EC, p. 15) Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions had argued that scientists practice normal science according to the norms of paradigms or “disciplinary matrices.” Scientific revolutions occur when scientists abandon one paradigm for another. Kuhn’s “paradigm shifts,” however, are unlike MacIntyre’s resolutions of epistemological crises in two ways. First they are not rational responses to specific problems. Kuhn compares paradigm shifts to religious conversions (pp. 150, 151, 158), stressing that they are not guided by rational norms and he claims that the “mopping up” phase of a paradigm shift is a matter of convention in the training of new scientists and attrition among the holdouts of the previous paradigm (Kuhn, pp. 152, 159). Second, the new paradigm is treated as a closed system of belief that regulates a new period of “normal science”; Kuhn’s revolutionary scientists are Emmas, not Hamlets.

MacIntyre takes Kuhn’s position as a restatement of Michael Polyani’s theory that “reason operates only within traditions and communities,” so that transitions between traditions or reconstructions of failed traditions must be irrational (EC, p. 16).  On Kuhn’s account, “scientific revolutions are epistemological crises understood in a Cartesian way. Everything is put in question simultaneously” (EC, p. 17).

MacIntyre proposes elements of Imre Lakatos’ philosophy of science as correctives to Kuhn’s. While Lakatos has his own shortcomings, his general account of the methodologies of scientific research programs recognizes the role of reason in the transitions between theories and between research programs (Lakatos’ analog to Kuhn’s paradigms or disciplinary matrices). Lakatos presents science as an open ended enquiry, in which every theory may eventually be replaced by more adequate theories. For Lakatos, unlike Kuhn, rational scientific progress occurs when a new theory can account both for the apparent promise and for the actual failure of the theory it replaces. The third conclusion of MacIntyre’s essay is that decisions to support some theories over others may be justified rationally to the extent that those theories allow us to understand our experience and our history, including the history of the failures of inadequate theories. EC answers the question that arose from ASIA of how to proceed philosophically. All of MacIntyre’s mature work uses and develops the methodology presented in this essay.

4. Major works since 1977

a. After Virtue

AV (1981, 2nd ed. 1984, 3rd ed. 2007) applies the methodology of EC to many of the same issues addressed in ASIA and in SHE, but interprets the history of ethics and the failure of modern moral philosophy in Aristotelian terms. For Aristotle, moral philosophy is a study of practical reasoning, and the excellences or virtues that Aristotle recommends in the Nicomachean Ethics are the intellectual and moral excellences that make a moral agent effective as an independent practical reasoner. AV criticizes modern liberal individualism and scientific determinism for separating practical reasoning from morality and political life; it proposes instead a return to Aristotelian ethics and politics.

i. Critical Argument of AV

The critical argument of AV, which makes up the first half of the book, begins by examining the current condition of secular moral and political discourse. MacIntyre finds contending parties defending their decisions by appealing to abstract moral principles, but he finds their appeals eclectic, inconsistent, and incoherent.  MacIntyre also finds that the contending parties have little interest in the rational justification of the principles they use. The language of moral philosophy has become a kind of moral rhetoric to be used to manipulate others in defense of the arbitrary choices of its users. What Stevenson had said incorrectly about the meaning of moral judgments has come to be true of the use of moral judgments. MacIntyre reinterprets “emotivism,” Stevenson’s “false theory of meaning” as a “cogent theory of use,” and he names the culture that uses moral rhetoric pragmatically and syncretically “the culture of emotivism.”

MacIntyre traces the lineage of the culture of emotivism to the secularized Protestant cultures of northern Europe (AV, p. 37). These cultures had abandoned any connection between an agent’s natural telos, personal desires, or pursuit of goods and that same agent’s moral duties when they had adopted the divine command moralities of fourteenth, fifteenth, and sixteenth century Christian moral theology. The secular moral philosophers of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries shared strong and extensive agreements about the content of morality (AV, p. 51) and believed that their moral philosophy could justify the demands of their morality rationally, free from religious authority.

Modern moral philosophy had thus set for itself an incoherent goal. It was to vindicate both the moral autonomy of the individual and the objectivity, necessity, and categorical character of the rules of morality (AV, p. 62). MacIntyre surveys the best efforts to achieve the goals of modern moral philosophy but dismisses each one as a moral fiction.

Given the failure of modern moral philosophy, MacIntyre turns to an apparent alternative, the pragmatic expertise of professional managers. Managers are expected to appeal to the facts to make their decisions on the objective basis of effectiveness, and their authority to do this is based on their knowledge of the social sciences. An examination of the social sciences reveals, however, that many of the facts to which managers appeal depend on sociological theories that lack scientific status. Thus, the predictions and demands of bureaucratic managers are no less liable to ideological manipulation than the determinations of modern moral philosophers.

If modern morality has been revealed to be “a theater of illusions,” then we must reject it, and this rejection can take two forms. Either we follow Nietzsche and defend the autonomy of the individual against the arbitrary demands of conventional moral reasoning, or we reject both moral autonomy and arbitrary conventional moral reasoning to follow Aristotle and investigate practical reason and the role of moral formation in preparing the human agent to succeed as an independent practical reasoner.

The critical argument of AV raises serious questions about the rational justification of modern moral philosophy, and it also proposes an explanation for the rational failure of modern moral philosophy: Modern moral philosophy separates moral reasoning about duties and obligations from practical reasoning about ends and practical deliberation about the means to one’s ends, and in doing so it separates morality from practice. Kant separates moral and practical reasoning explicitly in The Critique of Pure Reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A800/B828–A819/B847) and in The Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (First Section, pp. 393-405.); Mill makes the same separation in Utilitarianism (chapter 2).

MacIntyre compares the separation of morality from practice or the separation of moral reasoning from practical reasoning in modern moral philosophy to the separation of morality from practice in Polynesian taboo. The Polynesians had lost the practical justifications for their well-established moral customs by the time they first made contact with European explorers; so when they told these visitors that certain practices were forbidden because those practices were “taboo,” they were unable to explain why these practices were forbidden or what, precisely, “taboo” meant. Many Europeans also lost the practical justifications for their moral norms as they approached modernity; for these Europeans, claiming that certain practices are “immoral,” and invoking Kant’s categorical imperative or Mill’s principle of utility to explain why those practices are immoral, seems no more adequate than the Polynesian appeal to taboo. The comparison between modern morality and taboo is a recurring theme in MacIntyre’s ethical work.

MacIntyre’s critique of the separation of morality from practice also draws on his criticism of determinist social science. Practice involves free and deliberate human action, while morality divorced from practice regulates only outward human behavior. Determinist social scientists, notably Stalinists but also behaviorists like W.V. Quine, viewed human behaviors as determined responses to various kinds of causal factors, and refused to examine the things people do in terms of “intentions, purposes, and reasons for action” (Quine, quoted in AV, p. 83). Instead, determinist social scientists sought “law-like generalizations” about the connections of these causes to their behavioral effects, which would enable them to predict human behavior, and bring scientific understanding to the work of organizational management (AV, pp. 88–91).

ii. The Constructive Argument of AV

In the second half of AV, MacIntyre explores the moral tradition that examines human judgment, human weakness, and excellence in human action. The constructive argument of the second half of the book begins with traditional accounts of the excellences or virtues of practical reasoning and practical rationality rather than virtues of moral reasoning or morality. These traditional accounts define virtue as arête, as excellence, and all of the definitions offered in the second half of AV describe the excellence of the human agent who judges well and acts effectively in pursuit of desired ends. MacIntyre sifts these definitions and then gives his own definition of virtue, as excellence in human agency, in terms of practices, whole human lives, and traditions in chapters 14 and 15 of AV.

In the most often quoted sentence of AV, MacIntyre defines a practice as (1) a complex social activity that (2) enables participants to gain goods internal to the practice. (3) Participants achieve excellence in practices by gaining the internal goods. When participants achieve excellence, (4) the social understandings of excellence in the practice, of the goods of the practice, and of the possibility of achieving excellence in the practice “are systematically extended” (AV, p. 187).

Practices, like chess, medicine, architecture, mechanical engineering, football, or politics, offer their practitioners a variety of goods both internal and external to these practices. The goods internal to practices include forms of understanding or physical abilities that can be acquired only by pursuing excellence in the associated practice. Goods external to practices include wealth, fame, prestige, and power; there are many ways to gain these external goods. They can be earned or purchased, either honestly or through deception; thus the pursuit of these external goods may conflict with the pursuit of the goods internal to practices.

MacIntyre illustrates the conflict between the pursuits of internal and external goods in the parable of the chess playing child. An intelligent child is given the opportunity to win candy by learning to play chess. As long as the child plays chess only to win candy, he has every reason to cheat if by doing so he can win more candy. If the child begins to desire and pursue the goods internal to chess, however, cheating becomes irrational, because it is impossible to gain the goods internal to chess or any other practice except through an honest pursuit of excellence. Goods external to practices may nevertheless remain tempting to the practitioner.

Practices are supported by institutions like chess clubs, hospitals, universities, industrial corporations, sports leagues, and political organizations. Practices exist in tension with these institutions, since the institutions tend to be oriented to goods external to practices. Universities, hospitals, and scholarly societies may value prestige, profitability, or relations with political interest groups above excellence in the practices they are said to support.

Personal desires and institutional pressures to pursue external goods may threaten to derail practitioners’ pursuits of the goods internal to practices. MacIntyre defines virtue initially as the quality of character that enables an agent to overcome these temptations: “A virtue is an acquired human quality the possession and exercise of which tends to enable us to achieve those goods which are internal to practices and the lack of which effectively prevents us from achieving any such goods” (AV, p. 191).

MacIntyre finds that this first level definition is inadequate to describe an excellent human agent. It is not enough to be an excellent navigator, physician, or builder; the excellent human agent lives an excellent life. Excellence as a human agent cannot be reduced to excellence in a particular practice (See AV, pp. 204–205, and Ethics and Politics, pp. 196–7). MacIntyre therefore adds a second level to his definition of virtue.

The virtues therefore are to be understood as those dispositions which will not only sustain practices and enable us to achieve the goods internal to practices, but which will also sustain us in the relevant kind of quest for the good, by enabling us to overcome the harms, dangers, temptations, and distractions which we encounter, and which will furnish us with increasing self-knowledge and increasing knowledge of the good (AV, p. 219).

The excellent human agent has the moral qualities to seek what is good and best both in practices and in life as a whole.

The second level definition is still inadequate, however, because it does not take into account the individual’s response to the life and legacy of her or his community. MacIntyre rejects individualism and insists that we view human beings as members of communities who bear specific debts and responsibilities because of our social identities. The responsibilities one may inherit as a member of a community include debts to one’s forbearers that one can only repay to people in the present and future. These responsibilities also include debts incurred by the unjust actions of ones’ predecessors.

MacIntyre acknowledges that contemporary individualism insists that “the self is detachable from its social and historical roles and statuses” (AV, p. 221), but he illustrates his counterpoint point with three national communities in which contemporary citizens continue to bear the debts of their predecessors. The enslavement and oppression of black Americans, the subjugation of Ireland, and the genocide of the Jews in Europe remained quite relevant to the responsibilities of citizens of the United States, England, and Germany in 1981, as they still do today.  Thus an American who said “I never owned any slaves,” “the Englishman who says ‘I never did any wrong to Ireland,’” or “the young German who believes that being born after 1945 means that what Nazis did to Jews has no moral relevance to his relationship to his Jewish contemporaries” all exhibit a kind of intellectual and moral failure. “I am born with a past, and to cut myself off from that past in the individualist mode, is to deform my present relationships” (p. 221).  For MacIntyre, there is no moral identity for the abstract individual; “The self has to find its moral identity in and through its membership in communities” (p. 221).

Since MacIntyre finds social identity necessary for the individual, MacIntyre’s definition of the excellence or virtue of the human agent needs a social dimension:

The virtues find their point and purpose not only in sustaining those relationships necessary if the variety of goods internal to practices are to be achieved and not only in sustaining the form of an individual life in which that individual may seek out his or her good as the good of his or her whole life, but also in sustaining those traditions which provide both practices and individual lives with their necessary historical context (AV, p. 223).

This third, social, level completes MacIntyre’s account of the excellence of the human agent in AV.

iii. Aristotelian Critique of Modern Ethics and Politics

The remaining chapters of AV contrast MacIntyre’s Aristotelian notion of the virtues as excellences of character from modern notions of virtue as the quality of a person who obeys moral rules. These chapters also lay out some of the practical implications of MacIntyre’s Aristotelian project for contemporary ethics and politics. The loss of teleology makes morality appear arbitrary (AV, p. 236), separates moral reason from practical and political reasoning (AV, p. 236), and removes the notion of what one deserves from modern notions of justice (AV, p. 249). MacIntyre concludes that “modern systematic politics . . . expresses in its institutional forms a systematic rejection” of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues and therefore “has to be rejected” by those who commit themselves to the tradition of the virtues (AV, p. 255). In other words, those who approach moral and political philosophy in terms of the development of the human agent and the advancement of practical reasoning in the context of the life of a community cannot succeed in their task if they compromise their work by committing themselves to the arbitrary goals, methods, and language of modern politics.

At the end of the argument of AV, MacIntyre returns to the ultimatum of chapter 10, “Nietzsche or Aristotle.” Where Nietzsche intended his work as a critique of modern morality, Nietzsche in fact becomes the ultimate embodiment of the moral isolation and arbitrariness of modern liberal individualism. This fault remains invisible from a modern viewpoint, but when viewed from the perspective of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues, it is quite clear (AV, pp. 258-259).

Since “goods, and with them the only grounds for the authority of laws and virtues, can only be discovered by entering into those relationships which constitute communities whose central bond is a shared vision of and understanding of goods” (AV, p. 258), any hope for the transformation and renewal of society depends on the development and maintenance of such communities. Revolution cannot be imposed (AV, p. 238), although it may be cultivated. To wait “for another—doubtless very different—St. Benedict,” is to await a person who can unify communities that encourage moral formation in judgment and action.

iv. Criticism of AV

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian approach to ethics as a study of human action distinguishes him from post-Kantian moral philosophers who approach ethics as a means of determining the demands of objective, impersonal, universal morality. This modern approach may be described as moral epistemology. Modern moral philosophy pretends to free the individual to determine for her- or himself what she or he must do in a given situation, irrespective of her or his own desires; it pretends to give knowledge of universal moral laws. MacIntyre rejects modern ethical theories as deceptive and self-deceiving masks for conventional morality and for arbitrary interventions against traditions. For MacIntyre, the freedom of self-determination is the freedom to recognize and pursue one’s good, and moral philosophy liberates the agent, in part, by helping the human agent to desire what is good and best, and to choose what is good and best.

MacIntyre’s ethics of human action also distinguishes his later Thomistic work from the efforts of some twentieth-century neo-Thomists to craft a moral epistemology out of Thomas Aquinas’s metaphysics and natural law. AV argues that an Aristotelian ethics of virtue may remain possible, without appealing to Aristotle’s metaphysics of nature. This claim remains controversial for two different, but closely related reasons.

Many of those who rejected MacIntyre’s turn to Aristotle define “virtue” primarily along moral lines, as obedience to law or adherence to some kind of natural norm. For these critics, “virtuous” appears synonymous with “morally correct;” their resistance to MacIntyre’s appeal to virtue stems from their difficulties either with what they take to be the shortcomings of MacIntyre’s account of moral correctness or with the notion of moral correctness altogether.  Thus one group of critics rejects MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism because they hold that any Aristotelian account of the virtues must first account for the truth about virtue in terms of Aristotle’s philosophy of nature, which MacIntyre had dismissed in AV as “metaphysical biology” (AV, pp. 162, 179). Aristotelian metaphysicians, particularly Thomists who define virtue in terms of the perfection of nature, rejected MacIntyre’s contention that an adequate Aristotelian account of virtue as excellence in practical reasoning and human action need not appeal to Aristotelian metaphysics. Another group of critics, including materialists, dismissed MacIntyre’s attempt to recover an Aristotelian account of the virtues because they took those virtues to presuppose an indefensible metaphysical doctrine of nature.

A few years after the publication of AV, MacIntyre became a Thomist and accepted that the teleology of human action flowed from a metaphysical foundation in the nature of the human person (WJWR, ch. 10; AV, 3rd ed., p. xi). Nonetheless, MacIntyre has the main points of his ethics and politics of human action have remained the same. MacIntyre continues to argue toward an Aristotelian account of practical reasoning through the investigation of practice. Even though he has accepted Thomistic metaphysics, he seldom argues from metaphysical premises, and when pressed to explain the metaphysical foundations of his ethics, he has demurred. MacIntyre continues to argue from the experience of practical reasoning to the demands of moral education. MacIntyre’s work in WJWR, DRA, The Tasks of Philosophy, Ethics and Politics, and God, Philosophy, University continue to exemplify the phenomenological approach to moral education that MacIntyre took in After Virtue.

Contemporary scholars have defended MacIntyre’s unconventional Aristotelianism by challenging the conventions that MacIntyre is said to violate. Christopher Stephen Lutz examined some of the reasons for rejecting “Aristotle’s metaphysical biology” and assessed the compatibility of MacIntyre’s philosophy with that of Thomas Aquinas in Tradition in the Ethics of Alasdair MacIntyre (2004, pp. 133-140). Kelvin Knight took a broader approach in Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (2007). Knight examined the ethics and politics of human action found in Aristotle and traced the development of that project through medieval and modern thought to MacIntyre. Knight distinguishes Aristotle’s ethics of human action from his metaphysics and shows how it is possible for MacIntyre to retrieve Aristotle’s ethics of human action without first defending Aristotle’s metaphysical account of nature.

b. Two Books on Rationality: WJWR and 3RV

For MacIntyre, “rationality” comprises all the intellectual resources, both formal and substantive, that we use to judge truth and falsity in propositions, and to determine choice-worthiness in courses of action. Rationality in this sense is not universal; it differs from community to community and from person to person, and may both develop and regress over the course of a person’s life or a community’s history. MacIntyre describes this culturally relative, even subjective characteristic of rationality in the first chapter of WJWR (1988):

So rationality itself, whether theoretical or practical, is a concept with a history: indeed, since there are also a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice (WJWR, p. 9).

Rationality is the collection of theories, beliefs, principles, and facts that the human subject uses to judge the world, and a person’s rationality is, to a large extent, the product of that person’s education and moral formation.

To the extent that a person accepts what is handed down from the moral and intellectual traditions of her or his community in learning to judge truth and falsity, good and evil, that person’s rationality is “tradition-constituted.” Tradition-constituted rationality provides the schemata by which we interpret, understand, and judge the world we live in. The apparent reasonableness of mythical explanations, religious doctrines, scientific theories, and the conflicting demands of the world’s moral codes all depend on the tradition-constituted rationalities of those who judge them. For this reason, some of MacIntyre’s critics have argued that tradition-constituted rationality entails an absolute relativism in philosophy.

The apparent problem of relativism in MacIntyre’s theory of rationality is much like the problem of relativism in the philosophy of science. Scientific claims develop within larger theoretical frameworks, so that the apparent truth of a scientific claim depends on one’s judgment of the larger framework. The resolution of the problem of relativism therefore appears to hang on the possibility of judging frameworks or rationalities, or judging between frameworks or rationalities from a position that does not presuppose the truth of the framework or rationality, but no such theoretical standpoint is humanly possible. Nonetheless, MacIntyre finds that the world itself provides the criterion for the testing of rationalities, and he finds that there is no criterion except the world itself that can stand as the measure of the truth of any philosophical theory. So MacIntyre balances the relativity of rationality against the objectivity of the world that we investigate. As Popper and Lakatos found in the philosophy of science, MacIntyre concludes that experience can falsify theory, releasing people from the apparent authority of traditional rationalities.

MacIntyre holds that the rationality of individuals is not only tradition-constituted, it is also tradition constitutive, as individuals make their own contributions to their own rationality, and to the rationalities of their communities. Rationality is not fixed, within either the history of a community or the life of a person. Unexplainable events can occur that reveal shortcomings in a person’s rational resources, like the anomalous data that precipitate scientific revolutions in Thomas Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions or demand changes in research programmes in Imre Lakatos’ The Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes. Problems exposed by anomalous data or by conflicts with other traditions, other communities, or other people may prove rationally insoluble under the constraints that a given tradition places on rationality. Such events, when fully recognized, demand creative solutions, and it may happen that some person or group will discover what appears to be a more adequate response to those problems. To the extent that these new solutions are adopted by others and passed on to subsequent generations (for better or for worse), the rationality of those responsible for the new approach becomes “tradition-constitutive.”

The possibility that experience may falsify theory distinguishes MacIntyre’s theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality from forms of relativism that make rationality entirely tradition-dependent or entirely subjective. Nonetheless, MacIntyre denies that such falsification is common (WJWR, chs. 18 and 19), and history shows us that individuals, communities, and even whole nations may commit themselves militantly over long periods of their histories to doctrines that their ideological adversaries find irrational. This qualified relativism of appearances has troublesome implications for anyone who believes that philosophical enquiry can easily provide certain knowledge of the world. According to MacIntyre, theories govern the ways that we interpret the world and no theory is ever more than “the best standards so far” (3RV, p. 65). Our theories always remain open to improvement, and when our theories change, the appearances of our world—the apparent truths of claims judged within those theoretical frameworks—change with them.

From the subjective standpoint of the human enquirer, MacIntyre finds that theories, concepts, and facts all have histories, and they are all liable to change—for better or for worse. MacIntyre’s philosophy offers a decisive refutation of modern epistemology, even as it maintains philosophy is a quest for truth. MacIntyre’s philosophy is indebted to the philosophy of science, which recognizes the historicism of scientific enquiry even as it seeks a truthful understanding of the world. MacIntyre’s philosophy does not offer a priori certainty about any theory or principle; it examines the ways in which reflection upon experience supports, challenges, or falsifies theories that have appeared to be the best theories so far to the people who have accepted them so far. MacIntyre’s ideal enquirers remain Hamlets, not Emmas.

i. Whose Justice? Which Rationality?

WJWR presents MacIntyre’s most thorough argument for his theory of rationality. He summarizes the main points of his theory in chapter 1. In chapters 2 through 16, MacIntyre follows the progress of the Western tradition through “three distinct traditions:” from Homer and Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas, from Augustine to Thomas Aquinas and from Augustine through Calvin to Hume (WJWR, p. 326). The inhabitants of these traditions work to deepen, correct, and extend the claims and theories of their predecessors. Chapter 17 examines the modern liberal denial of tradition, and the ironic transformation of liberalism into the fourth tradition to be treated in the book. Chapter 18 reviews MacIntyre’s claims and conclusions concerning the tradition-constituted nature and tradition-constitutive power of human rationality. Chapters 19 and 20 explore the consequences of MacIntyre’s theory for conflicts between traditions.

WJWR fulfills a promise made at the end of AV: “I promised a book in which I should attempt to say both what makes it rational to act in one way rather than another and what makes it rational to advance and defend one conception of practical rationality rather than another. Here it is” (p. 9). To fulfill this promise, MacIntyre opens the book by arguing that “the Enlightenment made us . . . blind to . . . a conception of rational enquiry as embodied in a tradition, a conception according to which the standards of rational justification themselves emerge from and are part of a history.” From the standpoint of human enquiry, no group can arrogate to itself the authority to guide everyone else toward the good. We can only struggle together in our quests for justice and truth and each community consequently frames and revises its own standards of justice and rationality. MacIntyre concludes that neither reason nor justice is universal: “since there are a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice” (p. 9).

The thesis that rationalities and justices arise from the histories and traditions of communities sets MacIntyre squarely at odds with all modern philosophy, and particularly with the unacknowledged imperialism of any form of metaethics that would offer a neutral, third-party forum in which to adjudicate the practical differences between contending moral traditions by the peculiar standards of modern liberal individualism. The same thesis also appears to set MacIntyre at odds with the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas—traditions he claims to accept and defend—which make unambiguous claims about the universal nature, true reason, and objective justice. The book therefore has two tasks. On the one hand, the book relates the histories of particular rationalities and justices in a way that undermines the abstract universal notions of reason and justice that provide the foundations for modern moral and political thought. On the other hand, the book provides prima facie evidence

that those who have thought their way through the topics of justice and practical rationality, from the standpoint constructed by and in the direction pointed out first by Aristotle and then by Aquinas, have every reason at least so far to hold that the rationality of their tradition has been confirmed by its encounters with other traditions (p. 403).

In short, the book offers an internal critique of modernity, arguing that it is incoherent by its own standards, and it offers an internal justification of Thomism, holding that Thomism is rationally justified, for Thomists, by Thomist standards. Contrary to initial expectations, MacIntyre’s historicist, particularist critique of modernity is compatible with the historically situated Thomist tradition.

MacIntyre holds that his historicist, particularist critique of modernity is consistent with Thomism because of the way that he understands the acquisition of first principles. In chapter 10 (pp. 164-182), MacIntyre compares Thomas Aquinas’s account of the acquisition of first principles with those of Descartes, Hobbes, Hume, Bentham, and Kant. MacIntyre explains that according to Thomas Aquinas, individuals reach first principles through “a work of dialectical construction” (p. 174). For Thomas Aquinas, by questioning and examining one’s experience, one may eventually arrive at first principles, which one may then apply to the understanding of one’s questions and experience. Descartes and his successors, by contrast, along with certain “notable Thomists of the last hundred years” (p. 175), have proposed that philosophy begins from knowledge of some “set of necessarily true first principles which any truly rational person is able to evaluate as true” (p. 175). Thus for the moderns, philosophy is a technical rather than moral endeavor, while for the Thomist, whether one might recognize first principles or be able to apply them depends in part on one’s moral development (pp. 186-182).

The modern account of first principles justifies an approach to philosophy that rejects tradition. The modern liberal individualist approach is anti-traditional. It denies that our understanding is tradition-constituted and it denies that different cultures may differ in their standards of rationality and justice:

The standpoint of traditions is necessarily at odds with one of the central characteristics of cosmopolitan modernity: the confident belief that all cultural phenomena must be potentially translucent to understanding, that all texts must be capable of being translated into the language which the adherents of modernity speak to one another (p. 327)

Modernity does not see tradition as the key that unlocks moral and political understanding, but as a superfluous accumulation of opinions that tend to prejudice moral and political reasoning.

Although modernity rejects tradition as a method of moral and political enquiry, MacIntyre finds that it nevertheless bears all the characteristics of a moral and political tradition. MacIntyre identifies the peculiar standards of the liberal tradition in the latter part of chapter 17, and summarizes the story of the liberal tradition at the outset of chapter 18:

Liberalism, beginning as a repudiation of tradition in the name of abstract, universal principles of reason, turned itself into a politically embodied power, whose inability to bring its debates on the nature and context of those universal principles to a conclusion has had the unintended effect of transforming liberalism into a tradition (p. 349).

From MacIntyre’s perspective, there is no question of deciding whether or not to work within a tradition; everyone who struggles with practical, moral, and political questions simply does. “There is no standing ground, no place for enquiry . . . apart from that which is provided by some particular tradition or other” (p. 350). MacIntyre calls his position “the rationality of traditions.”

MacIntyre distinguishes two related challenges to his position, the “relativist challenge” and the “perspectivist challenge.” These two challenges both acknowledge that the goals of the Enlightenment cannot be met and that, “the only available standards of rationality are those made available by and within traditions” (p. 252); they conclude that nothing can be known to be true or false. For these post-modern theorists, “if the Enlightenment conceptions of truth and rationality cannot be sustained,” either relativism or perspectivism “is the only possible alternative” (p. 353). MacIntyre rejects both challenges by developing his theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality on pp. 354-369.

How, then, is one to settle challenges between two traditions? It depends on whether the adherents of either take the challenges of the other tradition seriously. It depends on whether the adherents of either tradition, on seeing a failure in their own tradition are willing to consider an answer offered by their rival (p. 355). There is nothing in MacIntyre’s account of the rationality of traditions that suggest that the superior traditions will vanquish inferior ones, or to provide any analogue to the modern, enlightenment, or Cartesian epistemological first principles that he rejected in his critique of the modern liberal individualist tradition.

MacIntyre emphasizes the role of tradition in the final chapter of the book by asking how a person with no traditional affiliation is to deal with the conflicting claims of rival traditions: “The initial answer is: that will depend upon who you are and how you understand yourself. This is not the kind of answer which we have been educated to expect in philosophy” (p. 393). Such a person might, through some process of reflection on experience and engagement with the claims of one tradition or another, join a tradition whose claims and standards appear compelling, but there is no guarantee of that. MacIntyre’s conclusion is that enquiry is situated within traditions.

WJWR is more than a restatement of the history from AV. AV had argued that an Aristotelian view of moral philosophy as a study of human action could make sense of the failure of modern moral philosophy while modern liberal individualism could not. Aristotelian and Thomist critics complained, however, that MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism, which sought its foundation in teleological activity rather than teleological metaphysics, remained open to the challenge that it was relativistic. WJWR advances the argument of AV in two ways. First, MacIntyre focuses the critique of modernity on the question of rational justification. Modern epistemology stands or falls on the possibility of Cartesian epistemological first principles. MacIntyre’s history exposes that notion of first principle as a fiction, and at the same time demonstrates that rational enquiry advances (or declines) only through tradition. Second, MacIntyre trades the social teleology of AV for a Thomist, metaphysical teleology. MacIntyre justifies this trade in terms acceptable within the Thomist tradition, and acknowledges that those who find Thomism irrational will find little reason to accept it (WJWR P. 403). This general conclusion remained troubling for Aristotelians, and particularly for those Neo-Thomists whose Neo-Scholastic tradition bore debts to the Cartesian tradition.

ii. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry

MacIntyre presented his theory of rationality again in his 1988 Gifford Lectures, published as Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990). The central idea of the Gifford Lectures is that philosophers make progress by addressing the shortcomings of traditional narratives about the world, shortcomings that become visible either through the failure of traditional narratives to make sense of experience, or through the introduction of contradictory narratives that prove impossible to dismiss. This vision of progress in philosophy is the same as that of EC, and WJWR, but the presentation is different. In this book, MacIntyre compares three traditions exemplified by three literary works published near the end of Adam Gifford’s life (1820–1887);  a bequest of Lord Gifford’s will funds the Gifford Lectures.  The Ninth Edition of the Encyclopaedia Britannica (1875–1889) represents the modern tradition of trying to understand the world objectively without the influence of tradition.  The Genealogy of Morals (1887), by Friedrich Nietzsche embodies the post-modern tradition of interpreting all traditions as arbitrary impositions of power.  The encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) of Pope Leo XIII exemplifies the approach of acknowledging one’s predecessors within one’s own tradition of enquiry and working to advance or improve that tradition in the pursuit of objective truth.  Of the three versions of moral enquiry treated in 3RV, only tradition, exemplified in 3RV by the Aristotelian, Thomistic tradition, understands itself as a tradition that looks backward to predecessors in order to understand present questions and move forward. Encyclopaedia, concerns itself only with present facts, and leaves the problems of intellectual history to others. Genealogy defends an historicist interpretation of the past to undermine what it takes to be irrational moral convictions in the present. MacIntyre argues that Encyclopaedists and Genealogists deceive themselves in their rejections of the method of tradition.

Encyclopaedia obscures the role of tradition by presenting the most current conclusions and convictions of a tradition as if they had no history, and as if they represented the final discovery of unalterable truth. In this sense, Encyclopaedia represents the epistemological “Emmas” of MacIntyre’s 1977 essay, EC. Encyclopaedists focus on the present and ignore the past.

Genealogists, on the other hand, focus on the past in order to undermine the claims of the present. The “Nietzschean research program” has three uses for history: (1) to reduce academic history to a projection of the concerns of modern historians, (2) to dissipate the identity of the historian into a collection of inherited cultural influences, and (3) to undermine the notion of “progress towards truth and reason” (3RV, pp. 49-50). In short, Genealogy denies the teleology of human enquiry by denying (1) that historical enquiry has been fruitful, (2) that the enquiring person has a real identity, and (3) that enquiry has a real goal. MacIntyre finds this mode of enquiry incoherent.

To provide an example of the incoherence of the Genealogical mode of enquiry MacIntyre turns to Foucault and begins by describing the “self-endangering paradox” Foucault—or anyone who would maintain and extend the Nietzschean research program—must face: “the insights conferred by this post-Nietzschean understanding of the uses of history are themselves liable to subvert the project of understanding the project” (3RV, p. 50). MacIntyre argues against each of the three Nietzschean uses of history, beginning with the denial of the fruitfulness of the study.

MacIntyre cites Foucault’s 1966 book, Les Mots et les choses (The Order of Things, 1970) as an example of the self-subverting character of Genealogical enquiry. Foucault’s book reduces history to a procession of “incommensurable ordered schemes of classification and representation” none of which has any greater claim to truth than any other, yet this book “is itself organized as a scheme of classification and representation.” In the light of its own account of history, it seems difficult to justify the claims of the book rationally. If historical narratives are only projections of the interests of historians, then it is difficult to see how this historical narrative can claim to be truthful.

Genealogical moral enquiry cannot make sense of its own claims without exempting those claims from its general critique of similar claims. Genealogical moral enquiry must make similar exceptions to its treatments of the unity of the enquiring subject and the teleology of moral enquiry; thus “it seems to be the case that the intelligibility of genealogy requires beliefs and allegiances of a kind precluded by the genealogical stance” (3RV, p. 54-55). Genealogy is self-deceiving insofar as it ignores the traditional and teleological character of its enquiry.

3RV uses Thomism as its example of tradition, but this use should not suggest that MacIntyre identifies “tradition” with Thomism or Thomism-as-a-name-for-the-Western-tradition. As noted above, WJWR distinguished four traditions of enquiry within the Western European world alone (WJWR, p. 349). MacIntyre uses Thomism because it applies the traditional mode of enquiry in a self-conscious manner. Thomistic students learn the work of philosophical enquiry as apprentices in a craft (3RV, p. 61), and maintain the principles of the tradition in their work to extend the understanding of the tradition, even as they remain open to the criticism of those principles.

Tradition differs from both encyclopaedia and genealogy in the way it understands the place of its theories in the history of human enquiry. The adherent of a tradition must understand that “the rationality of a craft is justified by its history so far,” thus it “is inseparable from the tradition through which it was achieved” (3RV, p. 65). To justify the claims of a tradition is to recount how the tradition has developed and understood those claims so far. To master a tradition is also “a matter of knowing how to go further, and especially how to direct others towards going further, using what can be learned from the tradition afforded by the past to move towards the telos of fully perfected work” (3RV, pp. 65-66). Tradition is not merely conservative; it remains open to improvement, and in the 1977 essay EC, it is Hamlet, not Emma, who exemplifies the traditional mode of enquiry.

MacIntyre’s emphasis on the temporality of rationality in traditional enquiry makes tradition incompatible with the epistemological projects of modern philosophy (3RV, pp. 69).

MacIntyre uses Thomas Aquinas to illustrate the revolutionary potential of traditional enquiry. Thomas was educated in Augustinian theology and Aristotelian philosophy, and through this education he began to see not only the contradictions between the two traditions, but also the strengths and weaknesses that each tradition revealed in the other. His education also helped him to discover a host of questions and problems that had to be answered and solved. Many of Thomas Aquinas’ responses to these concerns took the form of disputed questions. “Yet to each question the answer produced by Aquinas as a conclusion is no more than and, given Aquinas’s method, cannot but be no more than, the best answer reached so far. And hence derives the essential incompleteness” (3RV, p. 124). Thomas Aquinas, viewed as practicing the traditional mode of enquiry, is one influential practitioner within a tradition and his writings are contributions to that tradition, rather than collections of unassailable final conclusions. MacIntyre’s Thomistic responses to encyclopedia and genealogy in chapters eight and nine show that MacIntyre does not view the Thomistic tradition in particular, or the traditional mode of enquiry in general, as closed, static, or essentially conservative.

c. Dependent Rational Animals

MacIntyre’s Carus Lectures, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), put MacIntyre’s theory of rationality into practice to examine the conditions of human action and to argue that the virtues are essential to the practice of independent practical reason. The book is relentlessly practical; its arguments appeal only to experience and to purposes, and to the logic of practical reasoning.

DRA does not make metaphysical assertions about the human soul, or human dignity, or human rights, or natural law; it treats the human agent as an animal. “Human identity is primarily . . . bodily and therefore animal identity and it is by reference to that identity that the continuities of our relationships to others are partly defined” (DRA, p. 8). Like other intelligent animals, human beings enter life vulnerable, weak, untrained, and unknowing, and face the likelihood of infirmity in sickness and in old age. Like other social animals, humans flourish in groups. We learn to regulate our passions, and to act effectively alone and in concert with others through an education provided within a community. MacIntyre’s position allows him to look to the animal world to find analogies to the role of social relationships in the moral formation of human beings (DRA, pp. 21-28).

In chapter 8, MacIntyre turns to the moral development of the human agent. The task for the human child is to make “the transition from the infantile exercise of animal intelligence to the exercise of independent practical reasoning” (DRA, p. 87). For a child to make this transition is “to redirect and transform her or his desires, and subsequently to direct them consistently towards the goods of different stages of her or his life” (DRA, p. 87). The development of independent practical reason in the human agent requires the moral virtues in at least three ways.

As in his earlier writings, including his MA thesis, DRA presents moral knowledge as a “knowing how,” rather than as a “knowing that.” Knowledge of moral rules is not sufficient for a moral life; prudence is required to enable the agent to apply the rules well. “Knowing how to act virtuously always involves more than rule-following” (DRA, p. 93). The prudent person can judge what must be done in the absence of a rule and can also judge when general norms cannot be applied to particular cases.

Flourishing as an independent practical reasoner requires the virtues in a second way, simply because sometimes we need our friends to tell us who we really are. Independent practical reasoning also requires self-knowledge, but self-knowledge is impossible without the input of others whose judgment provides a reliable touchstone to test our beliefs about ourselves. Self-knowledge therefore requires the virtues that enable an agent to sustain formative relationships and to accept the criticism of trusted friends (DRA, p. 97).

Human flourishing requires the virtues in a third way, by making it possible to participate in social and political action. They enable us to “protect ourselves and others against neglect, defective sympathies, stupidity, acquisitiveness, and malice” (DRA, p. 98) by enabling us to form and sustain social relationships through which we may care for one another in our infirmities, and pursue common goods with and for the other members of our societies.

The book moves from MacIntyre’s assessment of human needs for the virtues to the political implications of that assessment. Social and political institutions that form and enable independent practical reasoning must “satisfy three conditions.” (1) They must enable their members to participate in shared deliberations about the communities’ actions. (2) They must establish norms of justice “consistent with exercise of” the virtue of justice. (3) They must enable the strong “to stand proxy” as advocates for the needs of the weak and the disabled.

The social and political institutions that MacIntyre recommends cannot be identified with the modern nation state or the modern nuclear family. Modern nation states, which MacIntyre characterizes as “giant utility companies” (DRA, p. 132) are organized to provide services, not to pursue a common good. The nuclear family is too small to allow the self-sufficiency required for the political community that pursues a common good (DRA, p. 133-5). The political structures necessary for human flourishing are essentially local. MacIntyre says, “It is . . . a mistake, the communitarian mistake, to attempt to infuse the politics of the state with the values and modes of participation in local community” (DRA, p. 142). Yet local communities support human flourishing only when they actively support “the virtues of just generosity and shared deliberation” (DRA, p. 142). To find examples of the kinds of local communities that support human flourishing, MacIntyre suggests investigations of “fishing communities in New England . . . Welsh mining communities . . . farming cooperatives in Donegal, Mayan towns in Guatemala and Mexico”( DRA, p. 143).

Coming to the conclusion that moral knowledge and understanding develops within, and is partly constituted by social relationships within particular local communities that require their members to commit themselves to the moral narratives and norms of those communities, MacIntyre finds himself compelled to answer what may be called the question of moral provincialism: If one is to seek the truth about morality and justice, it seems necessary to “find a standpoint that is sufficiently external to the evaluative attitudes and practices that are to be put to the question.” If it is impossible for the agent to take such an external standpoint, if the agent’s commitments preclude radical criticism of the virtues of the community, does that leave the agent “a prisoner of shared prejudices” (DRA, p. 154)?

In the final chapter of DRA, MacIntyre argues that it is impossible to find an external standpoint, because rational enquiry is an essentially social work (DRA, p. 156-7). Because it is social, shared rational enquiry requires moral commitment to, and practice of, the virtues to prevent the more complacent members of communities from closing off critical reflection upon “shared politically effective beliefs and concepts” (DRA, p. 161). “Moral commitment to these virtues and to the common good is not an external constraint upon, but a condition of enquiry and criticism” (DRA, p. 162). MacIntyre contrasts this account of social rational enquiry rooted in moral commitment to the standards of a community against Nietzsche’s notion of independence. In the light of the whole argument of DRA, MacIntyre’s conclusion shows, much more clearly than his remarks at the end of AV, why Nietzsche’s ideal of independence provides a poor model and a misleading guide for human flourishing.

d. The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1

In 2006, MacIntyre published two new collections of selected essays. Both volumes include valuable prefaces discussing the origin, importance, and intentions of each of the essays. The first volume, The Tasks of Philosophy, addresses the goals and methods of philosophical enquiry. It opens with EC, and MacIntyre’s remarks in the preface confirm the essay’s place as the starting point of MacIntyre’s mature work. Five more essays in the first part of the book explore the role of culture in our experience of the world, the problem of relativism, the mistake of ignoring the role of history and personal freedom in the development of individual character, the unity of the human person as an embodied mind, and the failure of modern moral philosophy.

The second part of The Tasks of Philosophy, “The Ends of Philosophical Enquiry” discusses the pursuit of truth. Chapter 7, “The Ends of Life, the Ends of Philosophical Writing,” treats philosophy as a professionalized outgrowth of the natural work of plain persons who struggle with ordinary questions about what it means to live well, or how laws have authority, or whether death has meaning (Tasks, p. 125). The literature of philosophy addresses questions like these, but whether philosophy can be fruitful for its reader depends on whether philosophers also engage those questions, or set the questions aside to focus on the literature of philosophy instead.

MacIntyre credits John Stuart Mill and Thomas Aquinas as “two philosophers of the kind who by their writing send us beyond philosophy into immediate encounter with the ends of life” (Tasks, p. 128). From their example, MacIntyre identifies three characteristics of good philosophical writing.

First, both were engaged by questions about the ends of life as questioning human beings and not just as philosophers. . . . Secondly, both Mill and Aquinas understood their speaking and writing as contributing to an ongoing philosophical conversation. . . . Thirdly, it matters that both the end of the conversation and the good of those who participate in it is truth and that the nature of truth, of good, of rational justification, and of meaning therefore have to be central topics of that conversation (Tasks, pp. 130-1).

Without these three characteristics, philosophy is first reduced to “the exercise of a set of analytic and argumentative skills. . . . Secondly, philosophy may thereby become a diversion from asking questions about the ends of life with any seriousness” (Tasks, p. 131). Third, philosophers’ serious professional enquiries into the writings of other philosophers regarding answers to the questions about the ends of human life may divert their attention completely from those same questions in their own lives.

MacIntyre illustrates this problem by reviewing the responses of Franz Rosenzweig and Georg Lukács to the decline of German NeoKantianism in the early twentieth century. Both Rosenzweig and Lukács abandoned the philosophical orthodoxy into which they had been educated, and in both cases, their abandonment of ideological NeoKantianism marked the beginning of their pursuit of the true ends of philosophy. Rosenzweig’s pursuit of the true ends of philosophy led to “dialogue without theorizing,” while Lukács’s work collapsed into Stalinist “theorizing without dialogue” (Tasks, p. 139). Neither Rosenzweig nor Lukács made philosophical progress because both failed to relate “their questions about the ends of life to the ends of their philosophical writing” (Tasks, p. 139).

To avoid the mistakes of Rosenzweig and Lukács, MacIntyre counsels his readers to remain attached to the questions that philosophy attempts to answer, so that their “beliefs about the ends of life” do not become “detached from the questions to which they are the answer” (Tasks, p. 139). MacIntyre’s recognition of the connection between an author’s pursuit of the ends of life and the same author’s work as a philosophical writer prompts him to finish the essay by demanding three things of philosophical historians and biographers. First, any adequate philosophical history or biography must determine whether the authors studied remain engaged with the questions that philosophy studies, or set the questions aside in favor of the answers. Second, any adequate philosophical history or biography must determine whether the authors studied insulated themselves from contact with conflicting worldviews or remained open to learning from every available philosophical approach. Third, any adequate philosophical history or biography must place the authors studied into a broader context that shows what traditions they come from and “whose projects” they are “carrying forward” (Tasks, p. 142).

Philosophy is not just a study; it is a practice. Excellence in this practice demands that an author bring her or his struggles with the questions of the ends of philosophy into dialogue with historic and contemporary texts and authors in the hope of making progress in answering those questions.

The three essays that complete the volume underscore the challenge MacIntyre gives at the end of “The Ends of Life and the Ends of Philosophical Writing.” These three essays approach the work of philosophy from the perspective of Thomism. Thomism, caricatured in one way by its twentieth-century promoters through deficient textbooks, misguided ideological projects, and abuse in Church politics, and in another by its detractors as an atavistic attachment to an obsolete worldview, has been increasingly marginalized since the 1960s. The three Thomistic essays in this book challenge those caricatures by presenting Thomism in a way that people outside of contemporary Thomistic scholarship may find surprisingly flexible and open; for MacIntyre’s Thomas Aquinas is caught up in the difficulties of the questions of the ends of philosophy no less than MacIntyre and other contemporary philosophers. All three essays return to the notion of enquiry as action. Setting aside the epistemological fictions that modern philosophers, including NeoThomists, had invented in a misguided effort to counter skepticism, MacIntyre defends Thomistic realism as rational enquiry directed to the discovery of truth.

e. Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2

Ethics and Politics (Hereafter E&P) is divided into three parts: “Learning from Aristotle and Aquinas,” “Ethics,” and “The Politics of Ethics.” Essays in the first part compare and contrast Aristotle’s philosophy with some renaissance and modern interpretations of it, examine the political context of Thomas Aquinas’s work on the natural law, and defend Thomas’s natural law theory through a critique of moral epistemology. Essays in the second part investigate the apparent problems of moral dilemmas and the real difficulties of determining whether and when it may be more reasonable to deceive or to lie than to tell the truth. Essays in the third part address the ways that rational enquiry can inform social life.

Two of the essays in the third part of E&P are particularly important to the development of MacIntyre’s thought. “Three Perspectives on Marxism” is the preface to the 1995 edition of M&C. The essay assesses both MI (1953) and M&C (1968), along with the economic and political conditions of 1995, and helps to map the consistency of his positions through nearly forty years of development.

“Social Structures and Their Threats to Moral Agency” expands and develops on the theme of compartmentalization that MacIntyre touched upon in AV (AV, p. 204). The essay examines social structures that encourage compartmentalization of one’s life and thus threaten the human agent’s capacity to recognize, judge, and do what is good and best for her- or himself, as a member of a larger community. MacIntyre considers “the case of J” (J, for jemand, the German word for “someone”), a train controller who learned, as a standard for his social role, to take no interest in what his trains carried, even during war time when they carried “munitions and . . . Jews on their way to extermination camps” (E&P, p. 187). J had learned to do his work for the railroad according to one set of standards and to live other parts of his life according to other standards, so that this compliant participant in “the final solution” could contend, “You cannot charge me with moral failure” (E&P, p. 187).

MacIntyre does not accept J’s relativist defense. J’s moral failure has nothing to do with his conscientious obedience to cultural standards; it stems from his failure to stand up as a moral agent. MacIntyre lists three characteristics of the self understanding of a moral agent. To be a moral agent, (1) one must understand one’s individual identity as transcending all the roles that one fills; (2) one must see oneself as a practically rational individual who can judge and reject unjust social standards; and (3) one must understand oneself as “as accountable to others in respect of the human virtues and not just in respect of [one’s] role-performances” (E&P, p. 196). J is guilty, not because he knowingly participated in the final solution; MacIntyre allows that J knew nothing about it and that his claim of innocence was sincere. J is guilty because he complacently accepted social structures that he should have questioned, structures that undermined his moral agency. This essay shows that MacIntyre’s ethics of human agency is not just a descriptive narrative about the manner of moral education; it is a standard laden account of the demands of moral agency.

f. God, Philosophy, Universities

God, Philosophy, Universities looks at the history of the Catholic philosophical tradition through its sources, its initial development through Thomas Aquinas, its decline into a silence that lasted from 1700 to 1850, its renewal in response to Pope Leo XIII’s encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) and its redevelopment in the twentieth century. This history returns to AV’s account of the relationships between practices and institutions, for the different parts of this history are marked by varying relationships between the practice of philosophy within the Catholic Church and the political, ecclesial, and academic institutions that have supported it. The Catholic practice of philosophy was left moribund when its practitioners bowed to institutional pressures in the transition from late medieval to early modern philosophy (God, Philosophy, Universities, p. 106). But this practice was resuscitated by the authority of the Church in 1879 when Leo XIII promulgated the encyclical Aeterni Patris. MacIntyre credits Pope John Paul II for redefining the Catholic intellectual tradition and its relationship to the teaching authority of the Catholic Church in the 1998 encyclical letter Fides et Ratio, and he recommends new research programs to help the Catholic intellectual tradition to make progress in the future.

5. The Main Themes of MacIntyre's Philosophy

a. The Ethics and Politics of Human Agency

What emerges from MacIntyre’s work is an ethics of human agency, in contrast to modern moral normative ethics and metaethics. The best summary of MacIntyre’s ethics of human agency is found in Kelvin Knight’s Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (Polity Press, 2007).

The epistemological theories of Modern moral philosophy were supposed to provide rational justification for rules, policies, and practical determinations according to abstract universal standards, but MacIntyre has dismissed those theories, not only in AV, but in every major publication of his career. Modern metaethics is supposed to enable its practitioners to step away from the conflicting demands of contending moral traditions and to judge those conflicts from a neutral position, but MacIntyre has rejected this project as well. In his ethical writings, MacIntyre seeks only to understand how to liberate the human agent from blindness and stupidity, to prepare the human agent to recognize what is good and best to do in the concrete circumstances of that agent’s own life, and to strengthen the agent to follow through on that judgment. In his political writings, MacIntyre investigates the role of communities in the formation of effective rational agents, and the impact of political institutions on the lives of communities. This kind of ethics and politics is appropriately named the ethics of human agency.

MacIntyre is sometimes categorized as a “virtue ethicist,” and AV is counted among the principle texts in virtue ethics, but this label may be misleading for MacIntyre. Virtue ethics developed as an alternative to modern moral theories. The purpose of the modern moral philosophy of authors like Kant and Mill was to determine, rationally and universally, what kinds of behavior ought to be performed—not in terms of the agent’s desires or goals, but in terms of universal, rational duties. Those theories purported to let agents know what they ought to do by providing knowledge of duties and obligations, thus they could be described as theories of moral epistemology.

Contemporary virtue ethics proposes an alternative to modern moral theory, but takes for granted that the purpose of ethics is to provide a moral epistemology. Contemporary virtue ethics purports to let agents know what qualities human beings ought to have, and the reasons that we ought to have them, not in terms of our fitness for human agency, but in the same universal, disinterested, non-teleological terms that it inherits from Kant and Mill. MacIntyre’s ethical project examines the virtues, but it is not a branch of moral epistemology.

For MacIntyre, moral knowledge remains a “knowing how” rather than a “knowing that;” MacIntyre seeks to identify those moral and intellectual excellences that make human beings more effective in our pursuit of the human good. MacIntyre’s purpose in his ethics of human agency is to consider what it means to seek one’s good, what it takes to pursue one’s good, and what kind of a person one must become if one wants to pursue that good effectively as a human agent. As a philosophy of human agency, MacIntyre’s work belongs to the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas.

Teleology and Metaphysics: From the beginning of his career, MacIntyre has pursued teleological practical reasoning, rather than utilitarian or deontological moral reasoning. The Project proposed in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” is a teleological project. “Freedom and Revolution” and “Can Medicine Dispense with a Theological Perspective on Human Nature?” are likewise teleological. AV criticized Christian voluntarism and divine command theory because it rejected teleological practical reasoning and adopted an arbitrary, legal model of moral reasoning. AV criticized modernity for secularizing the arbitrary, legalistic moral reasoning of Christian voluntarism.

The purpose of the constructive argument of the second half of AV is to renew teleological practical reasoning, but MacIntyre attempted to renew Aristotelian teleology while rejecting Aristotelian metaphysics. The teleology of AV, like the teleology of MacIntyre’s broader project since “Notes from the Moral Wilderness,” was to be a social teleology, discovered through reflection on experience. The social teleology appeared to have two advantages. First, it forestalled a host of objections that MacIntyre was involved in an arbitrary, atavistic project to return, whole cloth, to the world view of Aristotle including his views on the subjugation of women and “natural slaves.” Second, in keeping with the insight of Marx’s third thesis on Feuerbach, it maintained the common condition of theorists and people as peers in the pursuit of the good life.

MacIntyre grew to reconsider the adequacy of social teleology in the years following AV. In the Prologue to the 3rd edition (2007), MacIntyre reported that he had accepted from Thomas Aquinas that it was necessary to provide a metaphysical grounding for the social teleology:

It is only because human beings have an end toward which they are directed by reason of their specific nature, that practices, traditions, and the like are able to function as they do. So I discovered that I had, without realizing it, presupposed the truth of something very close to the account of the concept of good that Aquinas gives in question 5 of the first part of the Summa Theologiae (p. xi).

In MacIntyre’s subsequent Thomist works, principally WJWR (chapters 10 & 11), 3RV (chapters 5 & 6), his Aquinas Lecture, First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues, and “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture,” MacIntyre explicitly defends a metaphysical foundation for teleology.

In his ethical work, MacIntyre’s nonetheless continues to approach teleology primarily by examining the phenomena by which metaphysical nature manifests itself. DRA is a thoroughly Thomistic work, yet it is relentlessly practical in its argumentation. The book invites its readers to join that work of dialectical construction that might lead them to first principles. DRA does not assert the demands of substantive metaphysics; it invites its readers to discover them, whether they recognize them as such or not.

MacIntyre illustrates the need for a phenomenological approach to teleology in his two lectures on “Rival Aristotles” (in E&P, chapters 1 & 2). In these two lectures, MacIntyre examines two kinds of errors that Aristotle’s interpreters have made regarding knowledge of the human telos, and the role of that knowledge in practical reasoning. Certain renaissance Aristotelians, including Francesco Piccolomini, overstated the role of theoretical knowledge of the human good in practical reasoning (E&P, p. 14), and understated the place of character in Aristotle’s ethics. Certain contemporary Aristotelians, including Sarah Brodie, go to the opposite extreme, denying the need for knowledge of the good. MacIntyre avoids both misinterpretations. He holds that the human good plays a role in our practical reasoning whether we recognize it or not, so that some people may do well without understanding why (E&P, p. 25). He also reads Aristotle as teaching that knowledge of the good can make us better agents (E&P, p. 26).

b. Ethics and Politics

In the closely connected studies of ethics and politics, MacIntyre’s work is Aristotelian in the sense that it is a study of human action, the goals of human action, and the moral conditions that enable or hinder an agent’s recognition and pursuit of what is good and best. In keeping with his general approach to philosophy, however, MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism is phenomenological and historicist. AV does not define virtue in metaphysical terms as the perfection of nature (AV, pp. 148, 196). AV defines virtue in terms of the practical requirements for excellence in human agency, in an agent’s participation in practices (AV, ch. 14), in an agent’s whole life, and in an agent’s involvement in the life of her or his community (AV, chapter 15). This peculiar form of Aristotelianism, which MacIntyre described in the “Postscript to the 2nd ed.” of AV as “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277), remains controversial among Aristotelian and Thomistic metaphysicians.

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian concept of “human action” opposes the notion of “human behavior” that prevailed among mid-twentieth-century determinist social scientists. Human actions, as MacIntyre understands them, are acts freely chosen by human agents in order to accomplish goals that those agents pursue. Human behavior, according to mid-twentieth-century determinist social scientists, is the outward activity of a subject, which is said to be caused entirely by environmental influences beyond the control of the subject. Rejecting crude determinism in social science, and approaches to government and public policy rooted in determinism, MacIntyre sees the renewal of human agency and the liberation of the human agent as central goals for ethics and politics.

As an account of human action, MacIntyre’s projects in ethics and politics continue to pursue the goals of early Marxists, who had sought to reverse the processes of individualization and proletarianization that had undermined the solidarity and self-determination of workers during the industrial revolution. William Cobbett emerges as a Quixotic hero in AV because of his opposition to the dividing and conquering influences of individualism and industrialization.

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of “human action” examines the habits that an agent must develop in order to judge and act most effectively in the pursuit of truly choice-worthy ends. This examination demands a rich account of deliberate human activity encompassing moral formation and community life. Where modern moral philosophy seeks rational moral criteria to judge individual human acts without considering the subjective ends of the agent, MacIntyre seeks to understand what it takes for the human person to become the kind of agent who has the practical wisdom to recognize what is good and best to do and the moral freedom to act on her or his best judgment. In this way, MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of human action opposes the late medieval and modern reduction of ethics to the moral assessment of behavior.

MacIntyre rejected the determinism of modern social science early in his career (“Determinism,” 1957), yet he recognizes that the ability to judge well and act freely is not simply given; excellence in judgment and action must be developed, and it is the task of moral philosophy to discover how these excellences or virtues of the human agent are established, maintained, and strengthened. In this sense, MacIntyre’s ethics and politics continues the project of Aristotle, who wrote, “Neither by nature nor contrary to nature do the virtues arise in us; rather we are adapted by nature to receive them, and are made perfect by habit” (Nicomachean Ethics, 2.1 [1103a 23–25], trans. Ross).

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian philosophy investigates the conditions that support free and deliberate human action in order to propose a path to the liberation of the human agent through participation in the life of a political community that seeks its common goods through the shared deliberation and action of its members (DRA, ch. 8).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Marxism: An Interpretation. London: SCM Press, 1953.
    • Alasdair MacIntyre’s first published work argues for Marxist ethics and politics, criticizes Marxist social science, and defends Christian moral teaching that criticizes unjust social structures and encourages human agency.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Visions.” In New Essays in Philosophical Theology. Ed. Antony Flew and Alasdair MacIntyre. New York: Macmillan, 1955.
    • This is an example of MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgenstinian fideist philosophy of religion.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. "Manchester: The Modern Universities and the English Tradition," Twentieth Century, 159 (Feb. 1956): 123-9.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “The Logical Status of Religious Belief.” In Metaphysical Beliefs: Three Essays, by Stephen Toulman, Ronald W. Hepburn, and Alasdair C. MacIntyre. London: SCM Press, 1957. Reprinted with new preface, 1970. pp. 159–201.
    • This essay argues from the perspective of MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgenstinian fideist philosophy of religion that it is impossible to justify religious belief rationally. MacIntyre’s preface to the 1970 edition of the book condemns the essay’s “irrationalism as both false and dangerous.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Determinism” Mind, 66 (1957): 28-41.
    • This article criticizes determinism in the social sciences.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” I and II, New Reasoner 7 (Winter 1958–1959): 90–100; and New Reasoner 8 (Spring 1959): 89–98. Reprinted in The MacIntyre Reader, pp. 31-49 and in Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, pp. 45-68.
    • These essays are nearly indispensable summaries of the difficulties and goals of the Marxist ethical project that would lead to AV. MacIntyre asks, what rational justification can one give for the moral critique of Stalinism. He asks how we may develop an ethics that treats moral action and moral reasoning as human action and practical reasoning.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Difficulties in Christian Belief. London: SCM Press, 1959.
    • This small book discusses the problem of evil and other difficulties in Christian belief from the perspective of MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgenstinian fideist philosophy of religion.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. A Short History of Ethics: A History of Moral Philosophy from the Homeric Age to Twentieth Century. New York: Macmillan, 1966. Repr. New York: Touchstone, 1996.
    • This historicist account of morality and human agency through the history of the Western tradition lays out some of the elements of the histories that would follow in AV and WJWR but it lacks the Aristotelian teleology and virtue that define MacIntyre’s mature work.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “The Debate about God: Victorian Relevance and Contemporary Irrelevance.” In Alasdair MacIntyre and Paul Ricoeur, The Religious Significance of Atheism (Bampton Lectures in America delivered at Columbia University, 1966). New York: Columbia University Press, 1969. pp. 1–55.
    • In two lectures, MacIntyre describes Theism from the perspective of atheism. The first lecture discusses the struggle between Theism and the secular intellectual culture and the choices Theists made between a self-conscious cultural atavism that is irrelevant to secular culture and deistic forms of theism that become palatable to secular culture at the price of becoming empty. The second lecture discusses factors that have undermined the relationship between social life and morality in contemporary theistic morality.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Marxism and Christianity. New York: Schocken Books, 1968. Republished, University of Notre Dame Press, 1984. Revised edition with new Introduction, London: Duckworth, 1995.
    • In 1968, MacIntyre significantly revised Marxism: An Interpretation to reflect developments in his understanding of Marxism and of the role of Friedrich Engels in Marx’s move toward predictive social science. The Introduction to the 1995 edition, which is reprinted in Ethics and Politics, helps to explain the purpose of the book and its relationship to his mature work.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Against the Self-Images of the Age: Essays on Ideology and Philosophy. London: Duckworth; New York: Schocken Books, 1971. Republished, Uniersity of Notre Dame Press, 1978.
    • This collection of essays, including journal articles published as early as 1957, is divided into two parts. The first part criticizes Marxist literature and political practice. The second part criticizes modern liberal individualist ethics and politics. This book contains many of the components of AV, but lacks the Aristotelian theory that unifies AV.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Can Medicine Dispense with a Theological Perspective on Human Nature?” In Knowledge, Value, and Belief. The Foundations of Ethics and Its Relationship to Science, Volume II. Hastings-on-Hudson, N.Y.: The Hastings Center, 1977. pp. 25–43.
    • Arguing as an atheist, MacIntyre claims that absolute precepts of ethics do not require the existence of God, but do require teleology. The teleology that can justify absolute moral precepts must be social rather than individual, thus it is necessary to reject individualism and individualistic institutions. MacIntyre speaks of various kinds of histories presenting “human life as enacted narrative.” The essay is followed by “A Rejoinder” from Paul Ramsey and “A Rejoinder to a Rejoinder” from MacIntyre.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science.” The Monist 60, no. 4 (October 1977): 453–472; reprinted in Alasdair MacIntyre, The Tasks of Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, 2006. pp. 3-23.
    • As noted in the article above, this essay is MacIntyre’s discourse on method. It is reprinted in The Tasks of Philosophy. The preface to The Tasks of Philosophy explains the importance of this essay.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Utilitarianism and Cost-Benefit Analysis: An Essay on the Relevance of Moral Philosophy to Bureaucratic Theory," in Values in the Electric Power Industry, Kenneth Sayre, ed. Notre Dame and London: University of Notre Dame Press, 1977. pp. 217-37. Reprinted as "Utilitarianism and the Presuppositions of Cost-Benefit Analysis," in The Moral Dimensions of Public Policy Choice: Beyond the Market Paradigm, John Martin Gilroy and Maurice Wade, eds. Pittsburgh and London: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1992. pp. 179-94.
    • MacIntyre discusses the unacknowledged and uncriticized role of utilitarianism in modern bureaucratic organizations, particularly in the reasoning of the “bureaucratic manager,” who appears in AV as one of the characters of the culture of emotivism. This essay presents some of MacIntyre’s earliest comments on “compartmentalization.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Social Science Methodology as the Ideology of Bureaucratic Authority," in Through the Looking Glass: Epistemology and the Conduct of Inquiry, Maria J. Falco, ed. (Washington: University Press of America, 1979) pp. 42-58. Reprinted in Kelvin Knight, ed. The MacIntyre Reader.  pp. 53-68.
    • This essay is an illuminating precursor to the discussion of the social sciences in chapter eight of AV.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Corporate Modernity and Moral Judgment: Are They Mutually Exclusive," in Ethics and Problems of the 21st Century, Kenneth M. Sayre and Kenneth E. Goodpaster, eds. Notre Dame and London: University of Notre Dame Press, 1979. pp. 122-35.
    • This essay works out in greater detail MacIntyre’s treatment of the replacement of unified personal identity with role-playing and his interpretation of Erving Goffman, which play important roles in MacIntyre’s critique of bureaucratic individualism in AV.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory. 2d ed. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984. 3rd edition with new prologue, 2007.
    • This book makes two arguments. The critical argument in the first nine chapters of the book shows how the moral and political language of modern liberal individualist “culture of emotivism” has been transformed into a manipulative tool for social control. The constructive argument that makes up the rest of the book proposes the Aristotelian practical philosophy of learning to recognize and pursue what is good as an alternative to modern moral philosophy, proposes virtue, defined as excellence in human agency, as the moral goal for the renewal of culture, and argues that this culture of the virtues cannot be imposed through modern political means.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
    • As noted above, this book provides MacIntyre’s most extensive argument for his theory of rationality. He argues that there are justices rather than justice, and rationalities rather than rationality, but this cultural relativity in the conditions of human enquiry need not lead us to cultural relativism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Relativism, Power, and Philosophy.” In Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation. Edited with introduction by Michael Krausz. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989, 182–204.
    • This is a succinct statement of the problem of relativism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry: Encyclopaedia, Genealogy, and Tradition (Gifford Lectures). Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990.
    • MacIntyre’s Gifford Lectures digest the main points of WJWR in a shorter form using examples that make MacIntyre’s theory more accessible to general readers.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues. The Aquinas Lecture, 1990. Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1990.
    • This lecture, reprinted in The Tasks of Philosophy, is MacIntyre’s most explicit defense of his approach to Thomistic metaphysics.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Plain Persons and Moral Philosophy: Rules, Virtues, and Goods.” 1991 Aquinas Lecture at the University of Dallas. American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 66, no. 1 (Winter 1992): 3–19.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “My Station and Its Virtues.” In Symposium in Memory of Edmund L. Pincoffs. Journal of Philosophical Research 19 (1994): 1–8.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Moral Relativism, Truth and Justification.” In Moral Truth and Moral Tradition: Essays in Honor of Peter Geach and Elizabeth Anscombe. Ed. Luke Gormally. Dublin: Four Courts Press, 1994, 6–24.
    • This essay is an important, succinct statement of MacIntyre’s approach to relativism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken,” in Carol C. Gould and Robert S. Cohen, eds, Artifacts, Representations, and Social Practice: Essays for Marx Wartofsky (Kluwer Academic Publishing, 1994), reprinted in Kelvin Knight, ed., The MacIntyre Reader. pp. 223–234.
    • As noted in the article, MacIntyre explains in this essay the importance of The Theses on Feuerbach for his own career as a philosopher. Written later in MacIntyre’s career, and delivered at a gathering of “Marxists, ex-Marxists, and post-Marxists of various kinds,” this essay gives a valuable perspective on MacIntyre’s relationship with Marxist political thought.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Kinesis Interview with Professor Alasdair MacIntyre.” Interview by Thomas D. Pearson. Kinesis 20, no. 2 (Spring 1994): 34–47.
    • MacIntyre discusses his debts to Marxism, explains why financial management is not a practice, and answers some questions about his adherence to Catholic Christian teaching.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., and Kelvin Knight. The MacIntyre Reader. Notre Dame, Ind: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998.
    • Kelvin Knight’s “Introduction” places the 13 selections and 2 interviews into a helpful narrative. This book gathers some of the most essential texts for a through study of MacIntyre’s work, including “Notes from the Moral Wilderness,” “Moral Relativism, Truth, and Justification,” “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken,” the interview with Giovanna Borradori, and the interview for Cogito.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues. Chicago: Open Court, 1999.
    • Where moral philosophy textbooks typically begin with the decisions of the healthy autonomous adult as the subject matter for ethics, MacIntyre begins with vulnerability and dependence. We are vulnerable and dependent in childhood and in old age. Children must train and discipline their desires with the help of their communities if they are to achieve the relative autonomy of independent practical reasoners as adults. Adults must care for the young and old if they are to live out their lives in communities that take care of their old and young. This book is MacIntyre’s most complete statement of his moral philosophy.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C. Edith Stein: A Philosophical Prologue, 1913 - 1922. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield, 2006.
    • MacIntyre explores the practice of philosophy through a study of Edith Stein and of the people and problems that formed her philosophical context in the years leading to her baptism in 1922.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. The Tasks of Philosophy. Selected Essays, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • This collection includes EC, “Moral Philosophy and Contemporary Social Practice: What Holds Them Apart?” “The Ends of Life and the Ends of Philosophical Writing,” and seven other essays on the practice of philosophy. Three essays discuss Thomistic metaphysical realism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Ethics and Politics. Selected Essays, Volume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • A collection of some of MacIntyre’s best short works on ethics and politics. The book includes two essays on Thomistic natural law, “Moral Dilemmas,” “Three Perspectives on Marxism,” and “Social Structures and their Threats to Moral Agency.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., Paul Blackledge, and Neil Davidson. Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism: Selected Writings 1953-1974. Leiden: Brill, 2008. Published in Paperback, Chicago: Haymarket Books, 2009.
    • Paul Blackledge and Neil Davidson’s Introduction differentiates some of the strains in Marxist thought and practice in the 1950s and 1960s and connects MacIntyre to the Campaign for Nuclear Disarmament and the New Left. The 46 Marxist essays in the book reveal consistencies between MacIntyre’s earlier classical Marxism and his later Thomism. The collection includes “Communism and British Intellectuals,” “Freedom and Revolution,” and “Breaking the Chains of Reason.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture.” Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 84 (2010): 23–32.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Chapter 5, “Alasdair MacIntyre: The Illusion of Self-sufficiency’ in Conversations on Ethics by Alex Voorheve, Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Each chapter in this book is an interview with a contemporary moral philosopher.  Alasdair Macintyre calls Chapter 5 “the best short statement of my views in print.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. God, Philosophy, Universities: A Selective History of the Catholic Philosophical Tradition. Lanham. MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2011.
    • This book surveys the history of Catholic philosophical tradition, as a relationship between a practice and the institution that supports it.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., and Fran O'Rourke. What happened in and to moral philosophy in the twentieth century?: philosophical essays in honor of Alasdair Macintyre. University of Notre Dame Press, 2013.
    • This festschrift from the 2009 Conference hosted by Fran O’Rourke at University College Dublin in honor of MacIntyre’s eightieth birthday contains MacIntyre’s autobiographical lecture, “On Having Survived The Academic Moral Philosophy of the Twentieth Century,” MacIntyre’s response to the essays in the book, and some comments on moving forward in philosophy.

b. Secondary Works

  • Ballard, Bruce W. Understanding MacIntyre. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 2000.
    • This is a brief, basic introduction to MacIntyre’s philosophy from a professor who understands it.
  • Beadle, Ron and Geoff Moore. “MacIntyre on Virtue and Organization.” Organization Studies 27, no. 3 (2006): 323–340.
    • Ron Beadle and Geoff Moore’s groundbreaking essay on MacIntyre’s contribution to organizational theory has been cited widely In the Business Ethics literature and included in Sage’s four volume collection of the best papers in business ethics.
  • Beadle, Ron and Geoff Moore, eds. MacIntyre, Empirics, and Organization, special edition, Philosophy of Management 7 no.1 (2008).
    • The nine articles in this special MacIntyre issue of Philosophy of Management were selected “to illustrate both the range of empirical endeavors that might be animated by MacIntyre’s ideas and the variety of responses his work has provoked among social scientists.”
  • Bielskis, Andrius and Kelvin Knight, eds. Virtue and Economy: Essays on Morality and Markets. London: Ashgate, 2014.
    • This volume includes papers from the 2010 meeting of the International Society for MacIntyrean Enquiry hosted by Andrius Bielskis in Vilnius, Lithuania. Also includes MacIntyre’s essay “The Irrelevance of Ethics,” in which MacIntyre argues that courses in business ethics cannot solve social moral problems; those solutions demand moral formation in habits of justice, and no technical knowledge of moral arguments can make up for the lack of this moral formation.
  • Blackledge, Paul. “Morality and Revolution: Ethical Debates in the British New Left,” Critique 35, no. 2 (August 2007):  211–228.
  • Cunningham, Lawrence S. Intractable Disputes About the Natural Law Alasdair MacIntyre and Critics. Notre Dame, Ind: University of Notre Dame Press, 2009.
    • MacIntyre presents the problem of intractable moral disagreement as it has emerged in his writings since the late 1970s; eight scholars respond and MacIntyre replies.
  • Davenport, John J., Anthony Rudd, Alasdair C. MacIntyre, and Philip L. Quinn. Kierkegaard After MacIntyre: Essays on Freedom, Narrative, and Virtue. Chicago: Open Court, 2001.
    • Twelve essay by respected Kierkegaard specialists take issue MacIntyre’s interpretation of Kierkegaard, published in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy (1968) and in AV (1981). MacIntyre responds.
  • Franks, Joan M., O.P. “Aristotle or Nietzsche.” Listening 26, no. 2 (1991): 156–163.
  • Flew, Antony. “Psycho-Analytic Explanation.” Analysis 10, no. 1 (October 1949).
  • Flew, Antony. Review of Metaphysical Beliefs. The Philosophical Quarterly 8, no. 33 (Oct., 1958): 383-384.
  • George, Robert P. “Moral Particularism, Thomism, and Traditions.” Review of Metaphysics 42 (March 1989): 593–605.
  • Hauerwas, Stanley, and Paul Wadell. Review of After Virtue, by Alasdair MacIntyre. The Thomist 46, no. 2 (April 1982): 313–323.
  • Hibbs, Thomas S. “MacIntyre’s Postmodern Thomism: Reflections on Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry.” The Thomist 57 (1993): 277–297.
  • Hittinger, Russell. Review of After Virtue by Alasdair MacIntyre, The New Scholasticism 56, no. 3 (1982): 385–90.
    • Russell Hittinger wrote a peculiarly insightful book review that connects the achievement of AV to the frustrations of ASIA.
  • Horton, John, and Susan Mendus, eds. After MacIntyre: Critical Perspectives on the Work of Alasdair MacIntyre. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994.
    • This is a collection of essays critical of MacIntyre’s work.  It is of mixed quality.  MacIntyre responds.
  • Knight, Kelvin. Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre. Cambridge, UK: Polity, 2007.
    • Kelvin Knight interprets Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics in terms of action and agency, and shows how MacIntyre’s ethics and politics develop these themes. Kelvin Knight is respected internationally as a leading MacIntyre scholar.
  • Kelvin Knight and Paul Blackledge, eds. Revolutionary Aristotelianism (Stuttgart: Lucius & Lucius, 2008), special edition of Analyse & Kritik 30, no. 1 (June 2008).
  • Lutz, Christopher Stephen. Tradition in the Ethics of Alasdair MacIntyre: Relativism, Thomism, and Philosophy. Lanham, Md.: Lexington books, 2004.
    • This general introduction to MacIntyre’s theory of rationality provides a brief intellectual biography and examines the claims of MacIntyre’s critics.
  • Lutz, Christopher Stephen. “Alasdair MacIntyre’s Tradition Constituted Rationality: An Alternative to Relativism and Fideism.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 85:3 (Summer 2011).
  • Lutz, Christopher Stephen. Reading Alasdair MacIntyre’s AV. New York: Continuum, 2012.
    • This book situates AV in the larger context of MacIntyre’s career, summarizes and comments on the critical and constructive arguments of the book, and discusses the subsequent development of MacIntyre’s work.
  • Maletta, Sante. Biografia della ragione: Saggio sulla filosofia politica di MacIntyre. Rome: Rubbettino, 2007.
  • McMylor, Peter. Alasdair MacIntyre: Critic of Modernity. London: Routledge, 1994.
    • Peter McMylor traces MacIntyre’s development and explains his central theories from a perspective informed by sociology. This book is a valuable complement to philosophically centered readings of MacIntyre’s work.
  • Mitchell, Basil. “The Justification of Religious Belief.” The Philosophical Quarterly 11, No. 44 (Jul., 1961):  213–226.
  • Murphy, Mark C. ed. Alasdair MacIntyre. Contemporary Philosophy in Focus. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • Seven excellent essays from respected authors combine to draw a very good picture of the whole project. This is a valuable reference.
  • Nicholas, Jeffery L. Reason, Tradition, and the Good: MacIntyre’s Tradition-Constituted Reason and Frankfurt School Critical Theory. Notre Dame, Ind: University of Notre Dame Press, 2012.
    • Nicholas parallels the concerns of critical theory and those of contemporary Aristotelians and Thomists; in so doing, he offers an opportunity to Aristotelians and critical theorists to engage one another.
  • Nussbaum, Martha Craven. “Recoiling from Reason.” Review of WJWR by Alasdair MacIntyre. New York Review of Books 36, no. 19 (December 7, 1989): 36–41.
    • Nussbaum’s review is a notable example of the nostalgia complaint against MacIntyre’s work on tradition. Her interpretation of MacIntyre is contrary to MacIntyre’s writings on at least two points. First, it disregards his continued rejection of fideism. Second, it treats tradition after the fashion of Burke, Polanyi, or Kuhn, as essentially conservative and essentially unitary. Compare to “Epistemological Crises” in Tasks, p. 16.
  • Perreau-Saussine, Emile. Alasdair MacIntyre: Une Biographie Intellectuelle. Presses Universitaires France, 2005.
  • Perreau-Saussine, Emile. “The Moral Critique of Stalinism,” in Paul Blackledge and Kelvin Knight, eds. Virtue and Politics. pp. 134–151.
  • Perreau-Saussine examines the problem and implications of MacIntyre’s struggle with the moral critique of Stalinism with illuminating insight.
  • Peters, Richard. “Cause, Cure, and Motive.” Analysis 10, no. 5 (April 1950).
  • Reames, Kent. “Metaphysics, History, and Moral Philosophy: The Centrality of the 1990 Aquinas Lecture to MacIntyre’s Argument for Thomism.” The Thomist 62 (1998): 419–443.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. “Knowing How and Knowing That: The Presidential Address. ” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. New Series, Vol. 46, (1945 - 1946): 1-16.
  • Scheffler, Samuel. Review of AV: A Study in Moral Theory [1st ed.] in The Philosophical Review 92, No. 3 (July 1983): 443–447.
  • Toulmin, Steven. “The Logical Status of Psycho-Analysis.” Analysis 9, no. 2 (December 1948).
  • Wachbroit, Robert. “A Genealogy of Virtues.” Review of AV [1st ed.]. The Yale Law Journal 92 (1983): 564–576.
  • Wachbroit, Robert. “Relativism and Virtue.” The Yale Law Journal 94 (1985): 1559–1565.
  • Wartofsky, Marx. “Virtue Lost or Understanding MacIntyre.” Inquiry 27 (1984): 235–50.
  • Zoll, Patrick. Ethik ohne Letztbegründung?: Zu den nicht-fundamentalistischen Ansätzen von Alasdair MacIntyre und Jeffrey Stout. Würzburg, Deutschland: Verlag Königshausen & Neumann GmbH, 2012.
  • The photograph of MacIntyre appears by permission of the London Metropolitan University.


Author Information

Christopher Stephen Lutz
Email: clutz@saintmeinrad.edu
Saint Meinrad Seminary and School of Theology
U. S. A.

Blaise Pascal (1623–1662)

pascal_blaiseBlaise Pascal was a French philosopher, mathematician, scientist, inventor, and theologian. In mathematics, he was an early pioneer in the fields of game theory and probability theory. In philosophy he was an early pioneer in existentialism. As a writer on theology and religion he was a defender of Christianity.

Despite chronic ill health, Pascal made historic contributions to mathematics and to physical science, including both experimental and theoretical work on hydraulics, atmospheric pressure, and the existence and nature of the vacuum. As a scientist and philosopher of science, Pascal championed strict empirical observation and the use of controlled experiments; he opposed the rationalism and logico-deductive method of the Cartesians; and he opposed the metaphysical speculations and reverence for authority of the theologians of the Middle Ages.

Although he never fully abandoned his scientific and mathematical interests, after his uncanny “Night of Fire” (the intense mystical illumination and midnight conversion that he experienced on the evening of November 23, 1654), Pascal turned his talents almost exclusively to religious writing.  It was during the period from 1656 until his death in 1662 that he wrote the Lettres Provinciales and the Pensées. The Lettres Provinciales is a satirical attack on Jesuit casuistry and a polemical defense of Jansenism. The Pensées is a posthumously published collection of unfinished notes for what was intended to be a systematic apologia for the Christian religion. Along with his scientific writings, these two great literary works have attracted the admiration and critical interest of philosophers and serious readers of every generation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Early Years
    2. First Conversion
    3. Worldly Reversion
    4. Second Conversion
    5. Final Years
    6. Miracle of the Holy Thorn
  2. Literary and Religious Works
    1. Provincial Letters
    2. Pensées
      1. Plan and Purpose of the Work and its Textual History
      2. Philosophical Themes
      3. Between Misery and Grandeur
      4. Critical Approaches and Interpretation
      5. The Wager
    3. Minor Works (Opuscules)
      1. Writings on Grace
      2. On the Geometric Spirit
      3. Discourse on the Passions of Love
      4. Discourses on the Condition of the Great
      5. Prayer on the Proper Use of Sickness
      6. Pascal’s Conversation with M. de Saci on Epictetus and Montaigne
  3. Mathematical and Scientific Works
    1. Conic Sections
    2. Experiments on the Vacuum
    3. Pascal’s Triangle and Probability Theory
    4. Infinity
    5. Solving the Cycloid
  4. Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge
    1. Philosophy of Science
    2. Theory of Knowledge
      1. Reason and Sense
      2. The Heart
  5. Fideism
  6. Existentialism
  7. Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and translations of works by Pascal
    2. Biographical and critical studies

1. Biography

 “Pascal’s life is inseparable from his work.”—A. J. Krailsheimer

Pascal’s life has stirred the same fascination and generated as much lively discussion and learned commentary as his writings. This is largely attributable to his intriguing, enigmatic personality. To read him is to come into direct contact with both his strangeness and his charm. It is also to encounter a tangle of incongruities and seeming contradictions. For Pascal himself – humble yet forceful; fanatical as well as skeptical; mild and empathetic, yet also capable of withering scorn – personified the very “chimera” he famously declared man to be (Pensées, 131/164).  [Note: Throughout this article, fragments of the Pensées are identified first (that is, before the slash) by the numeration system of Lafuma and second (after the slash) by that of Sellier – L/S.]

Interest in his life is also due to our natural desire to learn more about this “scary genius” , or effrayant génie – Chateaubriand’s memorable phrase, whose unique combination of talents enabled him to make revolutionary contributions not only to mathematics and  physical science but also to the theology and literature of his age. Merely to list his achievements is once again to encounter Pascal the “chimera,”— the human riddle who was both an avant-garde crusader for empirical science as well as an avid supporter of ancient prophecy, mysticism, miracles, and Biblical hermeneutics. Modern readers are usually shocked to discover that the father of gambling odds and the mechanical computer wore a spiked girdle to chastise himself and further mortify a body already tormented by recurrent illness and chronic pain.

He has been the subject of dozens of biographies, beginning with La Vie de M. Pascal, the brief hagiographic sketch composed by his sister Gilberte Périer shortly after his death in 1662 and first published in 1684.  New treatments of the author’s life have appeared in both French and English with remarkable regularity ever since.

Périer’s memoir established a precedent by applying an underlying pattern and symmetry to her brother’s life. The implied form is that of a well-made play with classic five-act structure. In Périer’s treatment this life-drama is a divine comedy showing the spiritual rise and eventual salvation of a distressed soul who, after a series of trials and setbacks, reunites with God. Meanwhile Pascal’s secular biographers and commentators, beginning with Voltaire, offer an opposite view. They portray Pascal’s career as essentially a tragedy, a descending arc tracing the decline into timidity and superstition of a once bold and independent thinker. Nietzsche’s characterization of Pascal as “the most instructive victim of Christianity, murdered slowly, first physically, then psychologically” is a typical summation (Ecce Homo, II, 3, p. 243).

Both views are oversimplified. First of all, at no point during his lifetime was Pascal ever a libertine or libre-penseur. So portraying his life as though it consisted of two sudden and powerful “conversions,” with an intervening slide into worldliness and sins of the flesh, seems a bit too pat and melodramatic. Similarly, since Pascal was a lifelong supporter of the Catholic faith, and since he also maintained an interest in scientific and mathematical problems well after his commitment to Jansenism and Port-Royal, it seems unfair to portray his final years as a betrayal of his scientific principles rather than as an intensification or culmination of his religious views.  Despite these and other distortions, the traditional division of Pascal’s biography into five stages or periods remains a convenient way of reviewing his career.

a. Early Years

Blaise Pascal was born on June 19, 1623, in Clermont (now Clermont-Ferrand) in the Auvergne region of central France. His parents were Étienne Pascal (1588 – 1651), a magistrate, civil servant, and member of the aristocratic and professional class known as the noblesse de robe, and Antoinette Bégon Pascal (1596-1626), the daughter of a Clermont merchant. Pascal was named for his paternal uncle as well as for St. Blaise, the 3rd-century Armenian saint martyred by having his flesh flayed by iron carding combs as his namesake would later punish his own flesh by wearing a belt studded with sharp nails.

The Pascal family, including Pascal’s older sister Gilberte (b. 1620) and younger sister Jacqueline (b. 1625), enjoyed a comfortable, upper-bourgeois lifestyle. Étienne, in addition to being a lawyer, public official, and tax administrator, was proficient in Latin and Greek, a dabbler in natural philosophy, and an expert mathematician. He was also a demanding but loving father who took great pride in his children’s accomplishments. Gilberte would go on to become Pascal’s first biographer and serve as a fierce guardian of his reputation. Jacqueline displayed an early literary genius and earned acclaim as a poet and dramatist before becoming a nun at Port-Royal. Pascal’s mother, who was known for her piety and charitable work, died when Pascal was only three years old and Jacqueline was but an infant.

Pascal was a sickly child who suffered various pains and diseases throughout his life. According to a family anecdote related by his niece, at age one he supposedly fell victim to a strange illness. His abdomen became distended and swollen, and the slightest annoyance triggered fits of crying and screaming. This affliction supposedly continued for more than a year, and the child often seemed on the verge of death.

Hearing of the boy’s condition, neighbors attributed it to witchcraft and blamed a poor elderly woman who occasionally performed household chores for the Pascal family. Étienne, as an educated gentleman, at first scoffed at the accusation, but when his patience eventually wore thin he confronted the woman and threatened her with hanging if she didn’t come forward with the truth. The woman reportedly fell to the floor and promised to divulge everything if her life would be spared. She confessed that in a moment of anger and resentment she had cast a spell on the child – a fatal spell that could be undone only by having it transferred to some other living creature. Supposedly the family cat was given to her and made a scapegoat for the otherwise doomed child. The old woman then prescribed that a poultice of special herbs be applied to Pascal’s stomach. After an intense crisis, during which he appeared to be comatose and close to death, Pascal awoke from his “spell” and eventually recovered his health.

This strange and improbable “witch” tale is scarcely credible today. But that Pascal endured a serious and potentially fatal childhood illness during which his parents desperately tried all kinds of fanciful cures and treatments seems very likely. In fact, the anecdote is perfectly consistent with the wild and paradoxical world of 17th_ century culture and especially the medical practice of the time – a time when empirical science and natural magic, enlightened new techniques and antique superstitions, were routinely intermingled and practiced side by side.

The exact cause and basis of Pascal’s lifelong health problems have never been fully settled or accounted for. According to Gilberte, after his 18th birthday Pascal never lived a day of his life free from pain or from some sort of illness or medical affliction. The most common medical opinion is that he contracted gastrointestinal tuberculosis in early childhood and that manifestations of the disease, along with signs of possible concurrent nephritis or rheumatoid arthritis, recurred periodically throughout his lifetime. The accounts of his pathology are also consistent with migraine, irritable bowel syndrome, and fibromyalgia – a complex of illnesses often found together and which also frequently occur in combination with symptoms of anxiety, depression, and emotional distress.

Scholarly interest in this matter involves more than just idle curiosity and medical detective-work. The question of Pascal’s physical and mental health goes to the heart of desires to learn more about the conditions and circumstances that produce extraordinary genius. Affliction and disease, physical or emotional trauma, a natural disadvantage or disability have often served as an added motive or accelerator for high-level creative achievement. Examples abound – from the ancient legend of the blind and vagabond Homer to the documented histories of modern creative figures like Isaac Newton, Van Gogh, Stephen Hawking, and Christy Brown. We can only speculate whether and to what extent Pascal’s physical ailments and disabilities, instead of retarding his career, may have actually spurred and given rise to his intellectual triumphs.

In 1631, a few years after the death of his wife, Étienne sold his government post (a common practice of the day) along with most of his property and moved with his children to Paris. Over the next nine years he devoted himself to his amateur scientific and mathematical pursuits and took personal charge of his children’s education. Recognizing early on his son’s exceptional intellectual gifts, Étienne designed and supervised a special program and curriculum for the boy based on his own anti-scholastic and progressive educational principles.

Young Pascal was taught Latin and Greek as well as history, geography, and philosophy – all on an impromptu schedule, including during meals and at various hours throughout the day. Science, or natural philosophy as the discipline was then known, ignited Pascal’s imagination, and he demonstrated an early inquisitiveness about natural phenomena and a fondness for devising experiments. Civil and canon law were also part of a varied curriculum that included study of the Bible and the Church Fathers. The latter studies were in accordance with Étienne’s personal religious views, which were plain and respectful and as progressive as his views on education. He taught his son his own cardinal principle that whatever is a matter of faith should not also be treated as a matter of reason; and vice-versa. It is a tenet that Pascal took to heart and followed throughout his career.

In the belief that, once exposed to mathematics, his son would be so captivated by it that he would forsake or ignore his other studies, Étienne determined to withhold instruction in math and geometry until Pascal had completed the rest of his training. However, upon discovering that the boy had already achieved an intuitive understanding of the discipline including his own independently worked out demonstration of a proof in Euclid, Étienne acquiesced. The pages of Euclid were finally opened to the youth, and thus began Pascal’s belated introduction to mathematics – the subject with which he would conduct, at times guiltily, a lifelong love affair.

Pascal’s education was unique for his own time and would be unusual in any era. A passionate student who delved earnestly into each new subject, he absorbed new material, including, at a later period, the most arcane and technical components of theology quickly and effortlessly. However, his learning, while deep in a few areas, was never broad and was in some ways less remarkable for what it included than for what it left out.

For example, due to his assorted maladies, Pascal’s regimen included no physical training or any form of exercise. In addition, because of the sequestered, hermetic, entirely private form of his schooling, he never experienced any of the personal contacts or opportunities for social development that most young people, including even novice monks in monastic schools, commonly do. To what extent this may have deformed or limited his social and interpersonal skills it is hard to say. He was known to be temperamentally impatient with and demanding of others while sometimes seeming arrogant and self-absorbed. At a later point in his career, he fully acknowledged his deficiencies and indeed chastised himself for his social ambition and intellectual vanity.

Pascal was not widely read in the classics or in contemporary literature. Though he was well acquainted with Aristotelian and Scholastic thought, philosophy for him consisted mainly of Epictetus, Montaigne, and the traditional debate between Stoicism and Epicureanism. Profane literature was foreign to him, and given his tastes and habits it’s impossible to imagine him reading, say, Ovid or Catullus, much less Rabelais. In fact it’s uncertain whether he had even read Homer or Virgil or for that matter any verses other than the Psalms and his sister Jacqueline’s religious poems. As for drama, Corneille was a family friend who at one time personally championed Jacqueline’s poetry and dramaturgy, and the young Racine studied classical literature and rhetoric at the school at Port-Royal while Jacqueline and Pascal were also there. Yet Pascal never mentions the work of either great writer and indeed – other than to refer to the stage as a “dangerous diversion” (Pensées, 764/630) – seems to have taken little interest at all in contemporary French theatre, which was then at its artistic zenith.

But whatever he may have lacked in physical education, humanistic studies, and art appreciation, Pascal more than made up for in his favored pursuits. In fact, so rapidly did he advance in physics and mathematics that Étienne boldly introduced the boy at the age of only thirteen into his small Parisian academic circle known as the Académie libre. The central figure of this group was the polymathic philosopher, mathematician, theologian, and music theorist Père Marin Mersenne, one of the leading intellectuals of the age. Mersenne corresponded with Descartes, Huygens, Hobbes, and other luminaries of the period and actively promoted the work of controversial thinkers like Galileo and Gassendi. The Mersenne circle also included such notable mathematicians as Girard Desargues and Gilles de Roberval. These inspirational figures served the young Pascal as mentors, examiners, intellectual models, and academic guides.

It was during his involvement with the Mersenne circle that Pascal published, at age sixteen, his Essai pour les Coniques, an important contribution to the relatively new field of projective geometry. The essay includes an original proof concerning the special properties of hexagons inscribed within conic sections that is still known today as Pascal’s Theorem.

Around the same time that Pascal was working on his Theorem, Étienne, who had at one time served as an adviser to Cardinal Richelieu, incurred the wrath of the First Minister by leading a protest over a government bond default. Threatened with prison, he sought refuge in Auvergne. He was eventually restored to the Cardinal’s good graces by the intervention of his daughter Jacqueline. (The Cardinal, a patron of the theatre, was charmed not only by Jacqueline’s poetic and dramatic skills but also by her beauty and courtly manners.) It’s also likely that Richelieu had an additional motive for welcoming Étienne back. For no sooner was Étienne returned to royal favor than Richelieu appointed him the chief tax administrator for Rouen. At the Cardinal’s behest, the Pascal family moved from Paris to Rouen in early January of 1640.

Rouen was a city in crisis, beset by street violence, crop failures, a tax revolt, and an outbreak of plague. It was Étienne’s job to handle the taxpayer revolt, which he eventually managed to do by working with the local citizens and earning their confidence and respect. Pascal meanwhile seems to have been little affected by the change of scene and continued with his mathematical studies. He also undertook a new project. Impressed by the massive number of calculations required in his father’s work of accounting and tax assessment, he wondered if the drudgery of such labor might not be relieved by some type of mechanical device. Setting to work on the idea in 1642, he eventually conceived, designed, and oversaw the construction of what was presented to the public in 1645 as la machine arithmétique, later known as the Pascaline. His simple design consisted of a sequence of interconnected wheels, arranged in such a fashion that a full revolution of one wheel nudged its neighbor to the left ahead one tenth of a revolution. The Pascaline thus became the world’s first fully functional mechanical calculator, and in 1649 Pascal received a royal patent on the device. Over the next five years he continued tinkering with his design, experimenting with various materials and trying out different linkage arrangements and gear mechanisms. Nine working models survive today and serve as a reminder that Pascal was not just a mathematical Platonist absorbed in a higher world of pure number but also a practical minded, down-to-earth engineering type interested in applying the insights of science and mathematics to the solution of real-world problems.

b. First Conversion

On an icy day in January of 1646, Étienne Pascal, in his capacity as a public official, was summoned to prevent a duel that was to take place in a field outside Rouen. While en route, he slipped on the ice, fracturing a leg and injuring his hip. The family called in two local bonesetters, the brothers Deschamps, who moved into the Pascal household for a period of three months to care for Étienne and oversee his recovery. The brothers turned out to be members of the small, saintly community of Augustinian worshippers established at Port-Royal by the Jansenist priest Jean du Vergier de Hauranne, more simply known as the abbé Saint-Cyran.

The Jansenists (named for the Dutch theologian Cornelius Jansen) accepted the strict Augustinian creed that salvation is achieved not by human virtue or merit but solely by the grace of God. At Port-Royal they practiced an ascetic lifestyle emphasizing penance, austerity, devotional exercises, and good works. While treating Étienne, the Deschamps brothers shared their stringent, exacting, and somewhat cheerless religious views with the Pascal family. Pascal himself, along with his father and sisters, had never displayed much in the way of genuine religious fervor. They were good upper-middle-class Catholics, mild and respectful in their beliefs rather than zealous, neither God-fearing nor, to any extraordinary degree, God-seeking. Yet the ardor of the Deschamps brothers proved contagious. Pascal caught the fire and read with avidity the Jansenist texts that were given to him – sermons by Saint-Cyran along with doctrinal works by Augustine, Antoine Arnauld (Saint-Cyran’s successor), and Jansen himself. Gradually, with growing assurance, and eventually with complete sincerity and conviction, Pascal embraced the Jansenist creed. According to Gilberte’s account, he was the first in the family to convert to the new faith, and no sooner had he done so than he set about to convert the rest of family, first Jacqueline, then Étienne, and finally Gilberte and her husband Florin Périer. It should be added, however, that from Pascal’s own point of view he wasn’t so much “converting” to Jansenism, or any particular group or sect, as he was declaring or reaffirming his commitment to the true faith.

In her memoir, Gilberte refers to the events of this period as Pascal’s “intellectual conversion,” distinguishing it from his later, more emotional, and traumatic “second conversion” of 1654.  She also asserts that at this time Pascal formally renounced all his scientific and mathematical researches and ever afterward devoted himself entirely and exclusively to the love and service of God. This claim is inaccurate and indeed hard to fathom given that only a year later Florin Périer, Gilberte’s own husband, assisted in what is probably Pascal’s most famous scientific investigation, the celebrated Puy-de-Dôme experiment measuring air pressure and proving the existence of the vacuum. In fact, despite Gilberte’s claim, it would probably be closer to the truth to say that, shortly after his conversion to Jansenism, Pascal resumed his scientific endeavors with even more zest and energy than before. In the spring of 1647, partly on the advice of his physicians, he returned to Paris where he linked up once again with former colleagues and began organizing several new essays and treatises for publication. His supposed renunciation of natural philosophy and the bright world of Parisian intellectual life had lasted all of six months.

c. Worldly Reversion

Contrary to Gilberte’s account, most biographers have accepted the years 1649 -1654 as a periode mondaine in Pascal’s career – that is, as a time when he retreated from his pledge to serve only God and resumed to a significant degree the life of a gentleman-scientist.

It was not a period of debauchery and libertinism or anything of the kind. Although he showed an occasional weakness for silk and brocade and enjoyed the amenities of both a valet and a coach-and-six, Pascal did not become a salon habitué or even much of a bon vivant. He was simply a young man who sought the company of fellow experts, savored the spotlight of recognition for personal achievement, and delighted in the social world of learned conversation and sparkling intellectual debate. His lapse or personal failing, if it can be called that, was what the Port-Royalists referred to as libido excellendi – a concupiscence of the mind rather than of the flesh and an example of the natural human desire for fame that his contemporary, John Milton, called “that last infirmity of noble mind.”

Pascal’s companions during this period included such stars of the Paris social scene as Artus Gouffier, the Duc de Roannez, a former military officer, noted courtier, and amateur dabbler in science and mathematics; Antoine Gombaud, the Chevalier de Méré, a soldier, gambler, author, and paragon of honnêteté (more than mere “honesty,” this term connotes an entire code of conduct and the gallant, cheerful lifestyle of an independent-minded man of the world); and Damien Mitton, another champion of honnêteté whose name became a byword for debonair charm and colorful raconteurship. Several commentators on the Pensées argue that the work is directly aimed at the culture of honnêteté and that it specifically targets figures like Méré and Mitton, that is, persons who seek a life of virtue and happiness apart from God.

Shortly after his return to Paris in 1647 and during a turn for the worse in his health, Pascal reunited with his old circle of friends and fellow intellectuals and was also introduced into polite society. Descartes himself paid a visit (and according to reports wisely suggested that Pascal follow a regimen of bed-rest and bouillon rather than the steady diet of enemas, purgings, and blood-lettings favored by his doctors). The historic meeting between the two scientific and philosophical rivals reportedly did not go well.

Pascal’s new life in Paris was interrupted in 1648 by the outbreak of the Fronde, the violent civil clash that began as a power struggle between Chief Minister Mazurin and leaders of Parliament and which continued as a conflict between the crown and various aristocratic factions over the next five years. To escape the mob havoc and pervasive military presence in Paris, Pascal returned to Clermont along with his sisters, brother-in-law, and father. There he effectively inserted himself into the Auvergne equivalent of Parisian high society and resumed his temporary infatuation with la vie honnêteté. He returned to Paris in 1650, reconnected with his old friends, and began revising and polishing several scientific papers, including portions of a never completed or partially lost version of his Treatise on the Vacuum.

On September 24, 1651, Étienne died; he was 63. Pascal and Jacqueline were at his bedside. Gilberte was in Clermont awaiting the birth of a child who would be named Étienne Périer in honor of his grandfather. Pascal’s letter of consolation to Gilberte, preserved among his complete works, has disappointed some of his admirers due to its austere tone and cold Jansenist view of death (we should not grieve but rejoice at God’s will; the deceased is now in a better world; and so forth.). However, the letter includes a note of affection for the man who had taken personal charge of his education and who was the first to introduce him to the world of science and mathematics. Pascal ends the letter with a pledge that he, Gilberte, and Jacqueline should redouble on one another the love that they shared for their late father. A few months later, Jacqueline finally made good on her determination (long postponed in obedience to her father’s and brother’s wishes) to dedicate her life to holy service and enter Port-Royal as a nun.

In the summer of 1654 Pascal exchanged a series of letters with Fermat on the problem of calculating gambling odds and probabilities. It was also at this time (although many have doubted his authorship) that he completed his Discourse on Love. And according to at least two of his biographers (Faugère and Bishop) it was during this same period (1653-54) that Pascal himself fell victim to amorous passion and even contemplated marriage (supposedly to the comely Charlotte de Rouannez, his frequent correspondent and the sister of his good friend the Duke). On the other hand, Gilberte in her account of her brother’s life makes no mention whatsoever of a love affair, and the evidence that Pascal ever succumbed to romance or became a suitor remains sketchy at best.

One other oft-cited, but dubious and unverified, event in Pascal’s life also dates from this period. According to various sources, none wholly reliable, in October of 1654, Pascal was supposedly involved in a nearly fatal accident while crossing the Pont de Neuilly in his coach. His affrighted horses reportedly reared, bolted, and plunged over the side of the bridge into the Seine, nearly dragging the coach and Pascal after them. Fortunately, the main coupling broke and the coach, with Pascal inside, miraculously hung on to the edge and stabilized.

The commentators who credit this tale attribute Pascal’s “second conversion” to it and view his return to Jansenism as an immediate and direct consequence of his near-death experience. Sigmund Freud accepted the story and even used it as an example of how severe trauma can trigger an obsessive or phobic reaction. However, there is no conclusive evidence that the event ever happened.

d. Second Conversion

The crucial event of Pascal’s life and career occurred on November 23, 1654, between the hours of 10:30 pm and 12:30 am. Pascal lay in bed at his home in the Marais district in Paris when he experienced the religious ecstasy or revelation that his biographers refer to as his “second conversion” or “night of fire.” He produced a written record of this momentous experience on a sheet of paper, which he then inserted into a piece of folded parchment inscribed with a duplicate account of the same vision. This dual record, known as the Memorial, he kept sewed into the lining of his jacket as a kind of secret token or private testament of his new life and total commitment to Jesus Christ. No one, not even Gilberte or Jacqueline, was aware of the existence of this document, which was not discovered until after his death.

The text of the Memorial is cryptic, ejaculatory, portentous. At the top of the sheet stands a cross followed by a few lines establishing the time and date, then the word FEU (fire) in all upper case and centered near the top of the page. Then:

Dieu d'Abraham, Dieu d'Isaac, Dieu de Jacob, non des philosophes et des savants.

Certitude. Certitude. Sentiment. Joie. Paix.

Dieu de Jésus-Christ.

Deum meum et Deum vestrum.

Ton Dieu sera mon Dieu.

(God of Abraham, God of Isaac, God of Jacob, not of the philosophers and scholars. Certitude, certitude, feeling, joy, peace. God of Jesus Christ. My God and your God. Thy God will be my God.)

And so on, in a similarly ecstatic vein for about eighteen more lines. The parchment copy ends with the solemn pledge: “Total submission to Jesus Christ and to my director. Eternally in joy for a day’s trial on earth. I shall not forget thy word.”

As the name Memorial implies, Pascal’s words were written down to preserve them indelibly in his memory and to bear tangible witness to what was for him a soul-piercing and truly life-altering event. His account, despite its brevity and gnomic style, accords closely with the reports of conversion and mysticism classically described and analyzed by William James.

In the weeks leading up to November 23, 1654, Pascal had on several occasions visited Jacqueline at Port-Royal and had complained, despite his active social life and ongoing scientific work, of feelings of dissatisfaction, guilt, lack of purpose, and ennui. As in the story of his carriage accident by the Seine, he seemed to be a man teetering on the edge – in this case between anxiety and hope. His “Night of Fire” dramatically changed his outlook and brought him back from the brink of despair.

e. Final Years

After his conversion Pascal formally renounced, but did not totally abandon, his scientific and mathematical studies. He instead vowed to dedicate his time and talents to the glorification of God, the edification of his fellow believers, and the salvation of the larger human community. It wasn’t long before he got an early test of his new resolve.

In fact, hardly had Pascal committed himself to Port-Royal than the Jansenist enclave, never secure and always under the watchful suspicion of the greater Catholic community, found itself under theological siege.  Antoine Arnauld, the spiritual leader of Port-Royal and the uncompromising voice and authority for its strict Augustinian beliefs and values, was embroiled in a bitter controversy pitting Jansenism against the Pope, the Jesuit order, and a majority of the bishops of France. In effect, opponents charged that the entire Jansenist system was based on a foundation of error. At issue were matters of Catholic doctrine involving grace, election, human righteousness, divine power, and free will. Arnauld denied the charges and published a series of vehement counter-attacks. Unfortunately, these only served to make the hostility towards himself and the Port-Royal community more intense. He ended up being censored by the Faculty of Theology at the Sorbonne and stood threatened with official accusations of heresy. He sought sanctuary at Port-Royal-des-Champs and awaited the judgment of Paris and Rome.

With the official voice of Port-Royal effectively muted, the cause of Jansenism needed a new champion. Pascal stood ready to fill the role. During the period 1656-57, under the pseudonym Louis de Montalte,

he produced a series of 18 public letters attacking the Jesuits and defending Arnauld and Jansenist doctrine. The Lettres provinciales, as they became known, introduced an entirely new tone and style into contemporary theological debate. From time to time, the genre had served as a forum for obfuscation, vituperation, abstruse technical language, and stodgy academic prose. Pascal’s Lettres injected a new note of wit and humor and ran the gamut from light irony and sarcasm to outright mockery and scorn. They also featured a popular idiom and conversational tone and made use of literary devices such as characterization, dialog, dramatization, and narrative voice. They became a sensation and attracted the amused attention of readers throughout France. Who, people wondered, is this clever fellow Montalte? The Jesuits, stunned and slow to respond, seemed to have met their intellectual match.

f. Miracle of the Holy Thorn

During the same week that Pascal’s fifth provinciale (a polemic against Jesuit casuistry) was published, and just when rumors of new antagonism and royal disfavor with Jansenism began to circulate, an extraordinary event occurred at Port-Royal. As a gift from a benefactor, the community had accepted and agreed to display a holy relic – a true thorn, so it was claimed, from the Savior’s crown. Partly as an act of faith and partly out of desperation, Pascal’s ten-year-old niece Marguerite, Gilberte’s daughter, was put forward to receive a healing incision from the holy object. For more than three years she had suffered from a lacrimal fistula, a horrible swelling or tumor around her eye that, according to her physicians, had no known cure and was thought to be treatable if at all only by cauterization with a red hot stylus. Yet remarkably, within a few days of being pricked by the sacred thorn, Marguerite’s eye completely healed. The seeming miracle excited the Pascal family and the entire Port-Royal community; news of the event soon spread outside the walls of Port-Royal and around the nation. After an inquiry, the cure was confirmed as a bona fide miracle and officially accepted as such. Port-Royal rejoiced, and for a while the antagonism against it from the larger Catholic community abated. Pascal regarded the miracle as a sign of divine favor for his Lettres project and for the cause of Jansenism in general. It also confirmed his belief in miracles, a belief that would form part of the foundation for his view of religious faith as set forth in the Pensées.  

Despite the auspicious sign of heavenly favor, and even though the Lettres were brilliantly successful in the short term, they failed in their ultimate goal of vindicating Arnauld and Port-Royal. A papal “bull” condemning Jansenism was issued by Alexander VII in October of 1656 and approved in France in December of 1657. An official oath decreeing that Jansenist doctrine was contaminated by heresy was circulated and all French priests, monks, and nuns, including the Port-Royalists and Pascal’s sister Jacqueline, were compelled to sign. In 1660 the “little schools” of Port Royal, renowned for excellence and models of progressive education, were closed. In 1661 the monastery was no longer allowed to accept novices. Early in the next century the abbey would be abolished, the community of worshippers disbanded, and the buildings razed. Overwhelmed by a combined force of royal politics and papal power, Port-Royal would lie in ruins and Jansenism, though it would inspire a few random offshoots and latter-day imitations, would find itself largely reduced to an interesting but brief chapter in the history of French Catholicism.

Meanwhile, in the spring of 1658, as he was studying the Bible and doing preparatory work for what was to be his magnum opus – the great Apology for Christianity that would become the Pensées – Pascal turned his attention once again to mathematics and to the problem of the roulette or cycloid. Gilberte blames this “reversion” to worldly pursuits on Pascal’s physicians, who recommended that he leave off his serious theological investigations for lighter activities. She also claims that the solution to the problem, which had challenged the likes of Galileo, Torricelli, and Descartes, came to him almost despite himself and during a bout of sleeplessness caused by a toothache. She finally alleges that Pascal decided to make his discovery public only when he was at length persuaded by others that it was God’s will. Gilberte’s claims are questionable. What is known is that when Pascal, under the pseudonym Amos Dettonville, actually did publish his solution, which was done within the context of a contest or challenge that he had thrown out to some of the best mathematical minds of Europe, the result was a controversy that occupied his time and energy for several months and which distracted him from working on his new project.

The Pensées occupied Pascal’s final years and were undertaken at a time when his health, which was never robust, deteriorated and grew progressively worse. Originally conceived as a comprehensive defense of the Christian faith against non-believers, the work in its existing form is a rich assortment of notes, fragments, aphorisms, homilies, short essays, sermonettes, and aperçus that even in their disorganized and unfinished state constitute a powerful and fascinating contribution to philosophy, theology, and literary art.

Pascal worked determinedly on the Pensées to the extent that his health permitted him, which was unfortunately not very often or for very long. By early 1659 he was already seriously ill and could work for only short spurts before succumbing to mental and physical exhaustion. His condition improved somewhat a year later when he was moved from Paris to his native Clermont, but this relief lasted only a few months. When he returned to Paris he mustered enough energy to work out his plan for a public shuttle system of omnibuses for the city. When this novel idea was realized and put into actual operation in 1662, Paris had the first such transit system in the world.

The last two years of Pascal’s life were spent in Paris under the care and supervision of Gilberte and Florin, who had taken a home nearby. It was a grim period for all the Pascals; Jacqueline died in 1661, only a few months after being forced to subscribe to the formulary condemning Jansen’s Augustinus as heretical. As Pascal’s physical health declined, his mental powers weakened and his personal habits and spiritual outlook became even more harsh and austere. According to Gilberte, he regarded any sort of dining pleasure or gastronomic delight as a hateful form of sensuality and adopted the (very un-Gallic) view that one should eat strictly for nourishment and not for enjoyment. He championed the ideal of poverty and claimed that one should prefer and use goods crafted by the poorest and most honest artisans, not those manufactured by the best and most accomplished. He purged his home of luxuries and pretty furnishings and took in a homeless family. He even cautioned Gilberte not to be publicly affectionate with her children – on grounds that caresses can be a form of sensuality, dependency, and self-indulgence. In his opinion, a life devoted to God did not allow for close personal attachments – not even to family.

During his last days he burned with fever and colic. His doctors assaulted him with their customary cures. He wavered in and out of consciousness and suffered a series of recurrent violent convulsions. However, Gilberte attests that he recovered his clarity of mind in time to make a final confession, take the Blessed Sacrament, and receive extreme unction. His last coherent words were reportedly “May God never abandon me.” He died at 1:00 AM August 19, 1662, at the age of 39.

Even post-mortem Pascal was unable to escape the curiosity and intrusiveness of his physicians. Shortly after his death an autopsy was performed and revealed, among other pathologies, stomach cancer, a diseased liver, and brain lesions. Nor after death, was he granted peace from the still ongoing crossfire between Jesuits and Port-Royal. Was Pascal, it was asked, truly orthodox and a good Catholic? A sincere believer and supporter of the powers of the Pope and the priesthood and the efficacious intervention of the Saints? Did he reject the Jansenist heresy on his deathbed and accept a more moderate and forgiving theology? Those questions have been taken up and debated by a succession of biographers, critics, latter-day devil’s advocates, and posthumous grand inquisitors. His works have fared better, having received, during the three and a half centuries since his death, first-rate editorial attention, a number of superb translations, and an abundance of expert scholarly commentary. The Pensées and the Provincial Letters have earned him a place in the pantheon of French philosophical non-fiction alongside names like Montaigne, Descartes, Voltaire, Rousseau, and Sartre.

2. Literary and Religious Works

a. Provincial Letters

Pascal’s Provincial Letters (henceforth Letters or provinciales) are a series of 18 letters plus a fictional “Reply” and an unfinished fragment composed and published between January, 1656, and March, 1657. Their aim was to defend the Jansenist community of Port-Royal and its principal spokesman and spiritual leader Antoine Arnauld from defamation and accusations of heresy while at the same time leading a counter-offensive against the accusers (mainly the Jesuits). Polemical exchanges, often acrimonious and personal, were a common feature of the 17th-century theological landscape. Pascal ventured into this particular fray with a unique set of weapons – a mind honed by mathematical exercise and scientific debate, a pointed wit, and sharp-edged literary and dramatic skills.

In the background of the letters stand two notable events:  (1) In May of 1653, Pope Innocent X in a bull entitled Cum Occasione declared five propositions supposedly contained in Cornelius Jansen’s Augustinus to be heretical.  (2) In January of 1656, after a long and heated trial, Arnauld, who had repeatedly denied that the five propositions were in Jansen’s text, was officially censured and expelled from the Sorbonne.

The five propositions can be stated as follows:

1. Even the just, no matter how hard they may strive, lack the power and grace to keep all the commandments.

2. In our fallen condition it is impossible for us to resist interior grace.

3. In order to deserve merit or condemnation we must be free from external compulsion though not from internal necessity.

4. It is heresy to say that we can either accept grace or resist it.

5. Christ did not die for everyone, but only for the elect.

Two separate questions were at stake: (1) Are the propositions actually in Jansen, if not explicitly and verbatim, then implicitly in meaning or intention? This was the so-called question of fact (de fait). (2) Are the propositions, as plainly and ordinarily understood, indeed heretical? This was the question of right or law (de droit). The Port-Royal position was yes in the case of the second question, no in the case of the first. Arnauld claimed that the propositions do not occur, verbatim or otherwise, anywhere in Jansen’s text, but he acknowledged that if they did occur there (or for that matter anywhere), they were indeed heretical. Despite the fact that he disavowed any support for the five propositions, he and the Port-Royal community as a whole stood under suspicion of secretly approving, if not openly embracing them.

Such was the situation that Pascal found himself in when he sat down to compose the first provinciale. What he produced was something utterly new in the annals of religious controversy. In place of the usual fury and technical quibbling, he adopts a tone of easy-going candor and colloquial simplicity. He presents himself as a modest, ordinary, private citizen (originally anonymous, but later identified in the collected letters by the pseudonym Louis de Montalte) who is writing from Paris to a “provincial friend.” “Montalte’s” purpose is to pass along his personal observations, insights, and commentary on the learned and mighty disputes that recently took place at the Sorbonne. In essence, via his fictional persona, Pascal provides an account of l’affaire Arnauld and the case against Jansenism as viewed by a coolly observant, playful outsider.

In the course of the letter, Pascal/Montalte introduces a series of fictional interlocutors who explain or advocate for the Jansenist, Jesuit, and Thomistic views on a range of theological issues, most notably the doctrines of sufficient grace vis-à-vis efficacious grace and the notion of proximate power. These happen to be exactly the sort of deeply esoteric, highly technical, theological matters that “Montalte” and his “provincial friend” (and thus, by extension and more importantly, his target audience of plain-spoken, commonsense, fellow citizens) were likely to find strained, incomprehensible, and somewhat silly. Through devices of interview and dialogue Montalte manages to present these issues in relatively clear, understandable terms and persuade the reader that the Jansenist and Thomist views on each are virtually identical and perfectly orthodox. He goes on to show that any apparent discrepancy between the two positions – and in fact the whole attack on Jansenism and Arnauld – is based not on doctrine, but is entirely political and personal, a product of Jesuit calumny and conspiracy.  In effect, a complicated theological conflict is presented in the form of a simple human drama. Irony and stinging satire are delivered with the suave aplomb of a Horatian epistle.

Not all of the provinciales deal with the same issues and concerns as the first. Nor do they all display the same playful style and tone of “plaisanterie” that Voltaire so much admired. In fact some of the later letters, far from being breezy and affable, are passionate and achieve sublime eloquence; others are downright vicious and blistering in their attack. Letters 1-3 offer a defense of Arnauld, challenging his trial and censure. Letter 4, pitting a Jesuit against a Jansenist, serves as a bridge between provinciales 1-3 and 5-10. Letters 5-10 attack Jesuit casuistry and doctrine; in them Montalte accuses the Society of hypocrisy and moral laxity and of placing ease of conscience and the glory of the Order above true Christian duty and love of God. Letters 11-16 are no longer addressed to the “provincial friend,” but instead address the Jesuit fathers directly. Letter 14 includes an extended discussion of both natural and divine law and makes an important ethical distinction between homicide, capital punishment, and suicide. Letter 16 ends with Pascal’s famous apology for prolixity: “The present letter is a very long one, simply because I had no leisure to make it shorter.”) Letters 17 and 18 are addressed to Father Annat, SJ, confessor to the King, and are direct and personal. Here Pascal virtually abandons the artifice of “Montalte” and seems almost to come forward in his own person. In Letter 17, a virtual reprise and summation of the case of the five propositions, he repeats once again that he writes purely as a private citizen and denies that he is a member of Port Royal. Since Pascal was neither a monk nor a solitaire within the community, the claim is technically accurate, though it arguably leaves him open to the same charges of truth-bending and casuistry that he levels against the Jesuits.

Although the Letters gained a wide readership and enjoyed a period of popular success, they failed to achieve their strategic goal of preserving Port-Royal and Jansenist doctrine from external attack. They also had a few unfortunate, unintended consequences. They were blamed, for instance, for stirring up cynicism, disrespect, and even contempt for the clergy in the minds of ordinary citizens. Quickly translated into English and Latin, they also became popular with Protestant readers happy to extend Pascal’s wounding attack on Jesuit morality into a satirical broadside against Catholicism as a whole. After the publication of the provinciales, the term Jesuitical would become synonymous with crafty and subtle and the words casuistry and casuistical would never again be entirely free from a connotation of sophistry and excuse-making. Banned by order of Louis XIV in 1660 and placed on the Index and burned by the Inquisition, the provinciales nevertheless lived on underground and abroad with their popularity undimmed.

Today, the provinciales retain documentary value both as relics of Jansenism and as surviving specimens of 17th-century religious polemic, but modern readers prize them mainly for their literary excellence. They represent the original model not only for the genre of satirical non-fiction, but for classic French prose style in all other genres as well. Rabelais and Montaigne were basically inimitable and far too quirky and idiosyncratic to serve as a style model for later writers. Pascal’s combination of brisk clarity and concise elegance set a pattern for French authors from La Rochefoucauld, Voltaire, and Diderot to Anatole France. Even Paul Valéry, arguably Pascal’s most severe critic, excoriated his predecessor in a prose style heavily indebted to him. Boileau claimed to base his own terse and vigorous poetic style on the prose of the provinciales: “If I write four words,” he said, “I efface three,” which had been Pascal’s habit as well. Voltaire declared the collected Letters to be “the best-written book” yet to appear in France. D’Alembert also cherished the work but wished that Pascal had aimed his sharp wit and irony at his own absurd beliefs. He argued that Jansenism is every bit as “shocking,” and as deserving of scorn and ridicule, as the doctrines of Molina and the Jesuits. Of Pascal’s modern readers only the arch conservative Joseph de Maistre, spearhead of the counter-Enlightenment, utterly scorned the work, calling Jansenism a “vile” and “unblushing” heresy and finding the style of the Letters rancorous and bitter.

In the end, it’s unfortunate that the principal debate in the provinciales was theological rather than philosophical, for it would have been useful and interesting to have Pascal’s candid discussion of free will vs. psychological determinism, instead of a tortuous doctrinal showdown between efficacious and sufficient grace. Jansen’s own formula – that “man irresistibly, although voluntarily, does either good or evil, according as he is dominated by grace or by concupiscence” – is paradoxical and tries to have it both ways. (Can an act be both voluntary and irresistible?) Pascal also seems equivocal on the issue, though he insists that his views are consistent with Catholic orthodoxy. He wrestled with the problem of grace and free will not only in the Letters, but also in portions of the Pensées and especially in his Écrits sur la grâce (1657-58), where he offers an extensive commentary on Augustine and compares the Calvinist, Jansenist, and Jesuit views. However, even there his account is abstruse and theological rather than blunt and philosophical and is thus of interest mainly to specialists rather than general readers.

b. Pensées

i. Plan and Purpose of the Work and its Textual History

The Pensées are a rarity among literary and philosophical works – a magnum opus by a major author that has achieved classic status despite being unfinished, fragmentary, and almost scrapbook-like in form. The Aeneid, The Canterbury Tales, De Rerum Natura, Kafka’s manuscripts all had work remaining or were incomplete when their authors died, but they seem like final drafts compared to the Pensées. Sainte-Beuve compared the work to a tower in which the stones have been piled up but not cemented. The text, as we have it today, represents the assembled notes, fragments, miscellaneous aphorisms, and short essays-in-progress of what was to be a detailed and comprehensive Apology for Christianity – a defense of the faith against atheism, deism, libertinism, pagan philosophy, and the cult of honnêteté.

Inspired by the force and certainty of his own conversion and by the late excitement of the Holy Thorn, Pascal was further encouraged by the recent success of the provinciales. Confident in his powers of argument and persuasion, both logical and literary, he felt called upon to undertake a bold new project. The new work was to be nothing less than a definitive affirmation and justification of Christianity against its detractors and critics. It would also be an exercise in spiritual outreach and proselytization – an earnest appeal, addressed to both the reason and the heart, inviting scoffers, doubters, the undecided, and the lost to join the Catholic communion. In the Pensées, Pascal would assume the role of both Apologist and Apostle.

In the spring of 1658, he presented a detailed outline of his project, explaining its scope and goals, to an audience of friends and members of Port-Royal. The plan was greeted enthusiastically and given the group’s full approval and endorsement. The work would be unified, but layered and textured, with multiple sections and two main parts:

First part: Misery of man without God.

Second part: Happiness of man with God.


First part: That nature is corrupt. Proved by nature itself.

Second part: That there is a Redeemer. Proved by Scripture. (6/40).

The project was designed as an example of what is today termed immanent apologetics. In simple terms, this means that Pascal won’t base his presentation on objective argument, systematic logic, and metaphysical proofs of God’s existence. Indeed, except for a few instances, such as 135/167, where he finds evidence in nature for a Being who is “necessary, infinite, and eternal,” Pascal eschews most of the traditional proofs of God, even Augustine’s. He will instead appeal to the unfolding history of the Christian faith from its roots in Old Testament prophecy through its early development to the modern Church. Further, he will appeal directly to the subjective human spirit and to each reader’s personal experience, emphasizing our existential human need for God and our feelings of incompleteness and wretchedness apart from Him.

In essence, Pascal will leave it to readers to decide whether his account of the human condition and his descriptions of their social and physical worlds (not as they might wish them to be, but as they actually experience them in our daily lives) are credible and persuasive. If the reader accepts his accounts, Pascal will be halfway to his goal. It will remain for him to further convince readers that the solution to our wretchedness, to the disorder and unfairness of life, is acceptance of Jesus Christ. He will argue that not only is belief in Christianity not contrary to reason, but that it’s the only religion that is fully compatible with it. To support this claim, he will offer historical evidence in its favor from the authority of Scripture and ancient witnesses, and also in the form of miracles, prophecies, and figural (typological) hermeneutics. However, he admits that this evidence will not be conclusive – for Christianity can never be proved by reason or authority alone. It must be accepted in the heart (coeur – a special term in Pascal’s vocabulary that includes connotations of “spirit,” “soul,” “natural human instinct,” and even “love,”): “It is the heart which experiences God, and not the reason. This, then, is faith: God felt by the heart, not by the reason” (424/680).

Such in essence was the plan. Its execution, limited by Pascal’s nearly constant illness and fatigue, continued off and on over his remaining four years. Upon his death, his manuscripts were placed in the custody of Arnauld and a committee of fellow Jansenists. While transcribing the manuscripts, the committee produced two variant copies. The original Port Royal edition of Pascal’s works came out in 1670, incomplete and carefully screened to avoid offending the government. Prosper Faugère brought out a revised and authoritative edition of the work in 1844. Several new editions, with different arrangements of the material, appeared over the next century. The numerical ordering used in Léon Brunschvicg’s 1897 edition became standard, but was superseded first by the 1951 edition of Louis Lafuma (which was based on the First Copy) and then again by the 1976 edition of Phillipe Sellier (which was based on the Second Copy). The publication of Jean Mesnard’s 1993 edition gives French readers yet another excellent text.

ii. Philosophical Themes

Death, God, infinity, the nature of the universe, the limits of reason, the meaning of life – these are just a few of the big ideas and philosophical topics that Pascal reflects on in the short space of the Pensées. Indeed, other than the gnomic fragments of Heraclitus or the terse aphoristic texts of Wittgenstein, it’s hard to think of a work that packs as many provocative philosophical musings into so few pages.

Yet even with its multiple subject headings and wide range of topics, the work can still be read as the deep exploration of a single great theme: the Human Condition, viewed under its two opposing yet interrelated aspects – our wretchedness without God, and our greatness with Him. Pascal argues that without God our spiritual condition is essentially a state of misery characterized by anxiety, alienation, loneliness, and ennui.  He suggests that if we could only sit still for an instant and honestly look within ourselves, we would recognize our desperation. However, we spend most of our time blocking out or concealing our true condition from ourselves via forms of self-deception and amour-propre. (Like Augustine before him, Pascal accurately describes mechanisms of denial and ego-defense long before they were clinically and technically defined by Sigmund Freud).

Chief among these ego-protective devices is divertissement (distraction or diversion), Pascal’s term for our continual need and almost addictive tendency to seek out mindless or soul-numbing forms of entertainment and amusement. Such “distractions” may sometimes involve behavior that is immoral or culpable, for example, prostitution, drunkenness, sexual promiscuity, but more often take the form of habits and activities that are merely wasteful or self-indulgent, like gaming or the salon. They may even consist of pastimes that are basically innocent, but which are nevertheless vain, trivial, or unedifying, for example, sports like tennis and fencing. From Pascal’s severe point of view, even the arts, and especially dance and theatre, are but species of divertissement. So are all the luxuries, consumer goods, and worldly delights with which we proudly surround ourselves. According to Pascal, we use these goods and activities not, as we self-flatteringly suppose, to certify our achievements or add a touch of bonheur to our inner life. On the contrary, we use them mainly as a way of concealing our bleak inner reality from ourselves and from one another. They are a means of denying our own mortality and hollowness.  (136/168; 139/171.)

iii. Between Misery and Grandeur

In effect diversions prevent us from acknowledging our essential misery.  They create a false sense of security that hides the abyss or vacuum within. On the other hand, wretchedness and insecurity are only part of our nature. Our condition, as Pascal points out repeatedly in the Pensées and also in his “conversation” with Sacy, is dual.  We are one part misery and one part grandeur; and alongside our feelings of isolation and destitution we also have a profound sense of our intrinsic dignity and worth. Pascal calls us “thinking reeds,” though his stress is on thinking. For thought, he argues, is the whole basis of our dignity, the attribute of our nature that elevates and separates us from the rest of the material universe. It’s an accident of history that Pascal’s collection of notes came to be called Pensées. But the title is appropriate, since the work as a whole could well be described as an extended meditation on human consciousness, on what it means to think.

iv. Critical Approaches and Interpretation

Criticism and interpretation of the Pensées have followed two main approaches. The first, which could be called the conventional or historical approach, is the one favored by most literary scholars and historians of religion, including most notably Philippe Sellier, David Wetsel, and Jean Mesnard. According to this view the Pensées are to be understood within the context and framework of traditional Christian apologetics. Moreover, the author’s original design and purpose (so far as modern scholarship can determine them) are to be carefully reconstructed and fully respected. Most of the biographers and critics who follow this approach agree that Pascal’s primary purpose was to articulate and defend Christianity – and especially the Augustinian-Jansenist form of Christianity practiced at Port-Royal – against its skeptical, atheistic, and deistic opponents.  In particular, they argued, Pascal aims to convert the contemporary free-thinker and honnête homme – that is to say, a figure much like his friends Mitton  and Méré and indeed not unlike a secular, rationalistic, and worldly version of himself. The work is thus understood to be not an inner drama enacting Pascal’s own personal struggles with religious belief but rather an artfully contrived dialog with and rhetorical proselytization of an imagined adversary. The “I” of the work, in this view, is not Pascal himself in propria persona but a polyphonic fiction – a range of literary voices and masks adopted by Pascal strictly as a rhetorical device and as a means of persuasion. Thus, any time we seem to hear the narrative voice of the Pensées expressing fear, doubt, conflict, or existential agony we are to understand that voice not as Pascal’s own, but as that of a literary creation or persona whose utterances are to be interpreted ironically or as presented for dramatic or rhetorical effect.

Although he was neither a literary scholar nor a historian of religion (but more like a cantankerous version of each), Voltaire seems to have read and understood the Pensées in this traditional way. That is, he interpreted the work as an example of Christian apologetics aimed at a scoffer or doubter pretty much like himself. Needless to say, he was not swayed by Pascal’s arguments. To the claim that the human condition is one of anxiety and wretchedness, he responds that we are neither as wicked nor as miserable as Pascal says. As for Pascal’s extensive discussion of miracles, prophecy, the figurative interpretation of Scripture, and the like, Voltaire regards the effort as so much wasted breath. He even suggests that Christianity would be better off without such strained and overwrought apologetics, which he compared to trying to prop up an oak tree by surrounding it with reeds.

The poet and critic T. S. Eliot, in his 1933 introductory essay to the Pensées, also interprets the work in this traditional way.  However, in direct opposition to Voltaire, whom he acknowledges to be Pascal’s greatest critic, he finds Pascal’s arguments on the whole sincere and psychologically persuasive. He departs from the traditional reading only to the extent that he considers the Pensées  not only as a work of Christian apologetics but also as an example of spiritual biography, an expression of Pascal’s forceful and idiosyncratic personality and unique combination of passion and intellect (360).

In opposition to this essentially historical and scholarly way of reading the Pensées, several critics and commentators, from Chateaubriand and Walter Pater to Paul Valéry, AJ Krailsheimer, and Lucien Goldmann, have offered versions of what might be called a “romantic,” “confessional,” or “phenomenological” approach. According to this line of interpretation, Pascal’s fragmentary narrative represents either a fictional portrait of a soul in crisis or a true personal confession in the manner of Augustine (and later Rousseau). That is, it presents a cri de coeur or cri de triomphe that provides a direct look into the heart and soul of a penitent former sinner who, after a long and agonizing struggle, finds Christ and renounces the world. Romantic readers themselves disagree on the extent to which this exercise in self-revelation is a conscious product – that is, a carefully arranged and skillfully made artifact – or, in a more psychoanalytic vein, the expression of the author’s actual inner conflicts and unconscious motives and intentions. They also offer different interpretations of the audience or addressee of the work. Are the Pensées a dramatic monologue? A private confession addressed to God? A dialog between Pascal and the reader? Between Pascal and himself?  Are they truly intended to convert a Méré or a Mitton, and are they addressed only to skeptics and those lacking faith?  Or are they meant also as a meditative exercise and inspiration for active Christians, a spiritual tool to help guide believers and strengthen their faith? Or perhaps Pascal, in the manner of St. Paul, is trying to be all things to all people and thus to a certain extent trying to do some or all of the above at the same time?

The great Victorian critic Walter Pater compares the Pensées to Shakespearian tragedy and notes that Pascal is not a converted skeptic or former infidel who has seen the light. Instead, he seems caught “at the very centre of a perpetually maintained tragic crisis holding the faith steadfastly, but amid the well-poised points of essential doubt all around him.” The Pensées, Pater goes on to claim, dramatize an intense inner dialectic: “no mere calm supersession of a state of doubt by a state of faith; the doubts never die, they are only just kept down in a perpetual agonia.”

This view of the Pensées as an interior dialogue or psychomachia dramatizing Pascal’s own personal struggle between faith and doubt is thoroughly rejected by Jean Mesnard and other scholars who insist that any hint of such a struggle is merely a rhetorical pose on Pascal’s part and employed for dramatic effect.

Pascal was proclaimed a heretic and a Calvinist during his lifetime and has been called everything from a skeptic to a nihilist by modern readers. So to a certain extent Paul Valéry in his controversial essay “Variations on a Pensée” was for the most part only repeating criticisms of the author  that earlier critics, many of them Catholic clergymen, had made before (for example, that he was a poor theologian, that he was insensitive to natural beauty and to art, and so forth). Valéry seems to recognize a distinction between Pascal the author and the “I” of the Pensées, but he finds the “I” of the work so artificial and overwrought that he accuses the author of being hypocritical and insincere. Thinking of the passage in the Pensées about the terror induced by “the eternal silence” of infinite space (201/233), he says, here is a “strange Christian,” who gazes upon the starry heavens yet fails to discover his Heavenly Father. Echoing a criticism formerly made by Voltaire, Valéry likens Pascal to a tragic poet who portrays the human condition as much bleaker and harsher than it actually is; who describes the fears and torments of life vividly, but who depicts its delights and joys, its moments of excitement and intensity, hardly at all.

Lucien Goldmann has argued that the fragmentary form of the Pensées may be an accident due to Pascal’s death, but it also qualifies as a brilliantly achieved creative product, an aesthetically and psychologically appropriate form that not only reflects the true style and state of mind of Pascal himself and of his narrative persona but also captures the mood and temper of his time. Writing from a Lukácsian-Marxist and evolutionary perspective that he calls “genetic structuralism,” Goldmann views Pascal as both a cutting-edge, creative force and at the same time a product of his personal circumstances and historical era. In this interpretation, Pascal sets up dialectical polarities in the Pensées –man’s wretchedness vs. his greatness; concupiscence vs. godliness and sacrifice; Old Testament type vs. New Testament antitype; reason vs. the heart; and so forth, all of which are polarities that are supposedly resolved and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. Those polarities are homologous with and paralleled by the larger historical oppositions of the period: the new science vs. ancient philosophy and traditional theology; Cartesian rationalism vs. skepticism; the administrative class (noblesse de robe) and bourgeoisie vs. the nobility; Protestantism and Jansenism vs. Catholicism; and so forth. Viewed in this way, the Pensées can be seen to encapsulate and effectively dramatize the main intellectual and social dynamics of an entire era.

v. The Wager

One of the more remarkable developments in Western philosophy is the fact that one sliver of the Pensées , a single fragment of a fragmentary text and but a small portion of the untidy, multi-part, unfinished work that contains it, has achieved a full literary life of its own, with its own lively history of commentary and criticism. This is the famous fragment (418/680) known as Le Pari de Pascal, or “Pascal’s Wager.”  Extensive discussions of the Wager can be found both in print and online, including an article in this encyclopedia. These discussions address a range of issues relating to the Wager, such as its status in the development of decision theory and probability theory, the various objections that have been made against it, and the numerous revised or alternate versions and applications that have been derived from it. This section will take up only two matters related to the topic: (1) the question of whether or not Pascal himself sincerely approved the Wager and believed that it presents a legitimate and persuasive argument for faith in God; (2) the response to the Wager on the part of a few selected philosophers and critics along with a glance at some of its precedents in literary history.

Simply characterized, the Wager is a second-person dialog in which Pascal imagines an individual forced to choose between belief in God and disbelief in Him. He analyzes the situation as if the reader-protagonist (the “you” of the imaginary dialog) were involved in a great existential coin-toss game.  The conditions and possible outcomes of the Wager are presented in the following table:

You bet that He exists You bet that He does not exist
God exists + ∞ (infinite gain) - ∞ (infinite loss)
God does not exist - x (finite loss) + x (finite gain)

Pascal argues that given the terms of the Wager it is not simply prudent, it is practically obligatory to bet on God’s existence and illogical and utterly foolish to bet against Him. For consider: if you bet on His existence, you stand to win an infinite reward (an eternity in paradise) at the risk of only a small loss (whatever earthly pleasures you would be required to forego during your mortal life). On the other hand, if you bet against His existence, you risk the possibility of an infinite loss (loss of paradise – along with the possibility of an eternity in Hell) for only a limited gain (the opportunity to enjoy a few years’ worth of worldly delights). 

Pascal was a lifelong Catholic whose personal conversion from lukewarm to whole-hearted faith was accomplished not by rational argument but by a life-changing mystical experience. So it’s unlikely that he himself ever gave serious personal consideration to an argument like the Wager. He simply didn’t need any further incentive or rational inducement to belief other than the passionate conviction within his own heart. On the other hand, it’s not unlikely that he thought the Wager might appeal to and perhaps even sway a libertine, a skeptic, or a Deist who might be teetering on the brink of belief. And that goes even more for a figure like a Méré or Mitton or any of the other young gallants and connoisseurs of honnêteté whom Pascal came to know in the salons and gaming rooms of Paris. After all, what better than a wager to entice a gambler? “Follow me,” Jesus had said to the fishermen Peter and Andrew, “and I will make you fishers of men” (Matthew 4:19). Similarly, Pascal, in the role a latter-day apostle, uses a game of chance as a net to bring sinners to salvation.

The concept of the Wager was by no means original with Pascal. Versions of it can be found as far back as Euripides’ The Bacchae. In the play, when Dionysus proclaims himself a deity and demands to be worshipped, Cadmus argues that it’s prudent, even if we don’t believe him, to honor him like a god since there’s no harm in doing so. (On the other hand, we risk a great deal of personal hardship by failing to show him proper reverence if he truly is a god.)

Sir Thomas More’s anecdote of the Gallant and the Friar presents in an inverted form a similar conflict and moral: When a gallant sees a friar walking barefoot in the snow, he asks him why he endures such pain. The friar responds that the pain is trivial, if we remember Hell. “But what if there is no hell?” inquires the amused gallant, adding “then art thou a great fool.” “Yes, master,” the friar replies, “but what if there is a hell? Then art thou a greater fool.”

A comical modern parody of the Wager occurs in the 1951 Broadway musical Guys and Dolls. Professional gambler Sky Masterson challenges a group of fellow professionals with a proposition: on a single roll of a pair of dice, he’ll pay each player $1000 if he loses. But if he wins, the gamblers will have to attend a midnight revival meeting at the Save-a-Soul mission. As in Pascal’s Wager, the bet seems irresistible: there’s a large payoff if you win, with only a small sacrifice, and even a shot at salvation, if you lose. Sky wins his wager. The gamblers are “saved.”

Voltaire called the Wager “indecent and childish” and thought it strange that Pascal reduced questions of the highest gravity to the mathematics of games of chance. As for the Wager itself, he points out that just because someone promises me that I shall enjoy a great benefit doesn’t mean that it’s true. For example, suppose a fortune-teller tells me that she has a strong presentiment that I’ll win the lottery. Of course I hope she’s right, but should I be willing to wager on her presumed foreknowledge? If so, how much? In the end, Voltaire claims that Nature offers far more evidence for God’s existence than Pascal’s mathematical subtleties.

Following up on Voltaire’s objections, Diderot pointed out that Pascal’s same basic argument (better to believe than not to believe) would apply equally well to any other religion: “An imam could argue just as well this way.” Indeed, by this logic, it could be argued that the more fanatical the religion, and the more extreme its promised rewards for belief and punishments for non-belief, the more powerful the argument in its favor.

Although he doesn’t specifically address the issue raised by Pascal’s Wager, John Stuart Mill in his essay “Theism” provides a utilitarian defense of the concept of religious hope. In effect, he argues that in a case where the truth is uncertain and the alternatives, immortality of the soul vs. extinction; existence of God vs. His non-existence, appear equally probable, it is legitimate to prefer the more hopeful option as being the choice more likely conducive to overall happiness.

In his essay “The Will to Believe” William James offers a sharp critical assessment of the Wager and finds Pascal’s basic argument to be weak, sophistic, and insincere:

. . . When religious faith expresses itself thus, in the language of the gaming-table, it is put to its last trumps. Surely Pascal's own personal belief in masses and holy water had far other springs; and this celebrated page of his is but an argument for others, a last desperate snatch at a weapon against the hardness of the unbelieving heart. We feel that a faith in masses and holy water adopted willfully after such a mechanical calculation would lack the inner soul of faith's reality; and if we were ourselves in the place of the Deity, we should probably take particular pleasure in cutting off believers of this pattern from their infinite reward (224).

However, having said this, James goes on to makes a pragmatic case for voluntary belief similar to Mill’s utilitarian defense of “hope” and to some extent comparable to Kierkegaard’s “leap of faith”. He argues that there are matters where the truth is in doubt and science is incapable of passing judgment as in the question of whether God exists. Where that choice is, in his terms, live (meaning that it seems of vital interest and value to us and engages us emotionally), momentous (meaning that it is non-trivial and has serious consequences), and forced (meaning that we must choose one way or the other and cannot simply sit the fence or stand aside), then it is lawful, indeed even necessary for us to weigh the risks and evidence and choose. In the end, James basically recasts Pascal’s Wager in a new form, re-focusing on its existential and psychological dimensions and dispensing with what he regards as its stagy and cheapening gambling metaphors.

c. Minor Works (Opuscules)

Besides his two major works (the Pensées and the Provinciales), Pascal also wrote several shorter works touching on a wide range of topics – from political legitimacy and social order to Stoicism and romantic love. A brief overview and précis of some of the better known and more important of these minor works follows.

i. Writings on Grace

Essentially an extensive commentary on human nature and the doctrine of divine grace, the Écrits represent Pascal’s most ambitious venture into the arena of Catholic theological debate. First published in 1779, the work was written at the same time as the provinciales and covers much of the same ground (proximate power, concupiscence, free will, and so forth), though in a more serious and less cavalier manner and in a more direct and methodical form.  Along with other deep matters, Pascal here explicates Augustine’s distinction between human nature in its unfallen state as pure, innocent, and naturally just, though capable of choice and error, and our postlapsarian condition, which is in thrall to concupiscence and naturally prone, indeed practically bound to do evil if it were not for God’s prevenient grace.  Adam was upright but free to fall; we children of Adam are weighed down by sin, and incapable of rising by our own effort. But, we are free to accept grace and can therefore be lifted up.

Pascal dissects the problem of free will in a similarly Augustinian fashion. Adam had free will in the sense that he could freely choose either good or evil, though he naturally inclined to the former. We, in our concupiscent state, are also free to choose. However, we are naturally inclined to prefer evil, which in our ignorant, fallen condition we commonly mistake for good. Pascal also points out that through the grace of Jesus Christ, a grace instilled by the Holy Spirit, we can achieve a redeemed will – a will sufficient to overcome concupiscence and capable of recognizing and choosing good.

Commentators on the Écrits have questioned whether its depiction of grace (which is presented as something largely mysterious yet vital for salvation) is consistent with the rational apologetic approach and systematic style of argument that Pascal sought to use in the Pensées.

ii. On the Geometric Spirit

Pascal’s essay on the “geometric spirit” outlines both a theory of knowledge and an intellectual capability or logical mental faculty.  He asserts that geometry and mathematics are the only areas of human inquiry that provide knowledge that is both certain and infallible. He then supports this claim with arguments and demonstrations. He goes on to describe a certain quality or faculty of mind that he calls l’esprit géométrique, which he defines as the ability to take known or perceived truths and to present them in such a way – with such precise steps, perfect elegance, and logical rigor – that their truth cannot help but be recognized and approved by others. Such an irrefutable and triumphant persuasiveness – the ability to vanquish all doubt and counter-argument – seems to have been Pascal’s goal in all his writings, whether on scientific subjects or in matters of theological dispute. In any case, the “geometric spirit” is both a prominent characteristic of Pascal’s own genius as well as an important epistemological idea (illustrating both the powers and limitations of the human mind) that he returns to repeatedly throughout his writings.

iii. Discourse on the Passions of Love

Pascal’s authorship of the “Discourse on the Passions of Love” has been disputed for the obvious reason that its subject (romantic love) and sentiments (that love exalts the soul, that those with the greatest souls make the truest lovers, that secret or undeclared love entails both exquisite joy and agonizing pain, and so forth) are highly uncharacteristic of the writer and would seem to be far outside his range of interest and expertise. Yet the style of the Discourse is distinctively Pascalian and some of the ideas contained in it (such as the distinction between the “geometric” mind and the spirit of “finesse”) are certifiably his own. Thus his authorship, while dubious, is at least possible, and so the question for his critics and biographers becomes: how to account for a work that seems so utterly contrary to Pascal’s own modest habits and reputation, so much more in the spirit of the salons of Paris rather than the cells of Port-Royal?

The most popular way of dealing with the Discourse has been simply to dismiss it as uncanonical and regard it as, at bottom, some kind of anonymously composed pastiche that incorporates bits and echoes of Pascal along with selections from other sources. Alternatively, it could be argued that the Discourse is written in the style and spirit of the Paris salons because Pascal himself intentionally wrote it in that vein, possibly as a kind of literary exercise or demonstration on his part for the amusement of his friends Méré and Mitton and their circle. (One can indeed easily imagine the pair challenging their shy friend to attempt such an exercise and then delighting in his successful performance.) So even though the Discourse may indeed be Pascal’s, its content and sentiments are for the most part artificial and insincere, many of the expressed opinions being mere restatements or variations of age-old commonplaces and platitudes about romantic love taken either from the précieuse poetry of his own era or from earlier literature.  (See, for example, the medieval Rules of Courtly Love of Andreas Capellanus, a compendium of witty, lofty, acerbic, or tongue-in-cheek observations about love very similar to Pascal’s.)

iv. Discourses on the Condition of the Great

Despite its minor status, the “Discourses on the Great” is nevertheless of interest since it is the only work of Pascal’s that attempts to formulate something like a social or political philosophy. The work (which is addressed to a young man of high degree) begins with a parable about a castaway on an island whom the inhabitants (owing to his close physical resemblance) mistake for their long-lost king. Such, Pascal argues, is the condition of those born to nobility or wealth within society: it is only by coincidence or lucky accident and by the power of custom and convention, not by nature, that they have their status. From this it follows that persons of rank are obligated to conduct themselves with due humility and must never allow themselves to treat those on society’s lower rungs with insolence or disrespect. Pascal concludes the Discourses by reminding his young learner of his true condition and enjoins him to rule and lead with beneficence.

Simply stated, the political philosophy expressed in the Discourses is noblesse oblige. Pascal acknowledges that the origins of human inequality are of two kinds, natural and institutional. The former arise from relative abilities or deficiencies of mind or body. For instance, A has better eyesight than B; X is taller and stronger than Y).Institutional inequalities, unless they are sanctioned by divine law, are entirely conventional and sometimes even arbitrary and can be rescinded or overturned. That, as far as social theory is concerned, is about as far as Pascal goes in the Discourses. Since his primary purpose is to offer moral instruction to a young nobleman, he doesn’t address topics like property, the social contract, divine right theory, which was a view recently and avidly affirmed by Louis XIV, or the ethics of revolt. From scattered comments in the Pensées, we know that he was politically conservative and despised violence. Apparently his experience during the Fronde led him to believe that even oppressive order is better than anarchy and that there is no worse social evil than civil war (see Pensées 94/128, 81/116, 85/119).

v. Prayer on the Proper Use of Sickness

Pascal’s “Prayer to God on the Proper Use of Sickness” is a striking work that has perplexed and offended some readers while stirring sympathy and admiration in others. Readers of the first sort, knowing of Pascal’s persistent illnesses and chronic pain, are disturbed to find him here not only begging forgiveness for the few pleasures he enjoyed during his brief intervals of health, but even thanking God for his lifetime of afflictions and earnestly beseeching Him for more of the same. These readers view the “Prayer” as an expression of almost pathological morbidity and the testament of a fanatic. Interpreted in this way, Pascal’s portrayal of the pleasures of life as cruel and deadly and of disease and affliction as salutary and healing seem not so much holy paradoxes as evidence of the extent to which the gloom of Jansenism had darkened his entire outlook.

This reading is defective in at least two ways. First, it ignores the fact that the paradoxes invoked in the “Prayer”—life is death; death is life; health is illness, illness is health; pain is pleasure, pleasure is pain; and so forth — are Christian commonplaces and that the rhetorical use of such figures had long been a standard feature of Christian discourse. (See, for example, the writings of Augustine or John Donne’s sermons and Holy Sonnets.) Second, any accusation of exaggerated melodrama or overstatement in the “Prayer” also overlooks the degree to which serious illness and devastating rates of mortality – plagues, deaths, executions, amputations – were an everyday part of life in Europe during the 17th century. Viewed in this context, the “Prayer” may still strike modern readers as unnaturally bleak, but it expresses sentiments and feelings that many of Pascal’s contemporaries would have been familiar with and shared.

The “Prayer” can be more accurately characterized as a simple statement of faith and humility and a plea for patience and courage. It expresses the blend of neo-stoicism and contemptus mundi that was common in prayers and sermons of the day. Christian stoicism had been recently introduced into French literature via the writings of Guillaume du Vair, and Pascal had likely read Epictetus’s Enchiridion in du Vair’s translation. Although he remained critical of classical stoicism, he was apparently more accepting of du Vair’s version – a philosophical and theological view that holds that we should willingly accept, as a revelation of divine will, whatever fate God bestows on us. Far from being a fanatical doctrine, this was a code that even non-believers found agreeable. Indeed most of us find it admirable when individuals who are sorely afflicted with a disease or who have suffered the loss of an organ or limb accept their condition with fortitude and equanimity.

vi. Pascal’s Conversation with M. de Saci on Epictetus and Montaigne

The minor work Entretien avec M.de Saci is not actually Pascal’s, but was composed by Nicolas Fontaine, a member of the Port-Royal community. It is the record of a conversation that took place between Pascal and his spiritual director Lemaistre de Sacy shortly after Pascal took up residence at Port-Royal in 1654. The work wasn’t published until 1736, but it’s an important document nevertheless since it represents the fullest discussion that we have of Pascal’s views on Western philosophy. The portrait of Pascal that emerges from the Conversation is well drawn and seems authentic, and the words and style are recognizably his own. Many of the ideas presented in the work can be found scattered throughout the Pensées, where they are expressed in nearly similar language and where once again Epictetus and Montaigne stand as mighty opposites: the former championing but over-estimating the greatness and nobility of humankind, the latter recognizing but exaggerating our folly and ignorance.

Pascal praises Epictetus as a brilliant philosopher whose knowledge of our essential moral duties and especially of our need for patience, courage, faith, and humility is unsurpassed. Unfortunately, the philosopher’s “diabolic pride” leads him astray. For example, Epictetus wrongly supposes that human reason is a perfectly reliable guide to truth. He also errs in holding that the mind and the senses are sufficient for perceiving and understanding the true nature and overall justice of the cosmos.

Of Montaigne, Pascal remarks that although he was a professed Catholic he nevertheless chose to forego Christian doctrine as a source of moral law and turned instead to his, admittedly fallible, personal judgment and natural instinct as ethical guides. Pascal then goes on to criticize Montaigne for his utter and thoroughgoing Pyrrhonism symbolized by the device of a scales that Montaigne had emblazoned on the ceiling of his study with his famous motto Que sais-je?(What do I know?) inscribed beneath. Pascal argues that, in contrast to Epictetus, Montaigne’s error consists not in glorifying or over-estimating human reason and knowledge but rather in denying them any credit or status whatsoever. Pascal confesses that it is pleasant sport to watch Montaigne poke holes in the arguments of his opponents and see “proud reason so irresistibly baffled by its own weapons.” Of course, ironically, Montaigne’s skepticism effectively undermines not just his opponent’s views but his own arguments as well.

Near the end of the conversation, Pascal launches into an oratorical peroration describing how the errors, imperfections, and opposing polarities represented by the two philosophers are ultimately mediated and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. @

It is therefore from this imperfect enlightenment that it happens that the one [that is, Epictetus] knowing the duties of man and being ignorant of his impotence, is lost in presumption, and that the other [that is, Montaigne], knowing the impotence and being ignorant of the duty, falls into laxity; whence it seems that since the one leads to truth, the other to error, there would be formed from their alliance a perfect system of morals. But instead of this peace, nothing but war and a general ruin would result from their union; for the one establishing certainty, the other doubt, the one the greatness of man, the other his weakness, they would destroy the truths as well as the falsehoods of each other. So that they cannot subsist alone because of their defects, nor unite because of their opposition, and thus they break and destroy each other to give place to the truth of the Gospel. This it is that harmonizes the contrarieties by a wholly divine act, and uniting all that is true and expelling all that is false, thus makes of them a truly celestial wisdom in which those opposites accord that were incompatible in human doctrines. . . . Such is the marvelous and novel union which God alone could teach, and which He alone could make, and which is only a type and an effect of the ineffable union of two natures in the single person of a Man-God.

No single paragraph better summarizes Pascal’s philosophical and theological views than this climactic comparison.

3. Mathematical and Scientific Works

a. Conic Sections

Pascal made his first important mathematical discovery and published his first article, the Essay on Conics (1640), at the age of sixteen. Barely an essay at all, the work is a one-page document consisting of three diagrams, three definitions, and two lemmas. Although it had little immediate impact beyond a small circle of mathematicians, it was nevertheless a breakthrough contribution to the emerging new field of projective geometry. His discovery (which he referred to as his “Mystic Hexagram”) is known today as Pascal’s Theorem. It states that if six points are situated on a conic section (an ellipse, parabola, or hyperbola), and if these points are then joined by line segments to form a hexagon, then if the sides of this hexagon are projected beyond the section, the pairs of opposite sides will meet in three points all of which lie on a straight line.

Fig. 1

Figure 1: Pascal's "Mystic Hexagram." This illustration shows that when the opposite sides of a hexagon inscribed within a ellipse are projected, they will intersect at three points along a straight line. (In this case all the points lie entirely outside the ellipse.)

After his death, Pascal’s unpublished mathematical papers (including what seems to have been a full treatise on conics) were collected by his nephew Étienne Périer. Eventually these manuscripts were turned over to the great German philosopher and mathematician Gottfried Leibniz for his evaluation and use. Leibniz left behind an extensive set of notes on the collection and registered his admiration for Pascal’s genius. Unfortunately Pascal’s original papers have all been lost.

b. Experiments on the Vacuum

In 1644 the Italian physicist Evangelista Torricelli, testing a hypothesis suggested by Galileo, took a glass tube closed at one end and filled it with mercury. He then inverted the tube, open end down, into a bowl also containing mercury and watched as the mercury in the tube dropped slightly leaving a vacant space at the top. Contrary to the prevailing scientific view upheld by Aristotelians and Cartesians alike according to which a vacuum in nature is a physical impossibility, Torricelli surmised that the space at the top of the tube was indeed a vacuum and that it was created by the pressure of the external air, which exactly balanced the pressure exerted by the column of mercury inside the tube.

Pascal learned of the experiment from his former mentor Père Mersenne. Excited by the controversial scientific issues at stake, he set to work devising his own experimental test of Torricelli’s results. Just obtaining the required apparatus posed a huge challenge. Scientists of the era typically had to design, specify, oversee the production of, test, and of course pay for their own equipment. Pascal did all that and then went to work conducting his own experiments and demonstrations. Confident of his results, he went on tour to demonstrate his hypothesis, which he was able to do using tubes of different length and diameter and a variety of liquids. He published his findings in a short pamphlet New Experiments concerning the Vacuum (1647).

The decisive experiment, proving that the level of mercury in the tube was due to external air pressure, was conducted at the Puy-de-Dôme, the mountainous lava dome near Pascal’s native Clermont. Pascal designed and organized the experiment, but because of his health issues it was actually conducted by his brother-in-law Florin Périer along with a team of observers, clerics, and local officials. Using two identical tubes, the team measured the levels of mercury at a base point in the town. Then, with a portion of the party staying behind to monitor the mercury level in one tube, which remained at the home base, Florin and the rest of the party ascended the mountain with the other tube and measured the mercury level at various elevations. It was found that the level of mercury in the mobile (or test) tube varied inversely with the altitude. Meanwhile, the mercury level in the stationary (or control) tube never varied. Repeated experiments produced the same conclusive results: the level of mercury was due to air pressure, which also has the ability to create a vacuum.

Pascal published a record of the experiment in a short document entitled “The Account of the Great Experiment of the Equilibrium of Fluids.” to which he appended a closing note that deserves quotation since it marks a historic turning point in the advance of modern science vis-à-vis ancient authority. On the basis of his experiments, he asserts “that nature has no repugnance for the vacuum” and “makes no effort to avoid it”:

. . . all the effects that have been attributed to her horror have their origin in the weight and pressure of the air, that it is their sole and true cause. . . . It is not on this occasion only that, when the weakness of men has been unable to find the true causes, their subtlety has substituted imaginary causes to which they have given specious names filling the ears and not the mind. Thus it is said that the sympathy and antipathy of natural bodies are efficient causes, responsible for many effects, as if inanimate bodies were capable of sympathy and antipathy; it is the same with antiperistasis and with many other chimerical causes, which but give a vain solace to man’s hunger to know hidden truths, and which, far from revealing them, serve only to cover up the ignorance of such inventors and to feed that of their followers.

One other document relating to the vacuum that dates from this period (October 29, 1647) and which bears special mention is Pascal’s reply to (the felicitously if improbably named) Père Noël. A Jesuit priest who embraced the widely accepted doctrine (approved by both Aristotelian and Cartesian physicists) that nature is a material plenum and will not permit a vacuum, Noël had written a letter to Pascal defending the horror vacui viewpoint and arguing that the empty space that Pascal claims to have observed at the top of the tubes in his experiments was not empty space at all but a space necessarily filled with “rarified air” or some other subtle form of substance. Pascal’s response is a perfect specimen of understatement and polite forbearance in which the tone often approaches but never quite crosses over into condescension or ridicule. The provinciales are usually cited as the original instance of classic French prose style, but the letter to Noël and indeed a number of Pascal’s scientific papers – all notable for their force, clarity, concision, and elegance as well as for their utter absence of bombast, fustian, and needless adornment – could also lay claim to setting the model. An early paragraph in Pascal’s letter succinctly defines his criteria and standards of truth in matters of scientific investigation; two later paragraphs illustrate his tactful but forceful way of dealing with the kind of learned ignorance that Sir Francis Bacon had referred to as “vain imaginations” and the “idols of the theatre”:

The rule [of scientific method] is never to make a decisive judgment, affirming or denying a proposition, unless what one affirms or denies satisfies one of the two following conditions: either that of itself it appear so clearly and distinctly to sense or to reason, according as it is subject to one or the other, that the mind cannot doubt its certainty, and this is what we call a principle or axiom, as, for example, if equals are added to equals, the results are equal; or that it be deduced as an infallible and necessary consequence from such principles or axioms . . . . Everything satisfying one of these conditions is certain and true, and everything satisfying neither is considered doubtful and uncertain.  We pass decisive judgment on things of the first kind and leave the rest undecided, calling them, according to their deserts, now a vision, now a caprice, occasionally a fancy, sometimes an idea, and at the most a happy thought; and since it is rash to affirm them, we incline rather to the negative, ready however to return to the affirmative if a convincing demonstration brings their truth to light….

For all things of this kind [that is, hypothetical entities] whose existence is not manifest to sense are as hard to believe as they are easy to invent. Many persons, even among the most learned men of the day, have opposed me with this same substance [that is, rarified air or some comparable ethereal matter] before you (but simply as an idea and not as a certain truth), and that is why I mentioned it among my propositions. Others, to fill empty space with some kind of matter, have imagined one with which they have filled the entire universe, because imagination has this peculiarity that it produces the greatest things with as little time and trouble as little things; some have considered this matter as of the same substance as the sky and the elements, and others of a different substance, as their fancy dictated, for they disposed of it as of their own work.

But if we ask of them, as of you, that you show us this matter, they answer that it cannot be seen; if we ask that it make a sound, they say it cannot be heard, and so with all the remaining senses; and they think they have done much when they have convicted others of powerlessness to show that it does not exist by depriving themselves of all power to show that it does.

Pascal later composed, but never published, two detailed monographs that were discovered among his manuscripts after his death: a Treatise on the Equilibrium of Liquids and a Treatise on the Weight of the Mass of Air. These two treatises represent seminal contributions to the sciences of hydraulics and hydrostatics and include the discovery that if no other forces are acting on a fluid, the pressure will be the same throughout the fluid and the same in all directions – an observation that is known today as Pascal’s Principle. It is in recognition of his important work in the study of fluid mechanics that a standard unit of pressure is today known as the pascal (Pa), defined as a force equal to 1 Newton per square meter.

c. Pascal’s Triangle and Probability Theory

In 1654, Pascal responded to a series of problems posed by his friend Antoine Gombaud, the self-styled Chevalier de Méré, an amateur mathematician and noted gambler. Suppose, Pascal was asked, that you are given 24 rolls of a pair of dice. What is the probability of your throwing double sixes at least one time? Méré also asked a related question known as the “problem of the points” (also known as the problem of the division of the stakes). This problem asks, if a wager game is terminated before it has been completed, how should the contestants divide the stakes? For example, suppose that A and B are playing a winner-take-all game in which a point is scored on every try and the winner is the first player to reach ten points. How should the stakes be divided if the game is terminated after A has 7 points and B has 5?

Pascal developed solutions to these and other problems relating to the calculation of gambling odds and in an exchange of letters shared his insights with the great Toulouse mathematician Pierre de Fermat. Together the two correspondents effectively founded the modern theory of probability.

Part of the foundation for the modern theory is provided in Pascal’s “Treatise on the Arithmetical Triangle,” which he composed in 1653. (He sent a copy of this document to Fermat during their correspondence, but it was never published until after his death.) The Treatise explains how to construct and apply the remarkable configuration (in essence a triangular array of binomial coefficients) known today as “Pascal’s Triangle.” The array had been generated and used previously by Chinese, Indian, Persian, and European mathematicians, and Pascal never claimed to have discovered or originated it. He was simply interested in demonstrating its fascinating properties and powers.

Pascal triangle Figure 2. Pascal's Triangle.

Pascal calls the square containing each number in the array a cell. The numeral 1’s at the top of his triangle head perpendicular rows; those on the left side of the triangle head parallel rows. He calls the third (diagonal) side of the triangle the base. Cells along any diagonal row are called cells of the same base. The first diagonal row (consisting of the number 1) is row 0. The second diagonal row (1, 1) is row 1; and so on. The number value of each cell is equal to the sum of its immediately preceding perpendicular and parallel cells. For example, 120 in the base diagonal (item 4 in row 7) = 36 + 84.

Furthermore, the number value of each cell is also equal to the sum of all the cells of the preceding row (from the first cell to the cell immediately above the target cell). For example, 126 (the number value of cell 6 in row 5) = 1 + 4 + 10 + 20 + 35 + 56 (the sum of cells 1-6 of row 4).

Pascal explains in detail how the Triangle can be used to calculate combinations (that is to compute C in cases where nCr = n things taken r at a time). As Pascal demonstrates, to find the answer we would move perpendicularly down to the nth row and then move diagonally r cells. For example, for 5C4, we would go perpendicularly down to row 5 and then move diagonally 4 cells and find that the number of combinations is 5. Similarly, if we calculate for 6C3,we would move down 6 rows and then diagonally 3 cells and find that the answer is 20. And so on. In another section of the Treatise, Pascal explains how to use the Triangle to solve the Problem of Points.

Solutions to Méré’s problems:

1. Probability of at least one double-six in 24 rolls of two dice: 1 - (35/36)24 = 0.4914.

2. Problem of points: A needs 3 more points, B needs 5 more points. (Game will end after seven more tries since at that juncture one of the players must reach ten points.) Count 3 + 5 rows on the Triangle; then sum the first 5 items. That sum divided by the sum of all items in the row is A’s portion of the stakes. Then sum the remaining 3 items in the row and divide that total by the sum of all the items in the row. That will be B’s portion.

From the Triangle:

(1+7+21+35+35) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 99/128 = A’s portion.

(1+7+21) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 29/128 = B’s portion.

Expressed as a percentage, A receives 77.34375 percent of the stake; B receives 22.65625 percent of the stake.

d. Infinity

The idea of mathematical infinity – of a number that can be vaguely conceived but whose properties and nature can never be fully understood – has strong affinities with Pascal’s idea of God and also relates to his Wager and to his personal anxiety as he contemplates the “eternal silence of these infinite spaces” (201/233).

Imagine Pascal’s Triangle. Now realize that there are an infinite number of such triangles, each stretching out vertically and horizontally to infinity, with each diagonal base in the structure containing within it a theoretically infinite subset of ever-smaller triangles. Such is the paradoxical notion of infinity, a concept that astounded and haunted Pascal, and which has teased, baffled, and intrigued a long list of theorists and commentators from Nicholas of Cusa and Giordano Bruno to Bertrand Russell and David Foster Wallace. Although the idea of infinity can fill the imagination with dread, it can also, as Pascal points out at the conclusion of his treatise Of the Geometrical Spirit, provide us with a true understanding of nature and of our place in it:

But those who clearly perceive these truths will be able to admire the grandeur and power of nature in this double infinity that surrounds us on all sides, and to learn by this marvelous consideration to know themselves, in regarding themselves thus placed between an infinitude and a negation of extension, between an infinitude and a negation of number, between an infinitude and a negation of movement, between an infinitude and a negation of time. From which we may learn to estimate ourselves at our true value, and to form reflections which will be worth more than all the rest of geometry itself.

e. Solving the Cycloid

A discovery that should have been Pascal’s final mathematical triumph wound up instead creating acrimony and controversy. In the spring of 1658, supposedly as a diversion while contending with a toothache, he took up the problem of the roulette or cycloid, a problem that had puzzled some of Europe’s best mathematicians, including Galileo and Descartes, for nearly a century.

Pascal Fig. 3

Figure 3: Cycloid

Imagine a point P on the circumference of a revolving circle. A cycloid is the curve described by P as it rolls along a straight line.  The challenge is to discover and prove the area of this curve geometrically. Pascal worked out his own solution and then, as was common practice at the time, issued a public challenge to fellow mathematicians. Under the name Amos Dettonville, an anagram of the pseudonym Louis de Montalte, which he had used to write the provinciales (an anagram of the motto Talentum Deo Soli – “My talent for God alone”—according to Morris Bishop), Pascal drew up a list of six problems relating to the cycloid and offered a prize of 600 livres to the first person to solve them (Bishop 222). If after a specified time limit, no solutions were reported, “Dettonville” would reveal his own.

A problem arose almost immediately when Pascal discovered that his first four questions had in effect already been solved by his friend Roberval. The contest was therefore reduced to the final two questions, a change that, unfortunately, was not made clear to all the contestants. In addition, some contestants protested that the time limit was unreasonably short. Christian Huygens and Christopher Wren published solutions, but did not compete for the prize. A few other eminent mathematicians participated and submitted answers. However, Pascal, finding none of the submissions fully satisfactory, eventually revealed his own solutions and declared himself the winner. Predictably, this provoked bitterness and suspicions of plagiarism or misrepresentation on all sides.

Though the controversy left a blemish on Pascal’s reputation, his work on the cycloid has been admired by later mathematicians for its ingenuity and elegance, and he is credited, alongside his great contemporaries Galileo, Torricelli, Descartes, Mersenne, Roberval, Fermat, Wren, and Huygens, as having helped to solve the curve once known for its power to attract and captivate all who studied it as the “Helen of geometers.” In 1672, after having obtained and reviewed copies of Pascal’s papers on conics and the cycloid, Leibniz attested to their brilliance and concluded that were it not for an “evil fate” (by which phrase it’s unclear whether he meant their author’s short lifespan or his absorption in Jansenist theology) Pascal would have almost certainly gone on to make further and deeper mathematical discoveries.

Summarizing Pascal’s scientific and mathematical achievements, it can be said that in an age of amateurism, when everyone from priests and attorneys to soldiers and salonnières dabbled in “natural philosophy,” he was a marvel who often found himself in a position analogous to that later experienced by Newton and Leibniz: that is, he had to communicate dramatically new, highly complex and abstract concepts to readers who lacked his extraordinary mathematical imagination and facility. Having made his discoveries more or less instinctively, using his own private mathematical inventions and methods, he then found he had to “translate” his ideas into the conventionally accepted language and procedures of his peers and fellow numerophiles. Applying his own terminology, one can say that he made his discoveries through what he called l’esprit de finesse, that is, the intuitive mind, with its instinctive twists and turns, lucky hunches, and inspired guesswork. He found, however, that in order to communicate his findings to others he had to turn to what he styled l’esprit géométrique that is, the geometric mind, which he defined as the skill or capacity for “demonstrating truths already found, and of elucidating them in such a manner that the proof of them shall be irresistible”. Excellence in science and mathematics, he argued, requires both capabilities. It was Pascal’s good fortune to possess both l’esprit de finesse and l’esprit géométrique in rare and powerful abundance.

4. Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge

a. Philosophy of Science

Of the many great natural philosophers of the 17th century  – a group that includes both theoreticians and experimentalists and such illustrious names as Galileo, Descartes, Bacon, Boyle, Huygens, and Gassendi – Pascal arguably was the one who came closest to articulating a coherent, comprehensive, durable philosophy of science consistent with and comparable to the standard view that prevails today, except that he came up short. As Desmond M. Clarke has argued, Pascal was torn between his love of geometric proof and pure logical demonstration on the one hand and his skeptical, pragmatic instincts in favor of down-to-earth experimentalism and empiricism on the other. As a result he seemed trapped in a kind of philosophical limbo. (See “Pascal’s Philosophy of Science,” in Hammond, 118.) Similarly, although he seemed to recognize that our knowledge of the natural world is only probable and can never be certain, a part of him nevertheless remained enthralled by the “will-o-the-wisp” or “Holy Grail” of absolute certainty.

In most other respects, Pascal’s outlook is ahead of its time and admirable in its self-restraint and in its awareness of its own limitations. Unlike Bacon, he makes room for hypothesis and even imaginative insight and conjecture (l’esprit de finesse) and also allows a deductive component a la Descartes (l’esprit géométrique). He acknowledges that all hypotheses must be tested and confirmed by rigorous experiments, and even if he didn’t actually carry out his experiments exactly as described, he nevertheless accepts the necessity of such testing. Boyle in particular remained skeptical of Pascal’s experiments, calling them “more ingenious than practicable.” He especially marveled at the availability of 40-ft. Torricelli tubes and of brass fittings engineered to nearly microscopic precision. Attempting to reproduce one of Pascal’s hydrostatic tests involving a fly in a chamber of water, Boyle attests that “upon tryal with a strong flie” the creature “presently drowned” (243.)

Pascal fully understood that once a hypothesis is tested and confirmed, the problem of determining the true cause of the phenomenon still remains and becomes itself a matter for further conjecture. For example, take his prediction, experimentally confirmed, that the level of mercury in a Torricelli tube will decline as altitude increases. Pascal claimed that this phenomenon was due to the weight of air, though he knew that other factors might also explain the same effect. Indeed, for all he knew, an invisible emanation from the god Mercury may have influenced his results. (Ironically, the famous Puy-de-Dôme experiment had been performed near an ancient temple to that deity). As Pascal observed to Father Noël, fanciful explanations for phenomena are as easy to imagine as they are impossible to disprove.

In his correspondence with Noël, Pascal at one point suggests that it is fatal for one’s hypothesis if an experimental test fails to confirm a predicted outcome. However, as he himself and his fellow experimentalists certainly knew, there can be nearly as many reasons why an expected result does not occur, such as defective apparatus, lack of proper controls, measurement errors, extraordinary test circumstances, etc, as there are explanations for a result that occurs as expected. Apparently in his haste to champion the new science of experimentalism against its critics, both Cartesian and Scholastic, Pascal wanted to at least be able to say that if experiments cannot conclusively prove a given hypothesis, then they may at least be able to disprove it. If this was his intention, he was anticipating by nearly three centuries Karl Popper’s theory of empirical falsification and opposed to (and seemingly fearful at the prospect of) any view similar to WVO Quine’s theory of confirmation holism, according to which all scientific claims are at best only probable and there is no such thing as a decisive experiment.

b. Theory of Knowledge

Que-sais-je? (“What do I know?”) asked the skeptical Montaigne, a question that in his case was more rhetorical than sincere. Que puis-je savoir? (“What can I know?”) was Pascal’s more earnest if also slightly skeptical variation. Anticipating Kant, he wondered with what limitations and with what level of assurance we can confidently say we know what we believe we know.

Pascal has been plausibly labeled an empiricist, a foundationalist, even a positivist and a skeptic. The confusion is understandable and is due largely to the fact that his epistemological views are complex and seem in certain respects equivocal or inconsistent. For example, he accepts the rule of authority in some areas of knowledge, such as ancient history, while opposing and even forbidding it in others, especially physical science. He also recognizes three different types or sources of knowledge related to his so-called “three orders”: body/sense; mind/reason; heart/will or instinct, each with its own domain or area of applicability, level of certainty, and tests of confirmation and reliability.

i. Reason and Sense

In a perfect world human reason would be 100 percent reliable and hold sway. Presumably, Adam, prior to the Fall, had such a pristine and certain view of things, such that there was a perfect congruency or correspondence between his inner perceptions and the outer world. Pascal believes that the axioms and first principles of math, geometry, and logic constitute knowledge of this kind. They are perceived directly by reason and (along with any consequences that we can directly deduce from them) represent the only knowledge that we can know infallibly and with certainty. It is with respect to such axioms and principles alone that Pascal accepts Descartes’ criteria of clearness and distinctness as reliable evidence of truth. Everything else is subject to error and doubt.

A critic of Cartesian rationalism and the deductive method, which he referred to as “useless and uncertain” – 887/445, Pascal was for the most part an empiricist and experimentalist who held that our knowledge of the natural world is acquired through the senses and must be tested and empirically verified by experiment. Reason also has a role in this process. It guides our observations and assists us in the forming of hypotheses and predictions. It is reason that also judges and approves (or disapproves) the final results, though it does so on the basis of empirical evidence, not deductive logic or some preconceived system.

In the Preface to his Treatise on the Vacuum, Pascal declares that reason and sense alone must rule and authority has no place in the establishment of scientific truth. Authority is to be respected, he says, in history, jurisprudence, languages, and above all in matters of theology, where the authority of Scripture and the Fathers is omnipotent. But, he argues that in the case of physical science reverence for the ancients can actually cloud the truth and impede the advancement of knowledge, especially when such reverence is, blind, misplaced, or overly devout. He concludes the Preface with a witty reversal of roles in the heated, ongoing debate between “ancients and moderns”:

Those whom we call ancient were really new in all things, and properly constituted the infancy of mankind; and as we have joined to their knowledge the experience of the centuries which have followed them, it is in ourselves that we should find this antiquity that we revere in others.

ii. The Heart

If there is an element of mystery in Pascal’s theory of knowledge, it is in the source of knowledge and inner being that he terms le Coeur. In scattered places throughout the Pensées he makes reference to a logique du coeur or an ordre du coeur. But what exactly he means by such phrases he never clearly explains. The term coeur appears most famously in fragment 423/680:

The heart has its reasons, which reason does not know. We feel it in a thousand things. I say that the heart naturally loves the Universal Being, and also itself naturally, according as it gives itself to them; and it hardens itself against one or the other at its will. You have rejected the one, and kept the other. Is it by reason that you love yourself?

“The heart has its reasons, which reason doesn’t know.” Not only has Pascal’s famous aphorism become an oft-quoted cliché, it has also managed to enter and even permeate popular culture in the form of song lyrics, as the title of a love memoir, and as a message of endearment or benediction on bumper stickers and greeting cards. Even people who have never read a page of the Pensées are familiar with the quote, and while it seems safe to say that Pascal had no such sentimental meaning in mind, amour, in its various senses from romantic love and self-love to charity and maternal instinct, seems an inescapable association when we hear the phrase “reasons of the heart.” In fact, the Catholic scholar Romano Guardini has plausibly offered “love” and “charity” as appropriate translations or synonyms for coeur (133).

It has also been suggested that by “heart” Pascal means something transcending reason and prior to it (Peters 168-171; Kearns 101-02), almost as if it were some kind of Kantian intuition, or as if it were a form of natural or divinely endowed intelligence on the very cutting edge of perception; some instinctive faculty that, without contradicting reason, can either surpass it or supplement it. (110/142). Such a faculty, if it is indeed instinctive, would presumably be inborn and thus either a part of our basic nature and something that all humans share or a special gift or grace bestowed by God to the elect. And if it is intuitive, then it possibly bears some relation to what Pascal elsewhere terms l’esprit de finesse, the subtle or intuitive component of intellect that somehow “sees” or penetrates directly into truths that l’esprit géométrique,  the logical or sequential intelligence, can arrive at only via incremental, deductive steps. Heart-knowledge would then be like some faint glimmer or trace of the instantaneous, clairvoyant understanding that the unfallen Adam was believed to enjoy in Paradise. In any case, the notion of a raison du Coeur remains a critical crux in Pascal studies and posed a mystery and challenge to his readers.

5. Fideism

Fideism can be defined as the view that religious truth is ascertainable by faith alone and that faith is separate from, superior to, and generally antagonistic towards reason. Whenever the term shows up in a religious or philosophical discussion, it is typically in conjunction with a list that includes names like Tertullian, Luther, Montaigne, Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein, and William James. Pascal’s name is often inserted into this group.

Based on the foregoing definition of fideism, Pascal does not fit into such a list, though the tendency to include him is understandable. Perhaps the most compelling evidence in favor of labeling him a fideist is the striking fact of his midnight conversion and “Night of Fire,” the powerful, visionary experience, clearly more mystical than rational, on the basis of which he wound up explicitly rejecting “the god of the philosophers.” However, just because the medium or process through which a belief is achieved may not be rational, doesn’t mean that the belief itself  is unreasonable. For Pascal, that belief was his acceptance of Jesus Christ as his Lord and Savior. Kekule discovered the shape and structure of the benzene molecule in a dream. Though his means of discovery was non-rational, what he discovered was quite reasonable and proved true.

Another reason why Pascal’s religious views are sometimes confused with fideism is his notion of an infinite and hidden God, who is essentially beyond our comprehension and understanding and whose existence and nature transcends the limited perspectives of reason and sense perception. However, once again, just because God surpasses or eludes empirical sense and reason doesn’t mean that He is contrary to or incompatible with them. “Faith,” Pascal writes, “indeed tells what the senses do not tell, but not the contrary of what they see. It is above them, and not contrary to them” (185/265). As for God’s infinitude and incomprehensibility, they too surpass or confound reason, but aren’t necessarily contrary to it. The notion of mathematical infinity baffles us in the same way. As Pascal points out, just because something is incomprehensible, for example, God, infinity, “a sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere,” doesn’t mean that it can’t exist (149,230/182,262).

Some critics have even used the Wager itself (418/680) as a basis for linking Pascal to fideism since that fragment sets forth and vividly illustrates the view that God’s existence is uncertain and can’t be proved. Of particular significance in this respect is the paragraph in which Pascal, in an observation that seems to echo Tertullian almost as much as St. Paul, candidly acknowledges the “foolishness” of the Christian creed:

Who then will blame Christians for not being able to give reasons for their beliefs, since they profess belief in a religion which they cannot explain? They declare, when they expound it to the world, that it is foolishness, stultitiam; and then you complain because they do not prove it! If they proved it, they would not keep their word; it is through their lack of proofs that they show they are not lacking in sense.

But, again, not being able to prove or give a convincing explanation for a belief is not quite the same thing as saying that the belief is incompatible with or contrary to reason. Conspiracy theories are typically lamely supported and impossible to prove, but they are seldom implausible or illogical. Moreover, it is not just a fideistic claim, but a perfectly orthodox Catholic view (and indeed a widely observable fact) that reason has limits; that it is indeed, as Pascal claims, unreasonable to trust reason too much. “Reason's last step is the recognition that there are an infinite number of things which are beyond it.”  (188/220.)

Pascal eschewed metaphysical proofs of God’s existence not on fideistic grounds because he thought that, as rational constructions, they were contrary to faith, but because he felt they were emotionally sterile and too abstruse and technical to persuade a non-believer:

The metaphysical proofs for the existence of God are so remote from human reasoning and so involved that they make little impact, and, even if they did help some people, it would only be for the moment during which they watched the demonstration, because an hour later they would be afraid they had made a mistake. (190/222)

And this is why I shall not undertake here to prove by reasons from nature either the existence of God, or the Trinity or the immortality of the soul, or anything of that kind: not just because I should not feel competent to find in nature arguments which would convince hardened atheists, but also because such knowledge, without Christ, is useless and sterile. Even if someone were convinced that the proportions between numbers are immaterial, eternal truths, depending on a first truth in which they subsist, called God, I should not consider that he made much progress towards his salvation. The Christian's God does not consist merely of a God who is the author of mathematical truths and the order of the elements. That is the portion of the heathen and Epicureans. (449/690)

In the end, the strongest reason for denying Pascal a place within fideism is that he believed that even the most “irrational” proofs of Christianity – the prophesies, miracles, typological confirmations, and so forth – were not only not contrary to reason but were in fact perfectly compatible with it. (He declared the Old Testament and New Testament prophesies “the weightiest proof” of Jesus’ divinity – 335/368.) That Christianity is reasonable though not provable by reason effectively summarizes one of the central arguments of the entire Pensées.

6. Existentialism

Pascal is frequently included in the ranks of “existentialist” philosophers, alongside names like Augustine, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Sartre.

Again it can be asked (as it was in the case of his alleged affiliation with fideism) whether he belongs in such a list . Once again, the strict, technical response would seem to be that he isn’t an existentialist–although in this case the label is arguably more appropriate and may even be justified.

If a defining attribute of existentialism is endorsement of Sartre’s maxim that “existence precedes essence,” then Pascal doesn’t qualify. For in his view human beings enter the world with a largely defined and determined nature and a destiny that is partly charted, partly free. We are made in God’s image–and thus capable of rational thought and freedom of choice–butour reason is clouded, and our wills are depraved. We are broken creatures and would be hopelessly lost if it were not for divine grace. If such a view of the human condition is incompatible with existentialism, then Pascal is no existentialist.

On the other hand, if Augustine and Kierkegaard (or for that matter any Christian thinker) can be considered existentialists in some broad sense, then it is hard to see why Pascal might not also qualify.  Like Augustine and Kierkegaard, he emphasizes the priority of the individual and the deeply personal character of our choice to believe. Like them, he values and personally exemplifies an extreme inwardness, indeed at times displays an almost fanatical absorption in his mental and spiritual life. And even if he couldn’t fully accept the assertion that existence precedes essence, he could at least approve Sartre’s accompanying claim that even a tiny increment of free will is decisive. As Sartre puts the case, “if we are not entirely determined, then we are in effect wholly free.” Pascal would agree, though he would attribute this freedom to divine grace rather than accepting it as a mere donnée or product of happenstance.

The Confessions, with its focus on the self and personal identity, and especially on the self as a cumulative record, inscribed in memory, of our life-altering decisions and events, is conceivably the first existentialist text. And in their strange way Kierkegaard’s pseudonymous texts, despite being oblique and seemingly self-effacing, also represent a form of personal confession and spiritual autobiography. The Pensées stands as an intermediate text in this series, an experiment in autobiographical apologetics linking the direct, confessional style of Augustine with the multiple personae, lyrical vignettes, and pensive fragments typical of Kierkegaard.

That human life without God is wretched and that the human condition is marked by restlessness, ennui, and anxiety is an observation common to all three writers. Another common feature of their work is the recurrent image of a vast gulf or abyss. Augustine compares the human soul to a deep abyss and likens it to the Nothingness preceding the Creation (Genesis 1:2). Without the light of God, he suggests, we are but a dark emptiness. Kierkegaard argues that human freedom necessarily entails a constant sense of anxiety, and his image of our condition is that of a person standing on the edge of a dark precipice. Pascal’s dread of the silence of infinite space (201/233) and similar images in the Pensées of void and darkness echo these sentiments. And in the background of this imagery also stands the legend of his personal idée fixe – that is, his feeling that he was constantly shadowed by a personal abyss. (This legend relates to the aforementioned story of his accident on the Pont de Neuilly when his coach supposedly almost plunged into the Seine – an unconfirmed but oft-retold event that has been perpetuated and basically permanently enshrined in Baudelaire’s poem “Le Gouffre” and in Freud’s writings on obsession.)

In the Confessions Augustine describes the long ordeal that eventually leads to his conversion. But his narrative doesn’t end at that point. Instead, he must begin a new spiritual test and journey – that of actually living a Christian life. Similarly, Kierkegaard never wrote of being a Christian, but always of becoming one. He regarded an authentic Christian life as a constant trial and task. Like Augustine, Pascal places even harsher spiritual demands on himself after his conversion. And like Kierkegaard, he believes that true Christianity is an ever-striving imitatio Christi, a continual remaking of oneself in the image and spirit of Jesus.

With these resemblances in mind, it’s hardly a stretch to say that entire portions of the Pensées, translated into Latin or Danish, could easily pass for an excerpt from Augustine or from Kierkegaard’s Training in Christianity or another of the author’s “edifying” texts. Similarly, if we place Pascal in a sequence of “Christian existentialist” writers, a line that arguably proceeds from Augustine to Kierkegaard and then on to, say, Unamuno and Berdyaev, we find the same emphasis on personal experience and individual freedom and responsibility; the same rhetorical skill and verbal flourishes; the same flair for metaphor and self-dramatization. In short, if we accept existentialism as not so much a system or body of doctrine, but as more of a perspective or attitude towards life – an exacting and indeed tragic sense of life (depicted graphically and with Dostoyevsky-like force in fragment 434/686) – then Pascal can be considered an existentialist philosopher.

7. Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy

 “Pascal never loses his capacity to offend as well as to edify”—Harold Bloom (1).

 “How few,” wrote Walter Pater in what was to be his last work, a sparkling critical essay on Pascal, “how select, are the literary figures who have earned the honor of receiving regular ongoing criticism, both appreciative and deprecatory, from their successors.” Pascal has earned that honor and is of that rare and select company, having acquired during the nearly four centuries since his birth a long line of admirers and detractors, including many of the leading names in world literature. Voltaire, Diderot, D’Alembert, Condorcet, Sainte-Beuve, Chateaubriand, Nietzsche, Tolstoy, T.S. Eliot, Borges, Bertrand Russell, Paul Valéry, Harold Bloom – the list of important writers and thinkers who have studied Pascal and gone on to voice their appreciation or discontent could be extended literally for pages.

In his introductory essay to the Pensées published in 1933, Eliot referred to Pascal as “one of those writers who will be and who must be studied afresh by men in every generation. It is not he who changes, but we who change. It is not our knowledge of him that increases, but our world that alters and our attitudes towards it.” (355)

For some reason Eliot assumed that our knowledge of Pascal was basically complete eighty years ago and that modern scholarship would do little to alter or augment our understanding of his life and work. On this point he was quite mistaken. In fact, on the contrary, owing to the biographical and textual labors of scholars like Lafuma, Sellier, and Mesnard, students of Pascal today have a much fuller understanding of the author’s personal life, family, medical history, intellectual and religious development, and social milieu, as well as a far better sense of the likely order, design, and method of the Pensées, than any previous generation of readers.

Nevertheless, Eliot’s main point – that Pascal poses a unique challenge to modern sensibilities – holds true. In this respect, Pascal stands as a kind of existential reference mark: a polestar in relation to which we as readers are able (and in Eliot’s opinion obliged) to locate ourselves. He remains a fixed point against which we are challenged to measure the sincerity and durability of our own values and beliefs.

Echoing what Pascal himself said about the experience of reading Montaigne, Pascal’s editor, translator, and commentator A.J. Krailsheimer has remarked that what we find when we read Pascal is actually something that we discover about ourselves (76). In effect, what both Krailsheimer and Eliot are suggesting is that ultimately there is not one Pascal, but many – possibly as many as there are readers of his texts. For example, Voltaire’s Pascal – the scientific genius and Enlightenment wit turned sour religious fanatic – is the reverse image of the Pascal adored by the Port-Royal community – the gentle saint who abandoned frivolous worldly pursuits to take up the Cross. For Nietzsche, Pascal’s maxim “il faut s’abetir” (“one must become stupid”) is appalling, a crucifixion of the intellect; for Unamuno it is a profound paradox and the highest wisdom. Valéry’s Pascal is a sententious and badgering preacher, oblivious to the beauty of nature; the Pascal of Sainte-Beuve is an “athlete, martyr, and hero of the invisible moral world.” What Gilberte Perier refers to as her brother’s “second conversion,” Bertrand Russell regards as an act of “philosophical suicide.” And so on. In short, Pascal’s writings, and especially the Pensées, have served less as a window into the author’s soul than as a kind of mirror or prism reflecting the different outlooks and opinions of his readers.

Of course any proper summation of Pascal’s cultural legacy must include his contributions to probability theory and game theory and his invention of the mechanical computer (in honor of which the Swiss computer scientist Niklaus Wirth aptly named his new programming language Pascal). And, one must include all the other eponymous scientific, mathematical, and theological concepts (Pascal’s Theorem, Pascal’s Principle, Pascal’s Triangle, Pascal’s Wager, and so forth) that bear his name. In addition, every modern system of intra-urban or inter-urban shuttle transportation also owes a debt to the philosopher, who first conceived such a system and oversaw its original implementation in the city of Paris.

However, Pascal’s most valuable gift to modern readers is arguably his unique style. His combination of wit, irony, and aphorism, his ease and clarity, his air of someone skilled both in urbane conversation and erudite technical debate was to a large extent already present and on dazzling display in Montaigne. The same features reappear in the writings of Voltaire and the philosophes. And today, thanks largely to Pascal, these attributes have become a part of French literary tradition. However, what sets Pascal’s style apart, especially in the Pensées, is that supplemental to his characteristic élan and luster he adds a tone of existential angst: a visionary quality, together with an element of strangeness that is utterly foreign to the works of Montaigne and Voltaire but which appears powerfully in writers like Dante, Kafka, and Borges. Pascal’s imagination, like theirs, seems haunted by the notion of infinity and by images of mystery and turmoil; by circles, mazes, precipices, and abysses:

“At the far end of an infinite distance a coin is being spun . . .” 418/680.

 “Nature is an infinite sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere” 199/230.

Relatively few writers, and certainly few philosophers, have his uncanny quality, using that term in Freud’s sense as the ability to make familiar ideas seem strange and strange ideas seem familiar. Pater rightly called him the intellectual equivalent of lightning.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and translations of works by Pascal

  • Faugère, Prosper, ed. The Miscellaneous Writings of Pascal (consisting of Letters, Essays, Conversations, and Miscellaneous Thoughts). George Pearce, tr. London: Longman, Brown, Green, and Longmans, 1849.
  • Mesnard, Jean, ed. Œuvres complètes de Pascal. 4 vols. (to date). Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1964-1992.
  • Pascal, Blaise, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Louis Lafuma (ed). Oeuvres Complètes. Paris: Seuill, 1980.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Thoughts, Letters, and Opuscules. O. W. Wright, tr. New York: Hurd and Houghton, 1869.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Provincial LettersPenséesScientific Treatises. Chicago: Encyclopedia Britannica, 1952.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. Roger Ariew, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 2004.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. AJ Krailsheimer, trans. New York: Penguin Books, 1995.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées and Other Writings. Honor Levi, trans. Anthony Levi, ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Provincial Letters, translated by Hilaire Belloc, Catholic Truth Society, 1921.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Édition de Pascal, Provinciales, Pensées et opuscules divers. Phillipe Sellier and G. Ferryrolles, eds. Paris: La Pochothèque, 2004.
  • Pascal, Jacqueline, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Marguerite Périer. Lettres, opuscules et mémoires de madame Perier et de Jacqueline, soeurs de Pascal, et de Marguerite Perier, sa nièce: Publiés sur les manuscrits originaux par M. P. Faugère. Armand Prosper Faugère, ed. Paris: Auguste Vaton, 1845. (Elibron Classics replica edition, 2001.)

b. Biographical and critical studies

  • Bishop, Morris. Pascal: The Life of Genius. New York: Reynel & Hitchcock, 1936.
  • Bloom, Harold, ed. Blaise Pascal: Modern Critical Views. New York: Chelsea House, 1989.
  • Borges, Jorge Luis. “Pascal’s Sphere.” In Selected Non-Fictions. New York: Penguin Books, 1999.
  • Boyle, Robert. Hydrostatical Paradoxes: Made Out by New Experiments. Oxford: William Hall, 1666.
  • Cobb, William Frederick. “Pascal.” In James Hastings and John A. Selbie, eds. The Encyclopedia of Religion and Ethics, Part 18. Reprint. Whitefish, MT: Kessinger Publishing, 2003. 645-657.
  • Cousin, Victor. Études sur Pascal. 5th edition. Paris, Didier, 1857. Digitized by Google Books.
  • Davidson, Hugh M. Blaise Pascal. Boston: Twayne, 1983.
  • Edward, AWF. Pascal’s Arithmetical Triangle: The Story of a Mathematical Idea. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 2002.
  • Eliot, T.S. “The Pensées of Pascal.” Selected Essays. New York: Harcourt, Brace, and World, 1964; 355-368.
  • Faugere, Prosper. Génie et Écrits de Pascal. Paris, 1847. Digitized by Google Books.
  • Goldmann, Lucien. The Hidden God: A Study of Tragic Vision in the Pensées of Pascal and the Tragedies of Racine. Tr. Philip Thody. Brill, 1964.
  • Guardini, Romano. Pascal for Our Time. New York: Herder and Herder, 1966.
  • Hammond, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Pascal. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • James, William. “The Will to Believe.” In Religion from Tolstoy to Camus. Walter Kaufmann, ed.  New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 2002. 221-238.
  • Jones, Matthew. The Good Life in the Scientific Revolution: Descartes, Pascal, Leibniz and the Cultivation of Virtue. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006.
  • Kearns, Edward John. Ideas in Seventeenth-Century France. Manchester, UK: Manchester University Press, 1979.
  • Krailsheimer, A.J. Pascal. New York: Hill and Wang, 1980.
  • Melzer, Sara E. Discourse of the Fall: A Study of Pascal’s Pensées. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1986.
  • Mesnard, Jean. Pascal. Claude and Marcia Abraham, tr. Tuscaloosa, AL: University of Alabama Press, 1969.
  • Mesnard, Jean. Pascal: His Life and Works. London: Harvill Press, 1952.
  • Mill, J.S. “Theism.” In Three Essays on Religion. London: Longmans, Green, and Company, 1885.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich. On the Genealogy of Morals and Ecce Homo. Walter Kaufmann, tr. New York: Vintage Books, 1969.
  • Pater: "Pascal" in Miscellaneous Studies: A Series of Essays,London: MacMillan, 1920.
  • Périer, Gilberte Pascal. La vie de M. Pascal. Paris: Lettres Moderne, 1964.
  • Peters, James R. The Logic of the Heart: Augustine, Pascal, and the Rationality of Faith. Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Publishing, 2009.
  • Sainte-Beuve, Charles Augustin. “Pascal.” In Essays, volume 1.  London: Gibbings and Company Limited, 1901, pp. 1-15.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. “Freedom and Responsibility.” In The Philosophy of Existentialism: Selected Essays. New York: Philosophical Library, 1965.
  • Sellier, Phillipe. Pascal et Saint Augustin. Paris: A. Colin, 1970.
  • Vainio, Olli-Pekka. Beyond Fideism: Negotiable Religious Identities. Surrey, UK: Ashgate Publishing, 2010.
  • Valéry, Paul. “Variation sur une ‘Pensèe.’” Revue Hebdomadaire, XXXII (July 14, 1923), 161-170.
  • Voltaire. Philosophical Letters. Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, 2003.
  • Wallace, David Foster. Everything and More: A Compact History of Infinity. New York: WW Norton, 2003.
  • Wetsel, David. L’Écriture et le Reste: The Pensées of Pascal in the Exegetical Tradition of Port-Royal. Columbus, Ohio: The Ohio State University Press, 1981.
  • Wood, William. Blaise Pascal on Duplicity, Sin, and the Fall: The Secret Instinct. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013.


Author Information

David Simpson
Email: dsimpson@depaul.edu
Depaul University
U. S. A.