Art and Interpretation
Interpretation in art refers to the attribution of meaning to a work. A point on which people often disagree is whether the artist’s or author’s intention is relevant to the interpretation of the work. In the Anglo-American analytic philosophy of art, views about interpretation branch into two major camps: intentionalism and anti-intentionalism, with an initial focus on one art, namely literature.
The anti-intentionalist maintains that a work’s meaning is entirely determined by linguistic and literary conventions, thereby rejecting the relevance of the author’s intention. The underlying assumption of this position is that a work enjoys autonomy with respect to meaning and other aesthetically relevant properties. Extra-textual factors, such as the author’s intention, are neither necessary nor sufficient for meaning determination. This early position in the analytic tradition is often called conventionalism because of its strong emphasis on convention. Anti-intentionalism gradually went out of favor at the end of the 20th century, but it has seen a revival in the so-called value-maximizing theory, which recommends that the interpreter seek value-maximizing interpretations constrained by convention and, according to a different version of the theory, by the relevant contextual factors at the time of the work’s production.
By contrast, the initial brand of intentionalism—actual intentionalism—holds that interpreters should concern themselves with the author’s intention, for a work’s meaning is affected by such intention. There are at least three versions of actual intentionalism. The absolute version identifies a work’s meaning fully with the author’s intention, therefore allowing that an author can intend her work to mean whatever she wants it to mean. The extreme version acknowledges that the possible meanings a work can sustain have to be constrained by convention. According to this version, the author’s intention picks the correct meaning of the work as long as it fits one of the possible meanings; otherwise, the work ends up being meaningless. The moderate version claims that when the author’s intention does not match any of the possible meanings, meaning is fixed instead by convention and perhaps also context.
A second brand of intentionalism, which finds a middle course between actual intentionalism and anti-intentionalism, is hypothetical intentionalism. According to this position, a work’s meaning is the appropriate audience’s best hypothesis about the author’s intention based on publicly available information about the author and her work at the time of the piece’s production. A variation on this position attributes the intention to a hypothetical author who is postulated by the interpreter and who is constituted by work features. Such authors are sometimes said to be fictional because they, being purely conceptual, differ decisively from flesh-and-blood authors.
This article elaborates on these theories of interpretation and considers their notable objections. The debate about interpretation covers other art forms in addition to literature. The theories of interpretation are also extended across many of the arts. This broad outlook is assumed throughout the article, although nothing said is affected even if a narrow focus on literature is adopted.
Table of Contents
- Key Concepts: Intention, Meaning, and Interpretation
- Value-Maximizing Theory
- Actual Intentionalism
- Hypothetical Intentionalism
- Hypothetical Intentionalism and the Hypothetical Artist
- References and Further Reading
It is common for us to ask questions about works of art due to puzzlement or curiosity. Sometimes we do not understand the point of the work. What is the point of, for example, Metamorphosis by Kafka or Duchamp’s Fountain? Sometimes there is ambiguity in a work and we want it resolved. For example, is the final sequence of Christopher Nolan’s film Inception reality or another dream? Or do ghosts really exist in Henry James’s The Turn of the Screw? Sometimes we make hypotheses about details in a work. For instance, does the woman in white in Raphael’s The School of Athens represent Hypatia? Is the conch in William Golding’s Lord of the Flies a symbol for civilization and democracy?
What these questions have in common is that all of them seek after things that go beyond what the work literally presents or says. They are all concerned with the implicit contents of the work or, for simplicity, with the meanings of a work. A distinction can be drawn between two kinds of meaning in terms of scope. Meaning can be global in the sense that it concerns the work’s theme, thesis, or point. For example, an audience first encountering Duchamp’s Fountain would want to know Duchamp’s point in producing this readymade or, put otherwise, what the work as a whole is made to convey. The same goes for Kafka’s Metamorphosis, which contains so bizarre a plot as to make the reader wonder what the story is all about. Meaning can also be local insofar as it is about what a part of a work conveys. Inquiries into the meaning of a particular sequence in Christopher Nolan’s film, the woman in Raphael’s fresco, or the conch in William Golding’s Lord of the Flies are directed at only part of the work.
We are said to be interpreting when trying to find out answers to questions about the meaning of a work. In other words, interpretation is the attempt to attribute work-meaning. Here “attribute” can mean “recover,” which is retrieving something already existing in a work; or it can more weakly mean “impose,” which entails ascribing a meaning to a work without ontologically creating anything. Many of the major positions in the debate endorse either the impositional view or the retrieval view.
When an interpretative question arises, a frequent way to deal with it is to resort to the creator’s intention. We may ask the artist to reveal her intention if such an opportunity is available; we may also check what she says about her work in an interview or autobiography. If we have access to her personal documents such as diaries or letters, they too will become our interpretative resources. These are all evidence of the artist’s intention. When the evidence is compelling, we have good reason to believe it reveals the artist’s intention.
Certainly, there are cases in which external evidence of the artist’s intention is absent, including when the work is anonymous. This poses no difficulty for philosophers who view appeal to artistic intention as crucial, for they accept that internal evidence—the work itself—is the best evidence of the artist’s intention. Most of the time, close attention to details of the work will lead us to what the artist intended the work to mean.
But what is intention exactly? Intention is a kind of mental state usually characterized as a design or plan in the artist’s mind to be realized in her artistic creation. This crude view of intention is sometimes refined into the reductive analysis one will find in a contemporaneous textbook of philosophy of mind: intention is constituted by belief and desire. Some actual intentionalists explain the nature of intention from a Wittgensteinian perspective: authorial intention is viewed as the purposive structure of the work that can be discerned by close inspection. This view challenges the supposition that intentions are always private and logically independent of the work they cause, which is often interpreted as a position held by anti-intentionalists.
A 2005 proposal holds that intentions are executive attitudes toward plans (Livingston). These attitudes are firm but defeasible commitments to acting on them. Contra the reductive analysis of intention, this view holds that intentions are distinct and real mental states that serve a range of functions irreducible to other mental states.
Clarifying each of these basic terms (meaning, interpretation, and intention) requires an essay-length treatment that cannot be done here. For current purposes, it suffices to introduce the aforesaid views and proposals commonly assumed. Bear in mind that for the most part the debate over art interpretation proceeds without consensus on how to define these terms, and clarifications appear only when necessary.
Anti-intentionalism is considered the first theory of interpretation to emerge in the analytic tradition. It is normally seen as affiliated with the New Criticism movement that was prevalent in the middle of the twentieth century. The position was initially a reaction against biographical criticism, the main idea of which is that the interpreter, to grasp the meaning of a work, needs to study the life of the author because the work is seen as reflecting the author’s mental world. This approach led to people considering the author’s biographical data rather than her work. Literary criticism became criticism of biography, not criticism of literary works. Against this trend, literary critic William K. Wimsatt and philosopher Monroe C. Beardsley coauthored a seminal paper “The Intentional Fallacy” in 1946, marking the starting point of the intention debate. Beardsley subsequently extended his anti-intentionalist stance across the arts in his monumental book Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism ( 1981a).
The main idea of the intentional fallacy is that appeal to the artist’s intention outside the work is fallacious, because the work itself is the verdict of what meaning it bears. This contention is based on the anti-intentionalist’s ontological assumption about works of art.
This underlying assumption is that a work of art enjoys autonomy with respect to meaning and other aesthetically relevant properties. As Beardsley’s Principle of Autonomy shows, critical statements will in the end need to be tested against the work itself, not against factors outside it. To give Beardsley’s example, whether a statue symbolizes human destiny depends not on what its maker says but on our being able to make out that theme from the statue on the basis of our knowledge of artistic conventions: if the statue shows a man confined to a cage, we may well conclude that the statue indeed symbolizes human destiny, for by convention the image of confinement fits that alleged theme. The anti-intentionalist principle hence follows: the interpreter should focus on what she can find in the work itself—the internal evidence—rather than on external evidence, such as the artist’s biography, to reveal her intentions.
Anti-intentionalism is sometimes called conventionalism because it sees convention as necessary and sufficient in determining work-meaning. On this view, the artist’s intention at best underdetermines meaning even when operating successfully. This can be seen from the famous argument offered by Wimsatt and Beardsley: either the artist’s intention is successfully realized in the work, or it fails; if the intention is successfully realized in the work, appeal to external evidence of the artist’s intention is not necessary (we can detect the intention from the work); if it fails, such appeal becomes insufficient (the intention turns out to be extraneous to the work). The conclusion is that an appeal to external evidence of the artist’s intention is either unnecessary or insufficient. As the second premise of the argument shows, the artist’s intention is insufficient in determining meaning for the reason that convention alone can do the trick. As a result, the overall argument entails the irrelevance of external evidence of the artist’s intention. To think of such evidence as relevant commits the intentional fallacy.
There is a second way to formulate the intentional fallacy. Since the artist does not always successfully realize her intention, the inference is invalid from the premise that the artist intended her work to mean p to the conclusion that the work in question does mean p. Therefore, the term “intentional fallacy” has two layers of meaning: normatively, it refers to the questionable principle of interpretation that external evidence of intent should be appealed to; ontologically, it refers to the fallacious inference from probable intention to work-meaning.
Beardsley at a later point develops an ontology of literature in favor of anti-intentionalism (1981b, 1982). Reviving Plato’s imitation theory of art, Beardsley claims that fictional works are essentially imitations of illocutionary acts. Briefly put, illocutionary acts are performed by utterances in particular contexts. For example, when a detective, convinced that someone is the killer, points his finger at that person and utters the sentence “you did it,” the detective is performing the illocutionary act of accusing someone. What illocutionary act is being performed is traditionally construed as jointly determined by the speaker’s intention to perform that act, the words uttered, and the relevant conditions in that particular context. Other examples of illocutionary acts include asserting, warning, castigating, asking, and the like.
Literary works can be seen as utterances; that is, texts used in a particular context to perform different illocutionary acts by authors. However, Beardsley claims that in the case of fictional works in particular, the purported illocutionary force will always be removed so as to make the utterance an imitation of that illocutionary act. When an attempted act is insufficiently performed, it ends up being represented or imitated. For example, if I say “please pass me the salt” in my dining room when no one except me is there, I end up representing (imitating) the illocutionary act of requesting because there is no uptake from the intended audience. Since the illocutionary act in this case is only imitated, it qualifies as a fictional act. This is why Beardsley sees fiction as representation.
Consider the uptake condition in the case of fictional works. Such works are not addressed to the audience as a talk is: there is no concrete context in which the audience can be readily identified. The uttered text hence loses its illocutionary force and ends up being a representation. Aside from this “address without access,” another obtaining condition for a fictional illocutionary act is the existence of non-referring names and descriptions in a fictional work. If an author writes a poem in which she greets the great detective Sherlock Holmes, this greeting will never obtain, because the name Sherlock Holmes does not refer to any existing person in the world. The greeting will only end up being a representation or a fictional illocution. By parity of reasoning, fictional works end up being representations of illocutionary acts in that they always contain names or descriptions involving events that never take place.
Now we must ask: by what criterion do we determine what illocutionary act is represented? It cannot be the speaker or author’s intention, because even if a speaker intends to represent a particular illocutionary act, she might end up representing another. Since the possibility of failed intention always exists, intention would not be an appropriate criterion. Convention is again invoked to determine the correct illocutionary act being represented. It is true that any practice of representing is intentional at the start in the sense that what is represented is determined by the representer’s intention. Nevertheless, once the connection between a symbol and what it is used to represent is established, intention is said to be detached from that connection, and deciding the content of a representation becomes a sheer matter of convention.
Since a fictional work is essentially a representation of an insufficiently performed illocutionary act, determining what it represents does not require us to go beyond that incomplete performance, just as determining what a mime is imitating does not require the audience to consider anything outside her performance, such as her intention. What the mime is imitating is completely determined by how we conventionally construe the act being performed. In a similar fashion, when considering what illocutionary act is represented by a fictional work, the interpreter should rely on internal evidence rather than on external evidence of authorial intent to construct the illocutionary act being represented. If, based on internal data, a story reads like a castigation of war, it is suitably seen as a representation of that illocutionary act. The conclusion is that the author’s intention plays no role in fixing the content of a fictional work.
Lastly, it is worth mentioning that Beardsley’s attitude toward nonfictional works is ambivalent. Obviously, his speech act argument applies to fictional works only, and he accepts that nonfictional works can be genuine illocutions. This category of works tends to have a more identifiable audience, who is hence not addressed without access. With illocutions, Beardsley continues to argue for an anti-intentionalist view of meaning according to which the utterer’s intention does not determine meaning. But his accepting nonfictional works as illocutions opens the door to considerations of external or contextual factors that go against his earlier stance, which is globally anti-intentionalist.
One immediate concern with anti-intentionalism is whether convention alone can point to a single meaning (Hirsch, 1967). The common reason why people debate about interpretation is precisely that the work itself does not offer sufficient evidence to disambiguate meaning. Very often a work can sustain multiple meanings and the problem of choice prompts some people to appeal to the artist’s intention. It does not seem plausible to say that one can assign only a single meaning to works like Ulysses or Picasso’s abstract paintings if one concentrates solely on internal evidence. To this objection, Beardsley (1970) insists that, in most cases, appeal to the coherence of the work can eventually leave us with a single correct interpretation.
A second serious objection to anti-intentionalism is the case of irony (Hirsch, 1976, pp. 24–5). It seems reasonable to say that whether a work is ironic depends on if its creator intended it to be so. For instance, based on internal evidence, many people took Daniel Defoe’s pamphlet The Shortest Way with the Dissenters to be genuinely against the Dissenters upon its publication. However, the only ground for saying that the pamphlet is ironic seems to be Defoe’s intention. If irony is a crucial component of the work, ignoring it would fail to respect the work’s identity. It follows that irony cannot be grounded in internal evidence alone. Beardsley’s reply (1982, pp. 203–7) is that irony must offer the possibility of understanding. If the artist cannot imagine anyone taking it ironically, there would be no reason to believe the work to be ironic.
However, the problem of irony is only part of a bigger concern that challenges the irrelevance of external factors to interpretation. Many factors present at the time of the work’s creation seem to play a key role in shaping a work’s identity and content. Missing out on these factors would lead us to misidentifying the work (and hence to misinterpreting it).
For instance, a work will not be seen as revolutionary unless the interpreter knows something about the contemporaneous artistic tradition: ignoring the work’s innovation amounts to accepting that the work can lose its revolutionary character while remaining self-identical. If we see this character as identity-relevant, we should then take it into consideration in our interpretation. The same line of thinking goes for other identity-conferring contextual factors, such as the social-historical conditions and the relations the work bears to contemporaneous or prior works. The present view is thus called ontological contextualism to foreground the ontological claim that the identity and content of a work of art are in part determined by the relations it bears to its context of production.
Contextualism leads to an important distinction between work and text in the case of literature. In a nutshell: a text is not context-dependent but a work is. The anti-intentionalist stance thus leads the interpreter to consider texts rather than works because it rejects considerations of external or contextual factors. The same distinction goes for other art forms when we draw a comparison between an artistic production considered in its brute form and in its context of creation. For convenience, the word “work” is used throughout with notes on whether contextualism is taken or not.
As a reply to the contextualist objection, it has been argued (Davies, 2005) that Beardsley’s position allows for contextualism. If this is convincing, the contextualist criticism of anti-intentionalism would not be conclusive.
The value-maximizing theory can be viewed as being derived from anti-intentionalism. Its core claim is that the primary aim of art interpretation is to offer interpretations that maximize the value of a work. There are at least two versions of the maximizing position distinguished by the commitment to contextualism. When the maximizing position is committed to contextualism, the constraint on interpretation will be convention plus context (Davies, 2007); otherwise, the constraint will be convention only, as endorsed by anti-intentionalism (Goldman, 2013).
As indicated, the word “maximize” does not imply monism. That is, the present position does not claim that there can be only a single way to maximize the value of a work of art. On the contrary, it seems reasonable to assume that in most cases the interpreter can envisage several readings to bring out the value of the work. For example, Kafka’s Metamorphosis has generated a number of rewarding interpretations, and it is difficult to argue for a single best among them. As long as an interpretation is revealing or insightful under the relevant interpretative constraints, we may count it as value-maximizing. Such being the case, the value-maximizing theory may be relabelled the “value-enhancing” or “value-satisfying” theory.
Given this pluralist picture, the maximizer, unlike the anti-intentionalist, will need to accept the indeterminacy thesis that convention (and context, if she endorses contextualism) alone does not guarantee the unambiguity of the work. This allows the maximizing position to bypass the challenge posed by said thesis, rendering it a more flexible position than anti-intentionalism in regard to the number of legitimate interpretations.
Encapsulating the maximizing position in a few words: it holds that the primary aim of art interpretation is to enhance appreciative satisfaction by identifying interpretations that bring out the value of a work within reasonable limits set by convention (and context).
The actual intentionalist will maintain that figurative features such as irony and allusion must be analysed intentionalistically. The maximizer with contextualist commitment can counter this objection by dealing with intentions more sophisticatedly. If the relevant features are identity conferring, they will be respected and accepted in interpretation. In this case, any interpretation that ignores the intended feature ends up misidentifying the work. But if the relevant features are not identity conferring, more room will be left for the interpreter to consider them. The intended feature can be ignored if it does not add to the value of the work. By contrast, where such a feature is not intended but can be put in the work, the interpreter can still build it into the interpretation if it is value enhancing.
The most important objection to the maximizing view has it that the present position is in danger of turning a mediocre work into a masterpiece. Ed Wood’s film Plan 9 from Outer Space is the most discussed example. Many people consider this work to be the worst film ever made. However, interpreted from a postmodern perspective as satire—which is presumably a value-enhancing interpretation—would turn it into a classic.
The maximizer with contextualist leanings can reply that the postmodern reading fails to identify the film as authored by Wood (Davies, 2007, p, 187). Postmodern views were not available in Wood’s time, so it was impossible for the film to be created as such. Identifying the film as postmodernist amounts to anachronism that disrespects the work’s identity. The moral of this example is that the maximizer does not blindly enhance the value of a work. Rather, the work to be interpreted needs to be contextualized first to ensure that subsequent attributions of aesthetic value are done in light of the true and fair presentation of the work.
Contra anti-intentionalism, actual intentionalism maintains that the artist’s intention is relevant to interpretation. The position comes in at least three forms, giving different weights to intention. The absolute version claims that work-meaning is fully determined by the artist’s intention; the extreme version claims that the work ends up being meaningless when the artist’s intention is incompatible with it; and the moderate version claims that either the artist’s intention determines meaning or—if this fails—meaning is determined instead by convention (and context, if contextualism is endorsed).
Absolute actual intentionalism claims that a work means whatever its creator intends it to mean. Put otherwise, it sees the artist’s intention as the necessary and sufficient condition for a work’s meaning. This position is often dubbed Humpty-Dumptyism with reference to the character Humpty-Dumpty in Through the Looking-Glass. This character tries to convince Alice that he can make a word mean what he chooses it to mean. This unsettling conclusion is supported by the argument about intentionless meaning: a mark (or a sequence of marks) cannot have meaning unless it is produced by an agent capable of intentional activities; therefore, meaning is identical to intention.
It seems plausible to abandon the thought that marks on the sand are a poem once we know they were caused by accident. But this at best proves that intention is the necessary condition for something’s being meaningful; it does not prove further that what something means is what the agent intended it to mean. In other words, the argument about intentionless meaning does a better job in showing that intention is an indispensable ingredient for meaningfulness than in showing that intention infallibly determines the meaning conveyed.
To avoid Humpty-Dumptyism, the extreme actual intentionalist rejects the view that the artist’s intention infallibly determines work-meaning and accepts the indeterminacy thesis that convention alone does not guarantee a single evident meaning to be found in a work. The extreme intentionalist claims further that the meaning of the work is fixed by the artist’s intention if her intention identifies one of the possible meanings sustained by the work; otherwise, the work ends up being meaningless (Hirsch, 1967). Better put, the extreme intentionalist sees intention as the necessary rather than sufficient condition for work-meaning.
Aside from the unsatisfactory result that a work becomes meaningless when the artist’s intention fails, the present position faces a dilemma when dealing with the case of figurative language (Nathan, in Iseminger (1992)). Take irony for example. The first horn of the dilemma is as follows: Constrained by linguistic conventions, the range of possible meanings has to include the negation of the literal meaning in order for the intended irony to be effective. But this results in absolute intentionalism: every expression would be ironic as long as the author intends it to be. But—this is the second horn—if the range of possible meanings does not include the negation of literal meaning, the expression simply becomes meaningless in that there is no appropriate meaning possible for the author to actualize. It seems that a broader notion of convention is needed to explain figurative language. But if the extreme intentionalist makes that move, her intentionalist position will be undermined, for the author’s intention would be given a less important role than convention in such cases. However, this problem does not arise when the actual intentionalist is committed to contextualism, for in that case the contextual factors that make the intended irony possible will be taken into account.
Though there are several different versions of moderate actual intentionalism, they share the common ground that when the artist’s intention fails, meaning is fixed instead by convention and context. (Whether all moderate actual intentionalists take context into account is controversial and this article will not dig into this controversy for reasons of space.) That is, when the artist’s intention is successful, it determines meaning; otherwise, meaning is determined by convention plus context (Carroll, 2001; Stecker, 2003; Livingston, 2005).
As seen, an intention is successful so long as it identifies one of the possible meanings sustained by the work even if the meaning identified is less plausible than other candidates. But what exactly is the interpreter doing when she identifies that meaning? It is reasonable to say that the interpreter does not need to ascertain all the possible meanings and see if there is a fit. Rather, all she needs to do is to see whether the intended meaning can be read in accordance with the work. This is why the moderate intentionalist puts the success condition in terms of compatibility: an intention is successful so long as the intended meaning is compatible with the work. The fact that a certain meaning is compatible with the work means that the work can sustain it as one of its possible meanings.
Unfortunately, the notion of compatibility seems to allow strange cases in which an insignificant intention can determine work-meaning as long as it is not explicitly rejected by the relevant interpretative constraint. For example, if Agatha Christie reveals that Hercule Poirot is actually a smart Martian in disguise, the moderate intentionalist would need to accept it because this proclamation of intention can still be said to be compatible with the text in the sense that it is not rejected by textual evidence. To avoid this bad result, compatibility needs to be qualified.
The moderate intentionalist then analyses compatibility in terms of the meshing condition, which refers to a sufficient degree of coherence between the content of the intention and the work’s rhetorical patterns. An intention is compatible with the work in the sense that it meshes well with the work. The Martian case will hence be ruled out by the meshing condition because it does not engage sufficiently with the narrative even if it is not explicitly rejected by textual evidence. The meshing condition is a minimal or weak success condition in that it does not require the intention to mesh with every textual feature. A sufficient amount will do, though the moderate intentionalist admits that the line is not always easy to draw. With this weak standard for success, it can happen that the interpreter is not able to discern the intended meaning in the work before she learns of the artist’s intention.
There is a second kind of success condition which adopts a stronger standard (Stecker, 2003; Davies, 2007, pp. 170–1). This standard for success states that an intention is successful just in case the intended meaning, among the possible meanings sustained by the work, is the one most likely to secure uptake from a well-backgrounded audience (with contextual knowledge and all). For example, if a work of art, within the limits set by convention and context, affords interpretations x, y, and z, and x is more readily discerned than the other two by the appropriate audience, then x is the meaning of the work.
These accounts of the success condition answer a notable objection to moderate intentionalism. This objection claims that moderate intentionalism faces an epistemic dilemma (Trivedi, 2001). Consider an epistemic question: how do we know whether an intention is successfully realized? Presumably, we figure out work-meaning and the artist’s intention respectively and independently of each other. And then we compare the two to see if there is a fit. Nevertheless, this move is redundant: if we can figure out work-meaning independently of actual intention, why do we need the latter? And if work-meaning cannot be independently obtained, how can we know it is a case where intentions are successfully realized and not a case where intentions failed? It follows that appeal to successful intention results in redundancy or indeterminacy.
The first horn of the dilemma assumes that work-meaning can be obtained independently of knowledge of successful intention, but this is false for moderate intentionalists, for they acknowledge that in many cases the work presents ambiguity that cannot be resolved solely in virtue of internal evidence. The moderate intentionalist rejects the second horn by claiming that they do not determine the success of an intention by comparing independently obtained work-meaning with the artist’s intention (Stecker, 2010, pp. 154–5). As already discussed, moderate intentionalists propose different success conditions that do not appeal to the identity between the artist’s intention and work-meaning. Moderate intentionalists adopting the weak standard hold that success is defined by the degree of meshing; those who adopt the strong standard maintain that success is defined by the audience’s ability to grasp the intention. Neither requires the interpreter to identify a work’s meaning independently of the artist’s intention.
The most commonly raised objection is the epistemic worry, which asks: is intention knowable? It seems impossible for one to really know others’ mental states, and the epistemic gap in this respect is thus unbridgeable. Actual intentionalists tend to dismiss this worry as insignificant and maintain that in many contexts (daily conversation or historical investigations) we have no difficulty in discerning another person’s intention (Carroll, 2009, pp. 71–5). In that case, why would things suddenly stand differently when it comes to art interpretation? This is not to say that we succeed on every occasion of interpretation, but that we do so in an amazingly large number of cases. That being said, we should not reject the appeal to intention solely because of the occasional failure.
Another objection is the publicity paradox (Nathan, 2006). The main idea is this: when someone S conveys something p by a production of an object O for public consumption, there is a second-order intention that the audience need not go beyond O to reach p; that is, there is no need to consult S’s first-order intentions to understand O. Therefore, when an artist creates a work for public consumption, there is a second-order intention that her first-order intentions not be consulted, otherwise it would indicate the failure of the artist. Actual intentionalism hence leads to the paradoxical claim that we should and should not consult the artist’s intentions.
The actual intentionalist’s response (Stecker, 2010, pp. 153–4) is this: not all artists have the second-order intention in question. If this premise is false, then the publicity argument becomes unsound. Even if it were true, the argument would still be invalid, because it confuses the intention that the artist intends to create something standing alone with the intention that her first-order intention need not be consulted. The paradox will not hold if this distinction is made.
Lastly, many criticisms are directed at a popular argument among actual intentionalists: the conversation argument (Carroll, 2001; Jannotta, 2014). An analogy between conversation and art interpretation is drawn, and actual intentionalists claim that if we accept that art interpretation is a form of conversation, we need to accept actual intentionalism as the right prescriptive account of interpretation, because the standard goal of an interlocutor in a conversation is to grasp what the speaker intends to say. (This is a premise even anti-intentionalists accept, but they apparently reject the further claim that art interpretation is conversational. See Beardsley, 1970, ch.1.) This analogy has been severely criticized (Dickie, 2006; Nathan, 2006; Huddleston, 2012). The greatest disanalogy between conversation and art is that the latter is more like a monologue delivered by the artist rather than an interchange of ideas.
One way to meet the monologue objection is to specify more clearly the role of the conversational interest. In fact, the actual intentionalist claims that the conversational interest should constrain other interests such as the aesthetic interest. In other words, other interests can be reconciled or work with the conversational interest. Take the case of the hermeneutics of suspicion for example. Hermeneutics of suspicion is a skeptical attitude—often heavily politicized—adopted toward the explicit stance of a work. Interpretations based on the hermeneutics of suspicion have to be constrained by the artist’s non-ironic intention in order for them to count as legitimate interpretations. For instance, in attributing racist tendencies to Jules Verne’s Mysterious Island, in which the black slave Neb is portrayed as docile and superstitious, we need to suppose that the tendencies are not ironic; otherwise, the suspicious reading becomes inappropriate. In this example, the artistic conversation does not end up being a monologue, for the suspicious hermeneut listens and understands Verne before responding with the suspicious reading, which is constrained by the conversational interest. A conversational interchange is hence completed.
A compromise between actual intentionalism and anti-intentionalism is hypothetical intentionalism, the core claim of which is that the correct meaning of a work is determined by the best hypothesis about the artist’s intention made by a selected audience. The aim of interpretation is then to hypothesize what the artist intended when creating the work from the perspective of the qualified audience (Tolhurst, 1979; Levinson, 1996).
Two points call for attention. First, it is hypothesis—not truth—that matters. This means that a hypothesis of the actual intention will never be trumped by knowledge of that very intention. Second, the membership of the audience is crucial because it determines the kind of evidence legitimate for the interpreter to use.
A 1979 proposal (Tolhurst) suggests that the relevant audience be singled out by the artist’s intention, that is, the audience intended to be addressed by the artist. Work-meaning is thus determined by the intended audience’s best hypothesis about the artist’s intention. This means that the interpreter will need to equip herself with the relevant beliefs and background knowledge of the intended audience in order to make the best hypothesis. Put another way, hypothetical intentionalism focuses on the audience’s uptake of an utterance addressed to them. This being so, what the audience relies on in comprehending the utterance will be based on what she knows about the utterer on that particular occasion. Following this contextualist line of thinking, the meaning of Jonathan Swift’s A Modest Proposal will not be the suggestion that the poor in Ireland might ease their economic pressure by selling their children as food to the rich; rather, given the background knowledge of Swift’s intended audience, the best hypothesis about the author’s intention is that he intended the work to be a satire that criticizes the heartless attitude toward the poor and Irish policy in general.
However, there is a serious problem with the notion of an intended audience. If the intended audience is an extremely small group possessing esoteric knowledge of the artist, meaning becomes a private matter, for the work can only be properly understood in terms of private information shared between artist and audience, and this results in something close to Humpty-Dumptyism, which is characteristic of absolute intentionalism.
To cope with this problem, the hypothetical intentionalist replaces the concept of an intended audience with that of an ideal or appropriate audience. Such an audience is not necessarily targeted by the artist’s intention and is ideal in the sense that its members are familiar with the public facts about the artist and her work. In other words, the ideal audience seeks to anchor the work in its context of creation based on public evidence. This avoids the danger of interpreting the work on the basis of private evidence.
The hypothetical intentionalist is aware that in some cases there will be competing interpretations which are equally good. An aesthetic criterion is then introduced to adjudicate between these hypotheses. The aesthetic consideration comes as a tie breaker: when we reach two or more epistemically best hypotheses, the one that makes the work artistically better should win.
Another notable distinction introduced by hypothetical intentionalism is that between semantic and categorial intention (Levinson, 1996, pp. 188–9). The kind of intention we have been discussing is semantic: it is the intention by which an artist conveys her message in the work. By contrast, categorial intention is the artist’s intention to categorize her production, either as a work of art, a certain artform (such as Romantic literature), or a particular genre (such as lyric poetry). Categorial intention indirectly affects a work’s semantic content because it determines how the interpreter conceptualizes the work at the fundamental level. For instance, if a text is taken as a grocery list rather than an experimental story, we will interpret it as saying nothing beyond the named grocery items. For this reason, the artist’s categorial intention should be treated as among the contextual factors relevant to her work’s identity. This move is often adopted by theorists endorsing contextualism, such as maximizers or moderate intentionalists.
Hypothetical intentionalism has received many criticisms and challenges that merit mention. A frequently expressed worry is that it seems odd to stick to a hypothesis when newly found evidence proves it to be false (Carroll, 2001, pp. 208–9). If an artist’s private diary is located and reveals that our best hypothesis about her intention regarding her work is false, why should we cling to that hypothesis if the newly revealed intention meshes well with the work? Hypothetical intentionalism implausibly implies that warranted assertibility constitutes truth.
The hypothetical intentionalist clarifies her position (Levinson, 2006, p. 308) by saying that warranted assertibility does not constitute the truth for the utterer’s meaning, but it does constitute the truth for utterance meaning. The ideal audience’s best hypothesis constitutes utterance meaning even if it is designed to infer the utterer’s meaning.
Another troublesome objection states that hypothetical intentionalism collapses into the value-maximizing theory, for, when making the best hypothesis of what the artist intended, the interpreter inevitably attributes to the artist the intention to produce a piece with the highest degree of aesthetic value that the work can sustain (Davies, 2007, pp. 183–84). That is, the epistemic criterion for determining the best hypothesis is inseparable from the aesthetic criterion.
In reply, it is claimed that this objection may stem from the impression that an artist normally aims for the best; however, this does not imply that she would anticipate and intend the artistically best reading of the work. It follows that it is not necessary that the best reading be what the artist most likely intended even if she could have intended it. The objector replies that, still, the situation in which we have two epistemically plausible readings while one is inferior cannot arise, because we would adopt the inferior reading only when the superior reading is falsified by evidence.
The third objection is that the distinction between public and private evidence is blurry (Carroll, 2001, p. 212). Is public evidence published evidence? Does published information from private sources count as public? The reply from the hypothetical intentionalist emphasizes that this is not a distinction between published and unpublished information (Levinson, 2006, p. 310). The relevant public context should be reconstrued as what the artist appears to have wanted the audience to know about the circumstances of the work’s creation. This means that if it appears that the artist did not want to make certain proclamations of intent known to the audience, then this evidence, even if published at a later point, does not constitute the public context to be considered for interpretation.
Finally, two notable counterexamples to hypothetical intentionalism have been proposed (Stecker, 2010, pp. 159–60). The first counterexample is that W means p but p is not intended by the artist and the audience is justified in believing that p is not intended. In this case hypothetical intentionalism falsely implies that W does not mean p. For example, it is famously known among readers of Sherlock Holmes adventures that Dr. Watson’s war wound appears in two different locations. On one occasion the wound is said to be on his arm, while on another it is on his thigh. In other words the Holmes story fictionally asserts impossibility regarding Watson’s wound. But given the realistic style of the Holmes adventures, the best hypothesis of authorial intent in this case would deny that the impossibility is part of the meaning of the story, which is apparently false.
However, the hypothetical intentionalist would not maintain that W means p, because p is not the best hypothesis. She would not claim that the Holmes story fictionally asserts impossibility regarding Watson’s wound, for the best hypothesis made by the ideal reader would be that Watson has the wound somewhere on his body—his arm or thigh, but exactly where we do not know. It is a mistake to presuppose that W means p without following the strictures imposed by hypothetical intentionalism to properly reach p.
The second counterexample to hypothetical intentionalism is the case where the audience is justified in believing that p is intended by the artist but in fact W means q; the audience would then falsely conclude that W means p. Again, what W means is determined by the ideal audience’s best hypothesis based on convention and context, not by what the work literally asserts. The meaning of the work is the product of a prudent assessment of the total evidence available.
There is a second variety of hypothetical intentionalism that is based on the concept of a hypothetical artist. Generally speaking, it maintains that interpretation is grounded on the intention suitably attributed by the interpreter to a hypothetical or imagined artist. This version of hypothetical intentionalism is sometimes called fictionalist intentionalism or postulated authorism. The theoretical apparatus of a hypothetical artist can be traced back to Wayne Booth’s account of the “implied author,” in which he suggests that the critic should focus on the author we can make out from the work instead of on the historical author, because there is often a gap between the two.
Though proponents of the present brand of intentionalism disagree on the number of acceptable interpretations and on what kind of evidence is legitimate, they agree that the interpreter ought to concentrate on the appearance of the work. If it appears, based on internal evidence (and perhaps contextual information if contextualism is endorsed), that the artist intends the work to mean p, then p is the right interpretation of the work. The artist in question is not the historical artist; rather, it is an artist postulated by the audience to be responsible for the intention made out from, or implied by, the work. For example, if there is an anti-war attitude detected in the work, the intention to castigate war should be attributed to the postulated artist, not to the historical artist. The motivation behind this move is to maintain work-centered interpretation but avoid the fallacious reasoning that whatever we find in the work is intended by the real artist.
Inheriting the spirit of hypothetical intentionalism, fictionalist intentionalism aims to make interpretation work-based but author-related at the same time. The biggest difference between the two stances is that, as said, fictionalist intentionalism does not appeal to the actual or real artist, thereby avoiding any criticisms arising from hypothesizing about the real artist such as that the best hypothesis about the real artist’s intention should be abandoned when compelling evidence against it is obtained.
The first concern with fictionalist intentionalism is that constructing a historical variant of the actual artist sounds suspiciously like hypothesizing about her (Stecker, 1987). But there is still a difference. “Hypothesizing about the actual artist,” or more accurately, “hypothesizing the actual artist’s intention,” would be a characterization of hypothetical intentionalism rather than fictionalist intentionalism. The latter does not track the actual artist’s intention but constructs a virtual one. As shown, fictionalist intentionalism, unlike hypothetical intentionalism, is immune to any criticisms resulting from ignoring the actual artist’s proclamation of her intention.
A second objection criticizes fictionalist intentionalism for not being able to distinguish between different histories of creative processes for the same textual appearance (Livingston, 2005, pp. 165–69). For example, suppose a work that appears to be produced with a well-conceived scheme did result from that kind of scheme; suppose further that a second work that appears the same actually emerged from an uncontrolled process. Then, if we follow the strictures of fictionalist intentionalism, the interpretations we produce for these two works would turn out to be the same, for based on the same appearance the hypothetical artists we construct in both cases would be identical. But these two works have different creative histories and the difference in question seems too crucial to be ignored.
The objection here fails to consider the subtlety of reality-dependent appearances (Walton, 2008, ch. 12). For example, suppose the exhibit note beside a painting tells us it was created when the painter got heavily drunk. Any well-organized feature in the work that appears to result from careful manipulation by the painter might now either look disordered or structured in an eerie way depending on the feature’s actual presentation. Compare this scenario to another where a (almost) visually indistinguishable counterpart is exhibited in the museum with the exhibit note revealing that the painter spent a long period crafting the work. In this second case the audience’s perception of the work is not very likely to be the same as that in the first case. This shows how the apparent artist account can still discriminate between (appearances of) different creative histories of the same artistic presentation.
Finally, there is often the qualm that fictionalist intentionalism ends up postulating phantom entities (hypothetical creators) and phantom actions (their intendings). The fictional intentionalist can reply that she is giving descriptions only of appearances instead of quantifying over hypothetical artists or their actions.
From the above discussion we can notice two major trends in the debate. First, most late 20th century and 21st century participants are committed to the contextualist ontology of art. The relevance of art’s historical context, since its first philosophical appearance in Arthur Danto’s 1964 essay “The Artworld,” continues to influence analytic theories of art interpretation. There is no sign of this trend diminishing. In Noël Carroll’s 2016 survey article on interpretation, the contextualist basis is still assumed.
Second, actual intentionalism remains the most popular position among all. Many substantial monographs have been written in this century to defend the position (Stecker, 2003; Livingston, 2005; Carroll, 2009; Stock 2017). This intentionalist prevalence probably results from the influence of H. P. Grice’s work on the philosophy of language. And again, this trend, like the contextualist vogue, is still ongoing. And if we see intentionalism as an umbrella term that encompasses not only actual intentionalism but also hypothetical intentionalism and probably fictionalist intentionalism, the influence of intentionalism and its related emphasis on the concept of an artist or author will be even stronger. This presents an interesting contrast with the trend in post-structuralism that tends to downplay authorial presence in theories of interpretation, as embodied in the author-is-dead thesis championed by Barthes and Foucoult (Lamarque, 2009, pp. 104–15).
- Beardsley, M. C. (1970). The possibility of criticism. Detroit, MI: Wayne State University Press.
Contains four philosophical essays on literary criticism. The first two are among Beardsley’s most important contributions to the philsoophy of interpretation.
- Beardsley, M. C. (1981a). Aesthetics: Problems in the philosophy of criticism (2nd ed.). Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
A comprehensive volume on philosophical issues across the arts and also a powerful statement of anti-intentionalism.
- Beardsley, M. C. (1981b). Fiction as representation. Synthese, 46, 291–313.
Presents the speech act theory of literature.
- Beardsley, M. C. (1982). The aesthetic point of view: Selected essays. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
Contains the essay “Intentions and Interpretations: A Fallacy Revived,” in which Beardsley applies his speech act theory to the interpretation of fictional works.
- Booth, W. C. (1983). The rhetoric of fiction (2nd ed.). Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
Contains the original account of the implied author.
- Carroll, N. (2001). Beyond aesthetics: Philosophical essays. New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
Contains in particular Carroll’s conversation argument, discussion on the hermenutics of suspicion, defense of moderate intentionalism, and criticism of hypothetical intentionalism.
- Carroll, N. (2009). On criticism. New York, NY: Routledge.
An engaging book on artistic evaluation and interpretation.
- Carroll, N., & Gibson, J. (Eds.). (2016). The Routledge companion to philosophy of literature. New York, NY: Routledge.
Anthologizes Carroll’s survey article on the intention debate.
- Currie, G. (1990). The nature of fiction. Cambridge, England: Cambridge University Press.
Contains a defense of fictionalist intentionalism.
- Currie, G. (1991). Work and text. Mind, 100, 325–40.
Presents how a commitment to contextualism leads to an important distinction between work and text in the case of literature.
- Danto, A. C. (1964). The artworld. Journal of Philosophy, 61, 571–84.
First paper to draw attention to the relevance of a work’s context of production.
- Davies, S. (2005). Beardsley and the autonomy of the work of art. Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63, 179–83.
Argues that Beardsley is actually a contextualist.
- Davies, S. (2007). Philosophical perspectives on art. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
Part II contains Davies’ defense of the maximizing position and criticisms of other positions.
- Dickie, G. (2006). Intentions: Conversations and art. British Journal of Aesthetics, 46, 71–81.
Criticizes Carroll’s conversation argument and actual intentionalism.
- Goldman, A. H. (2013). Philosophy and the novel. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
Contains a defense of the value-maximizing theory without a contextualist commitment.
- Hirsch, E. D. (1967). Validity in interpretation. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
The most representative presentation of extreme intentionalism.
- Hirsch, E. D. (1976). The aims of interpretation. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
Contains a collection of essays expanding Hirsh’s views on interpretation.
- Huddleston, A. (2012). The conversation argument for actual intentionalism. British Journal of Aesthetics, 52, 241–56.
A brilliant criticism of Carroll’s conversation argument.
- Iseminger, G. (Ed.). (1992). Intention & interpretation. Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press.
A valuable collection of essays featuring Beardsley’s account of the work’s autonomy, Knapp and Michaels’ absolute intentionalism, Iseminger’s extreme intentionalism, Nathan’s account of the postulated artist, Levinson’s hypothetical intentionalism, and eight other contributions.
- Jannotta, A. (2014). Interpretation and conversation: A response to Huddleston. British Journal of Aesthetics, 54, 371–80.
A defense of the conversation argument.
- Krausz, M. (Ed.). (2002). Is there a single right interpretation? University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
Another valuable anthology on the intention debate, containing in particular Carroll’s defense of moderate intentionalism, Lamarque’s criticism of viewing work-meaning as utterance meaning.
- Lamarque, P. (2009). The philosophy of literature. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
The third and the fourth chapters discuss analytic theories of interpretation along with a critical assessment of the author-is-dead claim.
- Levinson, J. (1996). The pleasure of aesthetics: Philosophical essays. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
The tenth chapter is Levinson’s revised presentation of hypothetical intentionalism and the distinction between semantic and categorial intention.
- Levinson, J. (2006). Contemplating art: Essays in aesthetics. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
Contains Levinson’s replies to major objections to hypothetical intentionalism.
- Levinson, J. (2016). Aesthetic pursuits: Essays in philosophy of art. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
Contains Levinson’s updated defense of hypothetical intentionalism and criticism of Livingston’s moderate intentionalism.
- Livingston, P. (2005). Art and intention: A philosophical study. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
A thorough discussion on intention, literary ontology, and the problem of interpretation, with emphases on defending the meshing condition and on the criticisms of the two versions of hypothetical intentionalism.
- Nathan, D. O. (1982). Irony and the artist’s intentions. Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 22, 245–56.
Criticizes the notion of an intended audience.
- Nathan, D. O. (2006). Art, meaning, and artist’s meaning. In M. Kieran (Ed.), Contemporary debates in aesthetics and the philosophy of art (pp. 282–93). Oxford, England: Blackwell.
Presents an account of fictionalist intentionalism, a critique of the conversation argument, and a brief recapitulation of the publicity paradox.
- Nehamas, A. (1981). The postulated author: Critical monism as a regulative ideal. Critical Inquiry, 8, 133–49.
Presents another version of fictionalist intentionalism.
- Stecker, R. (1987). ‘Apparent, Implied, and Postulated Authors’, Philosophy and Literature 11, pp 258-71.
Criticizes different versions of fictionalist intentionalism
- Stecker, R. (2003). Interpretation and construction: Art, speech, and the law. Oxford, England: Blackwell.
A valuable monograph devoted to the intention debate and its related problems such as the ontology of art, incompatible interpretations and the application of theories of art interpretation to law. The book defends moderate intentionalism in particular.
- Stecker, R. (2010). Aesthetics and the philosophy of art: An introduction. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
Contains a chapter that presents the disjunctive formulation of moderate intentionalism and the two counterexamples to hypothetical intentionalism.
- Stecker, R., & Davies, S. (2010). The hypothetical intentionalist’s dilemma: A reply to Levinson. British Journal of Aesthetics, 50, 307–12.
Counterreplies to Levinson’s replies to criticisms of hypothetical intentionalism.
- Stock, K. (2017). Only imagine: Fiction, interpretation, and imagination. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
Contains a defense of absolute (the author uses the term “extreme”) intentionalism.
- Tolhurst, W. E. (1979). On what a text is and how it means. British Journal of Aesthetics, 19, 3–14.
The founding document of hypothetical intentionalism.
- Trivedi, S. (2001). An epistemic dilemma for actual intentionalism. British Journal of Aesthetics, 41, pp. 192–206.
Presents an epistemic dilemma for actual intentionalism and defense of hypothetical intentionalism.
- Walton, K. L. (2008). Marvelous images: On values and the arts. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
A collection of essays, including “Categories of Art,” which might have inspired Levinson’s conception of categorial intention; and “Style and the Products and Processes of Art,” which is a defense of fictionalist intentionalism in terms of the notion “apparent artist.”
- Wimsatt, W. K., & Beardsley, M. C. (1946). The intentional fallacy. The Sewanee Review, 54, 468–88.
The first thorough presentation of anti-intentionalism, commonly regarded as starting point of the intention debate.
Chinese Culture University