Plato: The Academy

greek_vase Plato’s enormous impact on later philosophy, education, and culture can be traced to three interrelated aspects of his philosophical life: his written philosophical dialogues, the teaching and writings of his student Aristotle, and the educational organization he began, “the Academy.” Plato’s Academy took its name from the place where its members congregated, the Akadēmeia, an area outside of the Athens city walls that originally held a sacred grove and later contained a religious precinct and a public gymnasium.

In the fifth century B.C.E., the grounds of the Academy, like those of the Lyceum and the Cynosarges, the two other large gymnasia outside the Athens city walls, became a place for intellectual discussion as well as for exercise and religious activities. This addition to the gymnasia’s purpose was due to the changing currents in Athenian education, politics, and culture, as philosophers and sophists came from other cities to partake in the ferment and energy of Athens. Gymnasia became public places where philosophers could congregate for discussion and where sophists could offer samples of their wisdom to entice students to sign up for private instruction.

This fifth-century use of gymnasia by sophists and philosophers was a precursor to the “school movement” of the fourth century B.C.E., represented by Antisthenes teaching in the Cynosarges, Isocrates near the Lyceum, Plato in the Academy, Aristotle in the Lyceum, Zeno in the Stoa Poikile, and Epicurus in his private garden. Although these organizations contributed to the development of medieval, Renaissance, and contemporary schools, colleges, and universities, it is important to remember their closer kinship to the educational activities of the sophists, Socrates, and others.

Plato began leading and participating in discussions at the Academy’s grounds in the early decades of the fourth century B.C.E. Intellectuals with a variety of interests came to meet with Plato—who gave at least one public lecture—as well as conduct their own research and participate in dicussions on the public grounds of the Academy and in the garden of the property Plato owned nearby. By the mid-370s B.C.E., the Academy was able to attract Xenocrates from Chalcedon (Dillon 2003: 89), and in 367 Aristotle arrived at the Platonic Academy from relatively far-off Stagira.

While the Academy in Plato’s time was unified around Plato’s personality and a specific geographical location, it was different from other schools in that Plato encouraged doctrinal diversity and multiple perspectives within it. A scholarch, or ruler of the school, headed the Academy for several generations after Plato’s death in 347 B.C.E. and often powerfully influenced its character and direction. Though the Roman general Sulla’s destruction of the Academy’s grove and gymnasium in 86 B.C.E. marks the end of the particular institution begun by Plato, philosophers who identified as Platonists and Academics persisted in Athens until at least the sixth century C.E. This event also represents a transition point for the Academy from an educational institution tied to a particular place to an Academic school of thought stretching from Plato to fifth-century C.E. neo-Platonists.

Table of Contents

  1. The Academy Prior to Plato’s Academy: Sacred Grove, Religious Sanctuary, Gymnasium, Public Park
  2. Athenian Education Prior to Plato’s Academy: Old Education, Sophists, Socrates and his Circle
  3. The Academy in Plato’s Time
    1. Location and Funding
    2. Areas of Study, Students, Methods of Instruction
  4. The Academy after Plato
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Academy Prior to Plato’s Academy: Sacred Grove, Religious Sanctuary, Gymnasium, Public Park

In early times, the area northwest of Athens near the river Cephissus was known as the Akadēmeia or Hekadēmeia and contained a sacred grove, possibly named after a hero called Akademos or Hekademos (Diogenes Laertius, Lives and Opinions of Eminent Philosophers III.7-8, cited hereafter as “Lives”). Plutarch mentions a mythical Akademos as a possible namesake for the Academy, but Plutarch also records that the Academy may have been named after a certain Echedemos (Theseus 32.3-4). While the Academy may have been named after an ancient hero, it is also possible that an ancient hero may have been created to account for the Academy’s name.

The Academy was bordered on the east by Hippios Kolonos and to the south by the Kerameikos district, which was famous for its pottery production.  In the late sixth century B.C.E., the Peisistratid tyrant Hipparchus reportedly constructed a public gymnasium in the area known as the Academy (Suda, Hipparchou teichion). This building project, known for its expense, walled in part of the area known as the Academy. Hipparchus probably developed the gymnasium at the Academy to win favor with residents of the Kerameikos district. Like the other major gymnasia outside the city walls, the Lyceum and the Cynosarges, the Academy’s function as a gymnasium operated in tandem with its function as a religious sanctuary.

After Xerxes led the Persians to burn Athens in 480 B.C.E., Themistocles rebuilt the city wall in 478 B.C.E. (Thucydides 1.90), dividing the Kerameikos into an inner Kerameikos and outer Kerameikos. Some time afterwards, Cimon reportedly rebuilt the Academy as a public park and gymnasium by providing it with a water supply, running tracks, and shaded walks (Plutarch, Cimon 13.8).  On the way to the Academy from Athens, one passed from the inner Kerameikos to the outer Kerameikos through the Dipylon gate in the city’s wall; continuing on the road to the Academy, one passed through a large cemetery. Referring to the area of the outer Kerameikos on the way to the Academy, Thucydides writes, “The dead are laid in the public sepulcher in the most beautiful suburb of the city, in which those who fall in war are always buried, with the exception of those slain at Marathon” (Thucydides 2.34.5, trans. Crawley).  Pausanias, writing in the second century C.E., likewise describes the Academy as a district outside of Athens that has graves, sanctuaries, alters, and a gymnasium (Attica XXIX-XXX).  In addition to the shrines, altars, and gymnasium mentioned by Thucydides and Pausanias, there were also gardens and suburban residences in the nearby area (Baltes 1993: 6).

Due to the improvements initiated by Hipparchus and Cimon, the Academy became a beautiful place to walk, exercise, and conduct religious observances. Aristophanes’ The Clouds, first produced in 423 B.C.E., contrasts the rustic beauty of the Academy and traditional education of the past with the chattering and sophistic values of the Agora. Describing the difference, Aristophanes’ “Better Argument” says,

But you’ll be spending your time in gymnasia, with a gleaming, blooming body, not in outlandish chatter on thorny subjects in the Agora like the present generation, nor in being dragged into court over some sticky, contentious, damnable little dispute; no, you will go down to the Academy, under the sacred olive-trees, wearing a chaplet of green reed, you will start a race together with a good decent companion of your own age, fragrant with green-brier and catkin-shedding poplar and freedom from cares, delighting in the season of spring, when  the plane tree whispers to the elm. (1002-1008, trans. Sommerstein)

While The Clouds illustrates that the grounds of the Academy in the 420s had running tracks, a water source, sacred olive groves, and shady walks with poplar, plane, and elm trees, it is not clear whether the Academy was as free of sophistry as Aristophanes presents it, perhaps ironically, in his comedy. At any rate, the Academy was very soon to become a place for intellectual discussion, and its peaceful environment was also headed for disruption by the Spartan army’s occupation of its grounds during the siege of Athens in 405-4 B.C.E.

2. Athenian Education Prior to Plato’s Academy: Old Education, Sophists, Socrates and his Circle

The Greek word for education, paideia, covers both formal education and informal enculturation. Paideia was traditionally divided into two parts: cultural education (mousikē), which included the areas of the Muses, such as poetry, singing, and the playing of instruments, and physical education (gymnastikē), which included wrestling, athletics, and exercises that could be useful as training for battle. Instruction in cultural and physical education was not paid for by public expenditure in the archaic or classical period in Athens, so it was only available to those who could afford it. Education often took place in public places like gymnasia and palestras. During the classical period, writing and basic arithmetic became a basic part of elementary education as well.  In addition to formal education, attendance at religious festivals, dramatic and poetic competitions, and political debates and discussions formed an important part of Athenians’ education. Broadly, an Athenian man educated in the “Old Education” championed by Aristophanes’ “Better Argument” would be familiar with the poetry of Homer and Hesiod, be able to read, write, and count well enough to manage his personal life and participate in the life of the polis, and be cultured enough to appreciate the city’s comic and tragic festivals.

In the fifth century B.C.E., philosophers and sophists came to Athens from elsewhere, drawn by the city’s growing wealth and climate of intellectual activity. Anaxagoras likely came to Athens sometime between 480 and 460 B.C.E. and associated with Pericles, the important statesman and general (Plato, Phaedrus 270a). Parmenides and Zeno came to Athens in the 450s, and sophist Protagoras from Abdera came to Athens in the 430s and also associated with Pericles. Gorgias the rhetorician from Leontini came to Athens in 427 B.C.E., and he taught rhetoric for a fee to Isocrates, Antisthenes, and many others.

Itinerant teachers like Protagoras and Gorgias both supplemented and destabilized the traditional education provided in Athens, as Aristophanes’ comedy The Clouds, the dialogues of Plato, and other sources document. In order to gain paying students, sophists, rhetoricians, and philosophers would often make presentations in public places like the Agora or in Athens’s three major gymnasia, the Academy, the Cynosarges, and the Lyceum. While the accounts of Xenophon and Plato contradict Aristophanes’ comic portrayal of Socrates as a teacher of rhetoric and natural science, the Platonic dialogues do show Socrates frequenting gymnasia and palestras in search of conversation. In the dialogue Euthyphro, Euthyphro associates Socrates with the Lyceum (2a); in the dialogue Lysis, Socrates narrates how he was walking from the Academy to the Lyceum when he was drawn into a conversation at a new wrestling school (203a-204a). Similarly, the Euthydemus presents a conversation between Socrates and two sophists in search of students in a gymnasium building on the grounds of the Lyceum (271a-272e). While Socrates, unlike the sophists, did not take payment or teach a particular doctrine, he did have a circle of individuals who regularly associated with him for intellectual discussion. While the establishment of philosophical schools by Athenian citizens in the major gymnasia of Athens seems to be a fourth-century phenomenon, the Platonic dialogues indicate that gymnasia were places of intellectual activity and discussion in the last decade of the fifth century B.C.E., if not before.

3. The Academy in Plato’s Time

 As noted in the previous section, the Academy, the Lyceum, and the Cynosarges functioned as places for intellectual discussion as well as exercise and religious activity in the fifth century B.C.E. It is likely that the aristocratic Plato spent some of his youth at these gymnasia, both for exercise and to engage in conversation with Socrates and other philosophers. After Socrates’ death in 399 B.C.E., Plato is thought to have spent time with Cratylus the Heraclitean, Hermogenes the Parmenidean, and then to have gone to nearby Megara with Euclides and other Socratics (Lives III.6). Isocrates, student of Gorgias, began teaching in a private building near the Lyceum around 390 B.C.E., and Antisthenes, who also studied with Gorgias and was a member of Socrates’ circle, held discussions in the Cynosarges around that time as well (Lives VI.13). While the Platonic Academy is often seen as the prototype of a new kind of educational organization, it is important to note that it was just one of many such organizations established in fourth-century Athens.

It is likely that Isocrates and Antisthenes established schools of some sort before Plato. Contemporary scholars often assign a founding date for the Academy between the dates of 387 B.C.E. and 383 B.C.E., depending on these scholars’ assessment of when Plato returned from his first trip to Syracuse. Rather than assign a particular date at which the Academy was founded, as though ancient schools possessed formal articles or charters of incorporation (see Lynch 1972), it is more plausible to note that Plato began associating with a group of fellow philosophers in the Academy in the late 390s and that this group gradually gathered energy and reputation throughout the 380s and 370s up until Plato’s death in 347 B.C.E.

a. Location and Funding

Plato was himself from the deme of Collytus, a wealthy district southwest of the Acropolis and within the city walls built by Themistocles. Collytus was a few miles from the Academy, so Plato’s relocating nearby the Academy would have been an important step in establishing himself there.  While some have emphasized the Academy’s remoteness from the Agora (Rihill 2003:174), the six stades (three quarters of a mile) from the Dipylon gate and three more stades from the Agora would not have constituted much of a barrier to anyone interested in seeing the goings on of the Academy in Plato’s time.

In keeping with the Academy’s customary use as a place of intellectual exchange, Plato used its gymnasium, walks, and buildings as a place for education and inquiry; discussions held in these areas were semi-public and thus open to public engagement and heckling (Epicrates cited in Athenaeus, Sophists at Dinner II.59; Aelian, Historical Miscellany 3.19; Lives VI.40). While some scholars have thought that Plato somehow resided in the sacred precinct and gymnasium of the Academy or purchased property there, this is not possible, for religious sanctuaries and areas set aside for gymnasia were not places where citizens (or anyone else) could set up residency. Rather, as Lynch, Baltes, and Dillon have argued, Plato was able to purchase a property with its own garden nearby the sanctuaries and gymnasium of Academy. While much of the Platonic Academy’s business was conducted on the public grounds of the Academy, it is natural that discussions and possibly shared meals would also occur at Plato’s nearby private residence and garden. Given the proximity of Plato’s private residence to the sanctuary and gymnasium of the Academy and the fact that his nearby property and school were both referred to as “the Academy” (Plutarch, On Exile 603b), there has been confusion about the particulars of the physical plant of the Platonic Academy.

Plato was of aristocratic stock and of at least moderate wealth, so he had the financial means to support his life of philosophical study. Following Socrates’ example and departing from the sophists and Isocrates, Plato did not charge tuition for individuals who associated with him at the Academy (Lives IV.2). Still, students at the Academy had to possess or come up with their own sustenance (Athenaeus, Sophists at Dinner IV.168). In addition to receiving funds from either Dion of Syracuse or Anniceris of Cyrene to purchase property near the Academy (Lives III.20), Diogenes Laertius records that Dion paid for Plato’s costs as choregus or chorus leader—a claim also made in Plutarch’s Dion XVII.2)—and purchased Pythagorean philosophical texts for him, and that Dionysus of Syracuse gave him eighty talents (Lives III.3,9). Part of the purpose of Plato’s trips to Syracuse may have been to participate in political reform, but it is also possible that Plato was seeking patrons for the philosophical activity engaged in at the Academy.

While it is probable that Plato associated with other philosophers, including the Athenian mathematician Theaetetus, in the Academy as early as the late 390s (see Nails 2009: 5-6; Nails 2002: 277; Thesleff 2009: 509-518 with Proclus’s Commentary on the First Book of Euclid’s Elements, Book 2, Chapter IV for more details on Theaetetus’s involvement with the Academy), it is the purchase of the property near the Academy after his trip to see Dion in Syracuse that scholars often refer to when speaking of the founding of the Academy in either 387 B.C.E. or 383 B.C.E. While purchase of this property was important to the development of the Platonic Academy, it is important to remember, as Lynch has shown, that Plato’s Academy was not legally incorporated or a juridical entity.  While the wills of Theophrastus (Lives V.52-53) and Epicurus (Lives X.16-17) make provisions for the continuation of their schools and the future control of school property, the will of Plato does not mention the Academy as such (Lives III.41-43). This indicates that while the Platonic Academy was thriving during Plato’s lifetime, it was not essentially linked to any private property possessed by Plato (compare Dillon 2003: 9; see further Nails 2002: 249-250).

b. Areas of Study, Students, Methods of Instruction

 The structure of the Platonic Academy during Plato’s time was probably emergent and loosely organized. Scholars infer from the varied viewpoints of thinkers like Eudoxus, Speusippus, Xenocrates, Aristotle, and others present in the Academy during Plato’s lifetime that Plato encouraged a diversity of perspectives and discussion of alternative views, and that being a participant in the Academy did not require anything like adherence to Platonic orthodoxy. In this way, Plato reflected Socrates’ willingness to discuss and debate ideas rather than the sophists’ claim to teach students mastery of a particular subject matter.  To get a sense of the topics discussed in the Academy, our primary sources are the Platonic dialogues and our knowledge of the persons present at the Academy.

While it is tempting to talk of teachers and students at the Academy, this language can lead to difficulties. While Plato was clearly the heart of the Academy, it is not clear how, if at all, formal status was accorded to members of the Academy. The Greek terms mathētēs (student, learner, or disciple), sunēthēs (associate or intimate), hetairos (companion), and philos (friend), as well as other terms, seem to have been variously used to describe the persons who attended the Academy (Baltes 1993: 10-11; Saunders 1986: 201).

While the precise function of the Platonic dialogues within the Academy cannot be settled, it is practically certain that they were studied and perhaps read aloud by the Academics in Plato’s time. It is also likely that the dialogues were circulated as a way to attract possible students (Themistius, Orations 23.295). As a cursory survey, dialogues like the Republic, Timaeus, and Theaetetus show Plato’s interest in mathematical speculation; the Republic, Statesman, and the Laws attest to Plato’s interest in political theory; the Cratylus, Gorgias, and Sophist show an interest in language, logic, and sophistry, and many dialogues, including the Parmenides, Sophist, and Republic show an interest in metaphysics and ontology. While Plato’s interests were varied and interconnected, the topics of the dialogues reflect topics that Academics were likely to be engaged with.

The array of topics examined in Plato’s dialogues do parallel some of what we know about the philosophical interests of the individuals at the Academy in Plato’s lifetime. Theaetetus of Athens and Eudoxus of Cnidus were mathematicians, and Phillip of Opus was interested in astronomy and mathematics in addition to serving as Plato’s secretary and editor of the Laws. Aristotle, a wealthy citizen of Stagira, came to the Academy in 367 as a young man and stayed until Plato’s death in 347. Aristotle’s twenty-year long participation in the Platonic Academy shows Plato’s openness in encouraging and supporting philosophers who criticized his views, the Academy’s growing reputation and ability to attract students and researchers, and sheds some light on the organization of the Academy. Aristotle reportedly taught rhetoric at the Academy, and it is certain that he researched rhetorical and sophistical techniques there. It is very probable that Aristotle began writing many of the works of his that we possess today at the Academy (Klein 1985: 173), including possibly parts of the biological works, even though biological research based on empirical data is not a line of inquiry that Plato pursued himself. Aristotle’s multiple references to Platonic dialogues in his own works also suggest how the Platonic dialogues were used by students and researchers at the Academy. While most of the pupils at the Platonic Academy were male, Diogenes Laertius lists two female students, Lastheneia of Mantinea and Axiothea of Philius in his list of Plato’s students (Lives III.46-47).

While the Platonic Academy was a community of philosophers gathered to engage in research and discussion around a wide array of topics and questions, the Academy, or at least the individuals gathered there, had a political dimension. Plutarch’s Reply to Colotes claims that Plato’s companions from the Academy were involved in a wide variety of political activities, including revolution, legislation, and political consulting (1126c-d). The various Epistles ascribed to Plato support this view by attesting to Plato’s involvement in the politics of Syrcause, Atarneus, and Assos. While claims that the Academy was an “Organized School of Political Science” or the “RAND Corporation” of antiquity go too far in ascribing formal structure and organization to the Academy, Plato and the individuals associated with the Academy were involved in the political issues of their time as well as purely theoretical discussions about political philosophy.

As noted above, some of the discussions Plato held were on the public grounds of the Academy, while other discussions were held at his private residence. Aristoxenus records at least one poorly received public lecture by Plato on “the good” (Elements of Harmonics II.30), and a comic fragment from Epicrates records Plato, Speusippus, Menedemus, and several youths engaging in dialectical definition of a pumpkin (Athenaeus, Sophists at Dinner 2.59). While it is difficult to reconstruct how instruction occurred at the Academy, it seems that dialectical conversation, lecture, research, writing, and the reading of the Platonic dialogues were all used by individuals at the Academy as methods of philosophical inquiry and instruction.

Although the establishment of the Academy is an important part of Plato’s legacy, Plato himself is silent about his Academy in all of the dialogues and letters ascribed to him. The word “Academy” occurs only twice in the Platonic corpus, and in both cases it refers to the gymnasium rather than any educational organization. One occurrence, already mentioned, is from the Lysis, and it describes Socrates walking from the Academy to the Lyceum (203a). The other occurrence, in the spurious Axiochus, refers to ephebic and gymnastic training (367a) on the grounds of the Academy and does not refer to anything that has to do with Plato’s Academy.

Plato’s silence about the Academy adds to the difficulty of labeling his Academy with the English word “school.” Diogenes Laertius refers to Plato’s Academy as a “hairesis,” which can be translated as “school” or “sect”  (Lives III.41). The noun “hairesis” comes from the verb “to choose,” and it thereby signifies “a choice of life” as much as “a place of instruction.” The head of the Academy after Plato was called the “scholarch,” but while scholē forms the root of our word “school” and was used to refer to Plato’s Academy (Lives IV.2), it originally had the meaning of “leisure.” The Greek word diatribē can also be translated as “school” from its connotation of spending time together, but no matter what Greek term is used, the activities occurring at the Academy during Plato’s lifetime do not neatly map on to any of our concepts of school, university, or college. Perhaps the clearest term to describe Plato’s Academy comes from Aristophanes’ Clouds, written at least three decades before the Academy was established: phrontistērion (94). This term can be translated as “think tank,” a term that may be as good as any other to conceptualize the Academy’s multiple and evolving activities during Plato’s lifetime.

4. The Academy after Plato

In 347 B.C.E. Plato died at the age of approximately eighty years old. According to Diogenes Laertius, Plato was buried in the Academy (Lives III.41). Unlike the claim that Plato purchased property in the sacred precinct of the Academy, this assertion is possible, for the grounds of the Academy were used for burial, shrines, and memorials. At any rate, Pausanias records that in his own time there was a memorial to Plato not far from the Academy (Attica XXX.3).

Although the entrenchment of the words   “academy” and “academic” in contemporary discourse make the persistence of the Platonic Academy seem inevitable, this is probably not how it appeared to Plato or to members of the Academy after his death (Watts 2007: 122). Rather, the Academy continued to develop its sense of identity and plans for persistence after Plato’s death.

One way to develop a partial picture of the Academy after Plato’s death is to review the succession of Academic scholarchs. The chronological succession of scholarchs after Plato, according to Diogenes Laertius, is as follows:

  • Speusippus of Athens, Plato’s nephew, was elected scholarch after Plato’s death, and he held that position until 339 B.C.E.
  • Xenocrates of Chalcedon was scholarch until 314 B.C.E.
  • Polemo of Athens was scholarch of the Academy until 276 B.C.E.
  • Crates of Athens, a pupil of Polemo, was the next scholarch.
  • Arcesilaus of Pitane was scholarch until approximately 241 B.C.E.
  • Lacydes of Cyrene was scholarch until approximately 216 B.C.E.
  • Telecles and Evander, both of Phocaea, succeed Lacydes as dual scholarchs.
  • Hegesinus of Pergamon succeed the dual scholarchs from Phocaea.
  • Carneades of Cyrene succeeded Hegesinus.
  • Clitomachus of Carthage succeeded Carneades in 129 B.C.E.

While Clitomachus is the last scholarch listed by Diogenes Laertius, Cicero provides us with information about Philo of Larissa, with whom he himself studied (De Natura Deorum I.6,17). Philo was a pupil of Clitomachus and was a head of the Academy (Academica II.17; Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Phyrrhonism I.220). Antiochus of Ascalon, who also taught Cicero, is sometimes considered a head of the Academy (Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Phyrrhonism I.220-221), but his philosophical position (I.235) and the fact that his school did not meet on the grounds of the Academy (Cicero, De Finibus V.1) makes Antiochus’s school discontinuous with the Platonic Academy.

The terms “Old Academy,” “Middle Academy,” and “New Academy” are used in somewhat different ways by Cicero, Sextus Empiricus, and Diogenes Laertius to describe the changing viewpoints of the Platonic Academy from Speusippus to Philo of Larissa. What seems clear from the various accounts is that, with Arcesilaus, a skeptical edge entered into Academic thinking that persisted through Carneades and Philo of Larissa.

The Mithridatic War of 88 B.C.E. and Sulla’s destruction of the grounds of the Academy and Lyceum as part of the siege of Athens in 86 B.C.E. (Plutarch, Sulla XII.3) mark the rupture between the geographical precinct of the Academy and the lineage of philosophical instruction stemming from Plato that together constitute the Platonic Academy. The destruction of the gymnasium at the Lyceum also marks the end of Aristotle’s peripatetic school (Lynch 1972: 207).

While the Platonic Academy can be said to end with the siege led by Sulla, philosophers including Cicero, Plutarch of Chaeronea, and Proclus continued to identify themselves as Platonists or Academics. In 176 C.E., the Roman Emperor and Stoic philosopher Marcus Aurelius helped continue the influence of Platonic and Academic thought by establishing Imperial Chairs for the teaching of Platonism, Stoicism, Aristotelianism, and Epicureanism, but the holders of these chairs were not associated with the long-abandoned schools that once met on the grounds of the Lyceum or the Academy.

Sometime in the fourth century C.E., a Platonic school was reestablished in Athens by Plutarch of Athens, though this school did not meet on the grounds of the Academy. After Plutarch, the scholarchs of this Platonic school were Syrianus, Proclus, Marinus, Isidore, and Damascius, the last scholarch of this Academy. In 529 C.E. the Christian Roman Emperor Justinian forbade Pagans from publicly teaching, which, along with the Slavonic invasions of 580 C.E. (Lynch 1972: 167), marks an end of the flourishing of Neo-Platonism in Athens.

The Platonic Academy forms an important part of Plato’s intellectual legacy, and analyzing it can help us better understand Plato’s educational, political, and philosophical concerns. While studying the Academy sheds light on Plato’s thought, its history is also invaluable for studying the reception of Plato’s thought and for gaining insight into one of the crucial sources of today’s academic institutions. Indeed, the continued use of the words  “academy” and “academic” to describe educational organizations and scholars through the twenty first century shows the impact of Plato’s Academy on subsequent education.

Today, the area that contains the sacred precinct and gymnasium that housed Plato’s Academy lies within a neighborhood known as Akadimia Platonos. The ruins of the Academy are accessible by foot, and a small museum, Plato’s Academy Museum, helps to orient visitors to the site.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aelian, (Claudius Aelianus) (2nd-3rd cn. C.E.). Historical Miscellany. Trans. Nigel G. Wilson. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, 1997.
    • Chapter XIX of Book 3 of Aelian’s Historical Miscellany is titled “Of the dissention between Aristotle and Plato.” This chapter records a conflict between Plato and Aristotle that has been used to infer that Plato had a private home where he taught in addition to leading conversations on the grounds of the Academy.
  • Aristophanes (c.448-380 B.C.E.). Clouds. Trans. Alan Sommerstein. Warminster: Aris and Phillips, 1991.
    • While written too early to shed light on Plato, this text is crucial for understanding Athenian education, the sophists, and Socrates. It also contains the passage cited above that describes the grounds of the Academy in the 420s.
  • Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.).
    • The writings of Aristotle are a valuable resource for learning more about the philosophies of some of the individuals that were part of the early Academy. See for example the references to Speusippus in Metaphysics Zeta, Chapter 2, Lambda, Chapter 7, and Mu, Chapter 7; see also the references Euxodus in Metaphysics Alpha, Chapter 8, Lambda, Chapter 8, and Nicomachean Ethics, Book 10, Chapter 2.
  • Aristoxenus of Tarentum (c.370-300 B.C.E.). The Harmonics of Aristoxenus. Ed. and trans. Henry S. Macran. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1902.
    • Aristoxenus was a student of Aristotle’s and he is an early source for Plato’s public lecture “On the Good.”
  • Athenaneus of Naucratis (2nd-3rd cn. C.E.). The Deipnosophists. In Seven Volumes. Trans. Charles Burton Gluck. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, 1951.
    • This lengthy work is a source of much information about antiquity. Scholars of the Academy are particularly drawn to the fragment from Epicrates preserved by Athenaneus that gives a comic presentation of Platonic dialectic.
  • Cicero, Marcus Tullius (106-43 B.C.E.).
    • Cicero’s many writings, including Academia, De Natura Deorum, De Finibus, and Tusculan Disputions contain information about the Academy.
  • Diogenes Laertius (2nd-3rd cn. C.E.). Lives and Opinions of Eminent Philosophers. Two Volumes. Trans. R. D. Hicks. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, 1925.
    • Diogenes is an invaluable resource for the lives of ancient philosophers, although he is writing five hundred or so years after the philosophers he describes.
  • Pausanias. (2nd cn. C.E.). Description of Greece. Four Volumes. Trans. W. H. S. Jones. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, 1959.
    • Book I of Pausanias’ work deals with Attica; Chapters XXI-XXX shed light on the history of the Academy and how it appeared to Pausanias several centuries later.
  • Philodemus. (c.110-c.30 B.C.E.). Index Academicorum.
    • Philodemus was an Epicurean philosopher who wrote a work on the Platonic Academy. Some fragments of this work have been discovered. For more information, see Blank (2019), below.
  • Plato. Complete Works. Ed. John Cooper. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
    • While the dialogues and letters of Plato do not mention the Platonic Academy, they are an important resource in understanding Plato’s educational and political commitments and activities as well as the educational environment of Athens in the last few decades of the fifth century.
  • Plutarch of Chaeronea (c.45-125 C.E.). Parallel Lives and Moralia.
    • Plutarch’s works are collected in the Loeb Classical Library under Lives (Eleven Volumes) and Moralia (Fifteen Volumes). Particularly valuable for the student of the Academy are Reply to Colotes and Life of Dion, but many of the works found in Plutarch’s corpus shed light on Plato, the Academy, and Platonism.
  • Proclus (412-485 C.E.). A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid’s Elements. Trans. Glenn R. Morrow. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1970.
    • Book 2, Chapter IV of Proclus’s commentary gives an account of the development of mathematics that includes helpful information about Plato and other members of the Academy. The “Foreword to the 1992 Edition” of Morrow’s translation by Ian Mueller is also helpful to students of Plato’s Academy.
  • Sextus Empiricus (2nd-3rd cn. C.E.). Outlines of Pyrrhonism. Four Volumes. Trans. R. G. Bury. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, 1955.
    • As part of his presentation of skepticism, Sextus articulates how skepticism and Academic philosophy differ in Book I, Chapter XXXIII.
  • Suda.
    • The Suda is a tenth-century C.E. Byzantine Greek encyclopedia. The entries on “To Hipparchou teichion,” “Akademia,” and “Platon” were helpful for this article. An online version of the Suda can be accessed at
  • Themistius (c.317-388 B.C.E.). The Private Orations of Themistius. Trans. Robert J. Penella. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2000.
    • Themistius was a philosopher and senator in the fourth century C.E. who taught in Constantinople. In his 23rd Oration, “The Sophist” he relays that a Corinthian farmer became Plato’s student after he read the Gorgias; Axiotheia had a similar experience reading the Republic, and Zeno of Citium came to Athens after reading the Apology of Socrates.
  • Thucydides (c.5th cn. B.C.E.). The Peloponnesian War. Ed. Robert B. Strassler. Trans. Richard Crawley. New York: Touchstone, 1998.
    • While Thucydides’ work does not shed light on the Academy, he does describe its environs and other aspects of Athenian history that are important for understanding Plato.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Athanassiadi, Polymnia. Damascius. The Philosophical History. Athens: Apamea Cultural Association, 1999.
  • Baltes, Matthias. “Plato’s School, the Academy,” Hermathena, No. 155 (Winter 1993): 5-26.
    • A very clear and well documented portrait of Plato’s Academy.
  • Blank, David, "Philodemus," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2019 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = .
  • Brunt, P. A. “Plato’s Academy and Politics” in Studies in Greek History and Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Cherniss, Harold. The Riddle of the Early Academy. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1945.
  • Chroust, Anton-Herman. “Plato’s Academy: The First Organizational School of Political Science in Antiquity,” The Review of Politics, Vol. 29, No. 1 (Jan., 1967): 25-40.
  • Dancy, R. M. Two Studies in the Early Academy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Dillon. John. The Heirs of Plato: A Study of the Old Academy (347-274 BC). Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2003.
    • A study of the Academy with special attention to the philosophies of Plato’s successors.
  • Dillon, John. The Middle Platonists: 80 B.C. to A.D. 220. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1996.
  • Glucker, John. Antiochus and the Late Academy. Göttingen: Hypomnemata 56, 1978.
  • Hadot, Pierre. What is Ancient Philosophy? Trans. Michael Chase. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2002.
  • Hornblower, Simon and Anthony Spawforth. The Oxford Classical Dictionary. 3rd ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Klein, Jacob. Lectures and Essays. Annapolis: St. John’s College Press, 1985.
  • Lynch, John Patrick. Aristotle’s School: A Study of a Greek Educational Institution. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1972.
    • This work is essential to anyone investigating classical educational institutions.
  • Mintz, Avi. Plato: Images, Aims, and Practices of Education. Cham: Switzerland: Springer, 2018.
  • Nails, Debra. Agora, Academy, and the Conduct of Philosophy. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
  • Nails, Debra. The People of Plato: A Prosopography of Plato and Other Socratics. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2002.
    • This work provides historical context for all of the individuals mentioned in the Platonic dialogues.
  • Nails, Debra. “The Life of Plato of Athens” in A Companion to Plato, edited by Hugh Benson. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell Publishing, 2009.
  • Natali, Carlo. Aristotle: His Life and School. Edited by D. S. Hutchinson. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2013.
  • Press, Gerald A., ed. The Bloomsbury Companion to Plato. London: Bloomsbury Academic, 2015.
    • A very valuable reference work on Plato. Chapter 1, “Plato’s Life—Historical and Intellectual Context” and Chapter 5, “Later Reception, Interpretation and Influence of Plato and the Dialogues” are particularly valuable for those interested in the history of the Academy.
  • Preus, Anthony. Historical Dictionary of Ancient Greek Philosophy. 2nd edition. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2015.
    • This clear and reliable historical dictionary is useful for students of ancient Greek philosophy.
  • Rihill, T. E. “Teaching and Learning in Classical Athens,” Greece & Rome, Vol. 50, No.2 (Oct., 2003): 168-190.
  • Saunders, Trevor J. “‘The Rand Corporation of Antiquity’? Plato’s Academy and Greek Politics” in Studies in Honor of T. B. L. Webster, vol. I, eds. J. H. Betts et al. Bristol: Bristol Classical Press, 1986.
  • Thesleff, Holger. Platonic Patterns: A Collection of Studies. Las Vegas: Parmenides Publishing, 2009.
  • Wareh, Tarik. The Theory and Practice of Life: Isocrates and the Philosophers. Cambridge, MA: Center for Hellenic Studies, 2012.
  • Watts, Edward. “Creating the Academy: Historical Discourse and the Shape of Community in the Old Academy, The Journal of Hellenic Studies, Vol. 127 (2007): 106-122.
    • This article argues that the Old Academy developed in an unplanned fashion and that the Old Academy attempted to craft its identity based on life-style and character as much as doctrine.

Author Information

Lewis Trelawny-Cassity
Antioch College
U. S. A.